Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Legal Pragmatism

Legal pragmatism is a theory critical of more traditional pictures of law and, more specifically, judicial decision-making. The classical view of law offers a case-based theory of law that emphasizes the universal and foundational quality of specifically legal facts, the meticulous analysis of precedent and argument from analogy. Legal pragmatism, on the other hand, emphasizes the need to include a more diverse set of data and claims that law is best thought of as a practice that is rooted in the specific context at hand, without secure foundations, instrumental, and always attached to a perspective. A pragmatic stance towards jurisprudence offers many philosophical challenges to more traditional descriptions of the legal domain.

Table of Contents

1. The Classical Picture of Judicial Decision-Making

The “classical picture” of legal argumentation and analysis dominates theoretical descriptions of judicial decision-making. It also is the dominant picture among legal practitioners. The classical model of legal argumentation is based upon the casebook method, the use of precedent and rigorous arguments from analogy. The casebook method assumes that the essential and exhaustive materials for a legal decision are summed up in the published opinions that accompany the conclusion of controversies in court. What an attorney or, more importantly, a judge is supposed to look to so as to render the proper verdict are reasons offered and situations analyzed in previous decisions that seem relevantly similar. The data for the decision is therefore the casebook. From a set of precedents, of written court opinions, is distilled a general set of rules and a specific verdict in the controversy before the court. Given a legal controversy, the practitioner (judge, attorney or the like) looks at previous cases for similar situations and then tries to distill the reasons that have been accepted as legally relevant for his or her client’s position. From these sources a legal conclusion should be drawn.

This classical picture of legal argumentation is historically attributed to former Harvard Law School Dean Christopher Columbus Langdell. Langdell put the first case book together as a educational tool, and bundled this type of book with a Socratic style of teaching that reigns supreme in legal practice and education today. Both the use of the casebook and the Socratic method presuppose a somewhat insular and rationalistic view of legal institutions. One of the most influential sources of the classical model of more recent vintage is offered by Edward Levi in An Introduction to Legal Reasoning. As he describes it legal reasoning is a “three-step process” where a “similarity is seen between cases; next the rule of law inherent in the first case is announced; then the rule of law is made applicable to the second case (Levi 1949, p. 2).” The implicit assumption is that once the similarity between cases is recognized, legal reasoning is simply a matter of making a logically valid deduction of a holding from a statement of the law (major premise) and a statement of the facts (minor premise). But by far the most influential current advocate of the main elements of the classical view is Ronald Dworkin.

Dworkin’s theory functions as a normative theory as well as a descriptive one. Taken as a descriptive claim the theory offers a portrait of what judges actually do when arriving at a legal conclusion. Dworkin’s own version of legal decision-making is entitled “law as integrity” (Dworkin, 1986). According to this theory, consistency with past judicial decisions should be emphasized as one of the most important legal virtues. He offers the picture of an imaginary creation, the “chain-novel,” to argue for the centrality of precedent in law. A chain-novel is a novel that is written one chapter at a time. After the creation of each new chapter, the novel is passed to a new author for further elaboration. Dworkin argues that in this enterprise we surely would want the new author to find as supremely important the need to cohere with and respect the content of the chapters already completed. An author that didn’t follow this rule would be not properly fulfilling his or her role. Dworkin then argues the same assumptions should rule the legal world and, therefore, the judge’s activity. That is, each case is directly analogous to a new chapter in the chain-novel. If one accepts the analogy, and there seems to be much too little analysis critiquing the acceptability of such an analogy, one gets a picture of a somewhat insulated legal system running upon a deep need for internal coherence. While Dworkin disavows the deductivist picture offered by Langdell, and allows in a moral dimension, in his attachment to traditional legal materials and practices he is clearly a proponent of the classical view. The legal pragmatist finds much to argue with in this picture of jurisprudence.

2. The Pragmatist’s Picture of Judicial Decision-Making

Legal pragmatists such as Daniel Farber, Thomas Grey, Margaret Radin and Richard Posner think that such a picture of jurisprudence is severely flawed. The legal pragmatist thinks that the classical view is overly legalistic, naively rationalistic and based upon misunderstandings of legal institutions. As opposed to the self-imposed limitations entailed by the classical view of judicial decision-making, legal pragmatists emphasize the eclectic nature and the diverse aims of the law. More specifically, legal pragmatists largely agree upon four main aspects of a pragmatist version of jurisprudence: (1) the important of context; (2) the lack of foundations; (3) the instrumental nature of law; and (4) the unavoidable presence of alternate perspectives.

a. Contextual

For the legal pragmatist all legal controversies are essentially attached to a specific and unique context. As Posner describes it, emphasizing the unavoidable presence of a specific context “disconnects the whirring machinery of philosophical abstraction from the practical business of governing our lives and our societies (Posner 1995, p. 463).” While there is some irony in a foremost proponent of neo-classical economics critiquing “philosophical abstractions,” Posner here correctly highlights the contextualist’s slogan of “return from abstractions to the concrete.” Certainly Dworkin and Langdell can be seen as overly fond of abstractions. In this case they mirror the actual practitioners. Tamanaha argues that the contrasting contextualism of legal pragmatism is best shown in Justice Holmes’ strategy whereby he used historical analysis to expose such seemingly timeless abstract legal concepts as being actually derived from contingent and context-specific needs (Tamanaha 1996, p. 315). Through this strategy the illusion of an eternal set of essential legal concepts is exposed as actually being a contingent creation of specific conflicts. While even legal formalists expect to apply concepts to a context, the legal pragmatist differs in seeing the concepts themselves as products of context. Because of this, the assumption that the legal concepts are applicable beyond their originating controversy is questioned.

The basic claim offered by the contextualist critique is that all legal decision-making, as well as any legal controversy, takes place in a specific and unique context that is so constitutive of the issues and the ultimate decision that the decision is distorted if seen from a non-contextual perspective. More importantly, the concepts used are questionable when applied between different controversies. Because of this, the abstractionist tendencies of the classical view of legal decision-making is thought undesirable and a view that emphasizes context, such as the legal pragmatist’s, to be superior.

b. Antifoundational

In addition to the need to emphasize context, the legal pragmatist also argues that the lack of foundations in legal decision-making must be recognized. Foundationalists hold that there is some core principle or principles that all legal decisions can be deduced from. While today very few will admit to an extreme view of such foundationalism, most legal theorizing assumes a more moderate foundationalist view. This moderate view argues that the judge has a sufficient set of tools from within the traditional materials of the classical view of legal decision-making (the case method) to make properly informed decisions in present cases. In other words, the moderate view sees cases as the necessary and sufficient foundation from which to deduce sufficiently analyzed legal conclusions.

A legal pragmatist sees this as descriptively wrong. First, “the idea that correct outcomes can be deduced from some overarching principle – or set of principles” is rejected (Cotter 1996, p. 2085). In place of deductive certainty is offered a picture of induction and an emphasis upon the creative problem-solving act of jurisprudence. Second, pragmatism in general stands for a rejection of the metaphysical picture of knowledge or decision-making that sees either as needing (or indeed having) a foundation. Knowledge and reason in law, as in any other domain, are seen as essentially open-ended concepts in need of continual testing and revision, and therefore law is an activity that would outgrow any purported foundations. So, if cases are thought to provide a foundation to legal decisions the legal pragmatist argues that they will not be inevitably up to the challenge of the next case, and therefore the foundationalist picture is at the very least incomplete.

c. Instrumental

While the classical view of legal decision-making emphasizes consistency with past decisions (the high value of respect for precedent), the instrumentalist advocates an investigation of the effects a decision might have and the capabilities of the legal institution. An instrumental view is therefore less interested in precedent and more based upon a “orientation towards the future (Rosenfeld 1996, p. 98).” That is, instead of an emphasis upon consistency with the essence of past decisions the pragmatist judge looks to the worldly implications of his or her decision. For instance, in a contract dispute a judge following the classical model of legal reasoning would look to antecedently held rights and obligations as shown in earlier cases in order to decide. A pragmatist judge, on the other hand, would see those issues as important but would also look at the greater implications for contract disputes in the future. This prospective attitude would bring in data as to the effects of the contract decision upon third parties, how a ruling would affect daily life, etc.

This orientation towards the future, and towards the empirical, means that for the legal pragmatist judge a whole new set of reasons become applicable and legally relevant when making a decision. While the advocate of the classical view can limit the reasons and facts to those allowed in the analogous cases, the cases accepted as precedents, the pragmatist judge must allow in other sorts of data, for instance sociological or economic data, in order to properly access the individual case at hand. Therefore, instead of emphasizing the primacy of consistency with precedent, a pragmatist of a legal bent emphasizes “the primacy of consequences in interpretation (Posner 1995, p. 252).”

d. Perspectival

Finally, the legal pragmatist adopts a stance that embraces the problem of perspective. Perspectivalism entails a suspicion of broad generalities and an acknowledgment of eclectic manners of description. As opposed to legal formalism, which “holds that determinate meanings exist in legal texts which may be discerned by reason and that objective, immutable principles simultaneously inform and transcend the practice of applying rules,” perspectivism emphasizes that all is messy, open-ended, and subject to revision in light of another perspective or further information (Shutkin 1993, p. 66). The acknowledgment of perspective entails that an overly deferential stance towards precedent and previously endorsed analogies could be unfairly restrictive towards new and possibly more inclusive descriptions.

As can be seen from the above, legal pragmatism offers a significant alternative to more traditional views of the legal domain. In fact, Stuart Scheingold argues that this lack of awareness of conflicting perspectives is a pervasive quality of traditional legal thought. As he puts it “Law professors and lawyers do not believe that they are either encumbered or enlightened by a special view of the world. They simply feel that their legal training has taught them to think logically. In a complex world, they have the intellectual tools to strip a problem, any problem, down to its essentials (Scheingold 1974, p. 161).” But if such an assumption is itself just one perspective, and one that obviously would distort any appreciation of other alternative perspectives, such ignorance of their own perspective would be an important vice to identify.

But important issues remain even if one finds such a description of legal pragmatism attractive. First, is legal pragmatism offered as a descriptive or a normative picture of jurisprudence? Second, does such a stance really offer any desirable features that the more classical picture of law cannot deliver or does it suffer from more intractable flaws?

3. Legal Pragmatism as a Descriptive Theory

Legal pragmatism can be characterized as a theory with descriptive pretensions. That is, as a theory as to what really happens in law, despite the ideological prevalence of the classical model. The descriptive legal pragmatist thinks that the classical picture of jurisprudence does not fit the facts of law, and that a pragmatist picture offers a better alternative. A legal pragmatism of this type looks to the legal realists as historical precursor. The legal realists claimed that law was a much sloppier and more political, as well as less reasonable, institution than those following the Langdell model admitted. In other words, that the reasons and data offered by the classical model of legal decision-making do not properly explain the actions of legal institutions. The legal pragmatist, therefore, looks for empirical evidence that argues against such a constrained view of decision-making.

Such evidence is not too hard to come by. First, it is clear that political actors do not treat the court system as neutral and functioning only upon respect for precedent. The full-blown fights over judicial appointments shows that actors outside of the court system view judges as politically important. Second, there is much empirical research that questions the assumption that precedent actually has the authority claimed for it. Some studies have claimed that decisions are more influenced by the political beliefs of the judge than by precedent (Goldman 1979, p. 208). Another study claimed an 85% success rate in prediction of future case decisions based upon a study of the judge’s “values” (Rohde/Spaeth 1976, p. 157). A further study concluded, “Supreme Court justices are not influenced by landmark precedents with which they disagree (Segal/Spaeth 1996, p. 971).” What the empirical data tends to show, then, is that the classical model does not explain the way actual judges decide cases very well.

On the other hand, the legal pragmatist model has difficulties as a descriptive theory as well. First, judges for the most part certainly act and write as if they are following precedent and the traditional legal materials. Second, it seems as if judges that were really pragmatic would have to be more rigorous in the following out of empirical implications of their decisions.

But this possibility raises many questions. For instance, would the current fear of statistics and sociological data that lawyers have as an rule have to be overcome in order for law to be actually and accurately described as pragmatic? Furthermore, there is the question of institutional competence. Does the legal system really have the resources to gather and digest all the data necessary to make an informed pragmatic decision? Does a judge have the capacity to digest all the relevant material in order to have any competent idea as to the real-world ramifications of any non-clerical decision? Would not a judge that described him or herself as a pragmatist judge be just as deluded as the judge that adopts the more traditional description?

4. Legal Pragmatism as a Normative Theory

Because neither option seems to accurately fit what really goes on in the jurisprudential domain, perhaps legal pragmatism should be better thought of as a normative theory. That is, perhaps it is a conceptual stance offered as a picture of what judicial decision-making should be.

In its normative mode legal pragmatism treats law and the legal realm as a tool useful for social purposes. The legal pragmatist opposes the a priori and rationalistic style of argumentation traditionally applied in legal argumentation by arguing that such methods have no valid claim to authority and, indeed, lack the tools necessary to justify their own adoption. The more traditional style of legal reasoning, that which keeps its attention upon cases, excludes broader and more scientifically warranted data. Therefore the user of the classical theory can offer not much more than a heart-felt and resounding exclamation – “it works” – when confronted with the question of the empirical effectiveness of a decision. All pragmatist thought brings with it a suspicion of unquestioned and non-experimental pictures of reason. Indeed the pragmatist is liable to see in such a claim something akin to the statement “because God commanded it.” This “it works” exclamation is an example of just such an a priori, rationalist and non-experimental claim. What exactly does it work in comparison to? For the pragmatist such statements only have meaning if they can be tested, and the classical picture of jurisprudence doesn’t have the tools with which to test such claims in each case or on a more global level.

On the other hand, adoption of a pragmatist theory offers the ideal of a system rooted in experience and the experimental method. As opposed to the overly rationalistic and insular picture of legal decision-making offered by the classical legal theorist, the legal pragmatist argues for a more empirical jurisprudence. The normative argument, in outline, is that a jurisprudential theory rooted in sensitivity to context, a theory that functions without a belief in false foundations, one that is judged along explicitly instrumental criteria and that also acknowledges the inevitability of perspective, is better suited to bring about justice in a complex and unpredictable world than a theory that rests upon untested essentialistic assumptions and a non-experimental and universalistic view of reason.

5. Selected Bibliography

Brint, Micheal and William Weaver, Pragmatism in Law and Society (Boulder: Westview Press, 1991)

Cotter, Thomas F., “Legal Pragmatism and the Law and Economics Movement,” 84 Georgetown Law Journal 2071 (1996)

Dickstein, Morris, The Revival of Pragmatism: New Essays on Social Thought, Law, and Culture (Durham: Duke University Press, 1998).

Dworkin, Ronald M., Law’s Empire (Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1986)

Farber, Daniel, “Reinventing Brandeis: Legal Pragmatism for the Twenty-First Century,” 1995 University of Illinois Law Review 163 (1995)

Goldman, Sheldon, “The Effect of Past Judicial Behavior on Subsequent Decision-Making,” 19 Jurimetrics Journal 208 (1979)

Grey, Thomas G., “Freestanding Legal Pragmatism,” 18 Cardozo Law Review 21 (1996)

——”Holmes and Legal Pragmatism,” 41 Stanford Law Review 787 (1989)

Levi, Edward, H., An Introduction To Legal Reasoning (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1949)

MacCormick, Neil, Legal Reasoning and Legal Theory (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1978)

Posner, Richard, Overcoming Law (Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1995)

——”Pragmatic Adjudication,” 18 Cardozo Law Review 1 (1996)

Radin, Margaret Jane, “The Pragmatist and the Feminist,” 63 Southern California Law Review 1699 (1990)

Rohde, David W., and Harold J. Spaeth, Supreme Court Decision Making (San Francisco: W.H. Freeman, 1976)

Rorty, Richard, “The Banality of Pragmatism and the Poetry of Justice,” in Pragmatism in Law and Society

Rosenberg, Gerald D., The Hollow Hope: Can Courts Bring About Social Change? (Chicago: The University of Chicago Press, 1991).

Rosenfeld, Michel, “Pragmatism, Pulralism and Legal Interpretation: Posner’s and Rorty’s Justice Without Metaphysics Metts Hate Speech,” 18 Cardozo Law Review 97 (1996)

Segal, Jeffrey A., and Horold J. Spaeth, “The Influence of Stare Decisis on the Votes of Supreme Court Justices,” 40 American Journal of Political Science 971 (1996)

Scheingold, Stuart A., The Politics of Rights (New Haven: Yale University Press, 1974)

Shutkin, William Andrew, “Pragmatism and the Promise of Adjudication,” 18 Vermont Law Review 57 (1993)

Smith, Steven D., “The Pursuit of Pragmatism,” 100 Yale Law Journal 409 (1990)

Tamanaha, Brian Z., “Pragmatism in U.S. Legal Theory: Its Application to Normative Jurisprudence, Sociolegal Studies, and the Fact-Value Distinction, 41 American Journal of Jurisprudence 315 (1996)

Wells, Catharine P. “Improving One’s Situation: Some Pragmatic Reflections on the Art of Judging,” 49 Washington and Lee Law Review 323 (1992)

Author Information

Brian Edgar Butler
University of North Carolina at Asheville
U. S. A.

Last updated: June 28, 2005 | Originally published: