The views of Leibniz (1646-1716) on causation must stand as some of the more interesting in the history of philosophy, for he consistently denied that there is any genuine causal interaction between finite substances. And yet from another perspective, he sought to integrate both old and new causal taxonomies: On the one hand, Leibniz put forth a theory of causation that would accommodate the Scientific Revolution’s increasing mathematization of nature, one according to which efficient causes played a dominant role. On the other hand, Leibniz also sought to integrate certain aspects of traditional Aristotelian causation into his philosophy. In particular, while many of Leibniz’s contemporaries were rejecting Aristotelian final causes, Leibniz insisted that the pursuit of final causes was worthwhile. Indeed, they played a crucial role in his philosophical system. The result is that Leibniz produced a system with a complex integration of both old and new––of both final and efficient causes––while simultaneously denying there was any real causal interaction between substances at the most basic level. The resulting metaphysics is sufficient to secure him a significant place in the history of the philosophy of causation, one worthy of serious attention.
In introducing his views on causation, Leibniz nearly always pivoted his theory against what he saw as its main rivals, occasionalism and physical influx theory (influxus physicus). He thought both were unacceptable, and that his own theory was the only viable option. In presenting Leibniz’s own theory, the famous “preestablished harmony,” this article follows his lead by considering, in the first section, why Leibniz deemed the competitors unacceptable. The article then discusses the details of Leibniz’s positive views on causation.
When it came to introducing his theory of causation, preestablished harmony, Leibniz was fond of presenting it via an argument by elimination: he would set the argument up against its main competitors; reasoning that neither of them was intelligible and so each must be false. Consequently, since the preestablished harmony is entirely intelligible according to Leibniz, and more worthy of a divine creator, it must be the true theory of causation. The following passage from 1698, written with particular attention to mind–body causation, is typical of Leibniz’s presentation:
I have pointed out that we can imagine three systems to explain the intercourse which we find between body and soul, namely, (1) the system of mutual influence of one upon the other, which when taken in the popular sense is that of the Scholastics, and which I consider impossible, as do the Cartesians; (2) that of a perpetual supervisor who represents in the one everything which happens in the other, a little as if a man were charged with constantly synchronizing two bad clocks which are in themselves incapable of agreement –– this is the system of occasional causes; and (3) that of the natural agreement of two substances such as would exist between two very exact clocks. I find this last view fully as possible as that of a supervisor and more worthy of the author of these substances, clocks or automata. (GP IV, 520 [L 494])
This highly metaphorical passage presents Leibniz’s own view, the last of the three options, as both “possible,” and “more worthy” than its competitors of being the product of divine invention. The first view, which Leibniz refers to as the “system of mutual influence,” is also labeled by him “the theory of physical influence” (A VI, 6, 135 [NE 135]), and “the hypothesis of influx” (C 521 [L 269]), among other labels. Leibniz’s claim about this theory of causation is that it is simply impossible. The other main competitor, occasionalism (or “the system of occasional causes”) is possible according to Leibniz, but it is not worthy, and so it is at least implausible. Why did Leibniz consistently make such claims about the rival theories of causation?
While the history of the influx theory is complex and often unclear, it seems to have originated in the Neoplatonic tradition and was put to work by a number of medieval Scholastic philosophers (see O’Neill, 1993). The details of the history and various formulations of the influx model need not concern us here however, for what is important is that Leibniz rejects any model of causation that involves a transmission of parts between substances, that is, a passing on of something from one substance (the cause) to another (the effect). And Leibniz uses the terminology “influx” or “influence” to refer to any model of causation that involves passing properties, or “accidents,” from one substance to another, or from one “monad”––the term for Leibnizian substances––to another. The best–known passage containing Leibniz’s rejection of this model is from Monadology 7:
There is, furthermore, no way to explain how a monad could be altered or changed in its inner make-up by some other created being. For one can transpose nothing in it, nor conceive in it any internal motion that could be excited, directed, increased, or diminished within it, as can happen in composites where there is change among the parts. Monads have no windows through which something can enter into or depart from them. Accidents cannot be detached, nor wander about outside of substances, as the sensible species of the Scholastics formerly did. And so, neither substance nor accident can enter a monad from without. (GP VI, 607f. [AG 213f.])
The Scholastic model of causation involved properties of things (“species”) leaving one substance, and entering another. Consider what happens when one looks at a red wall: one’s sensory apparatus is causally acted upon. According to the target of this passage, this involves a sensible property of the wall (a “sensible species”) entering into the mind’s sensorium. According to Leibniz, “nothing ever enters into our mind naturally from the outside” (GP IV, 607 [AG 214]). Leibniz’s message is clear enough: since substances as he conceives of them are “windowless”––that is, indivisible, partless, immaterial, soul-like entities––there is no place for anything to enter into it, or leave it. As a result, one cannot conceive of a property or part of something entering a monad and transposing its parts, for monads have no parts and thus have no portals in which to enter and exit. Given that monads have no parts or windows, it is, as we have seen Leibniz claim, impossible for this theory to be true. Hence, it is not true, according to Leibniz.
It is clear that Leibniz viewed occasionalism––Malebranche’s theory of causation––as the leading contender, for he addressed it in a number of published and unpublished writings spanning the course of decades. According to occasionalism, God is the only truly causally efficacious being in the universe. According to Leibniz, Malebranche’s “strongest argument for why God alone acts” (ML 412) is roughly as follows. A true cause, for Malebranche, is one according to which there is a necessary connection between it and its effect. Since bodies cannot move themselves, it must be minds that move bodies. But since there is no necessary connection between the will of a finite mind and what it wills, it follows that the only true cause is the will of God, that is, the only will for which there is a necessary connection between it and what it wills (that is, its effects). Hence, what appear to be causally efficacious acts of will by finite beings are mere occasions for God––the only true cause––to exercise his efficacious will.
Leibniz used three arguments against occasionalism. First, he argued that occasionalism consistently violates “the great principle of physics that a body never receives a change in motion except through another body in motion that pushes it.” According to Leibniz, this principle has “been violated by all those who accept souls or other immaterial principles, including here even all of the Cartesians [such as Malebranche]” (GP VI, 541 [L 587]). In other words, Leibniz believed that occasionalism, by claiming that a material object can be put into motion by something other than another material object, namely, the occasional cause of a finite will and the true cause of the divine will, violated a fundamental principle of physics. As we shall see, Leibniz believed the preestablished harmony did not do so, since every non-initial state of a body in motion has, as a real cause, some state of a body in motion.
Second, Leibniz often argued that occasionalism involved “perpetual miracles.” Consider the following from a letter to Antoine Arnauld of 30 April 1687:
[I]f I understand clearly the opinions of the authors of occasional causes, they introduce a miracle which is no less one for being continual. For it seems to me that the concept of the miracle does not consist of rarity. … I admit that the authors of occasional causes may be able to give another definition of the term, but it seems that according to usage a miracle differs intrinsically through the substance of the act from a common action, and not by an external accident of frequent repetition, and that strictly speaking God performs a miracle whenever he exceeds the forces he has given to creatures and maintains in them. (GP II, 92f. [LA 116])
Notice that Leibniz’s objection is not simply that occasionalism is miraculous because God is constantly acting in the course of nature. Rather, his objection is that according to occasionalism, there is nothing in the nature of objects to explain how bodies behave. All change on Malebranche’s system is explained by appeal to God, and not by the natures or intrinsic forces of created things. Finite bodies on this view are merely extended hunks of matter with no nature by appeal to which one can explain motion. Thus, there is no natural explanation for natural change (no naturally inner cause of motion), and hence such change is supernatural, that is, miraculous.
Finally, this second argument is closely connected with a third argument. Throughout all of his later years, Leibniz sought to distance himself from Spinoza. His primary way of doing so was to insist that there are genuine finite substances, a claim at odds with Spinoza’s monism. According to Leibniz, the very nature of a substance consists in force, or its ability to act, for if it has no such ability, then it is a mere modification of God, the only other substance who could act. Leibniz believed that occasionalism was in danger of reducing into the view of Spinoza—a doctrine inconsistent with traditional theology, and in any event, according to Leibniz, one at odds with the common sense view that creatures are genuine individuals:
I have many other arguments to present and several of them serve to show that according to the view which completely robs created things of all power and action, God would be the only substance, and created things would be only accidents or modifications of God. So those who are of this opinion will, in spite of themselves, fall into that of Spinoza, who seems to me to have taken furthest the consequences of the Cartesian doctrine of occasional causes. (GP IV, 590 [WF 164])
Because occasionalism makes God the principle of activity in created substances, it makes God the very nature of created substances. Hence, there is only one substance (God), and created individuals are modifications of God. So, Leibniz argued that occasionalism has the dangerous consequence of collapsing into Spinozism. (For considerations of Leibniz’ treatments of occasionalism, see Rutherford, 1993; Sleigh 1990.)
Leibniz maintained that created substances were real causes, that God was not the only causally efficacious being (that is, that occasionalism was false), and that intersubstantial causation could not be understood in terms of a physical influx. So, what was Leibniz’s account of causation?
Leibniz’s account of causation was in terms of his famous doctrine of the preestablished harmony. This doctrine contains three main ingredients:
(1) No state of a created substance has as a real cause some state of another created substance (that is, a denial of intersubstantial causality).
(2) Every non-initial, non-miraculous, state of a created substance has as a real cause some previous state of that very substance (that is, an affirmation of intrasubstantial causality).
(3) Each created substance is programmed at creation such that all its natural states and actions are carried out in conformity with––in preestablished harmony with––all the natural states and actions of every other created substance.
Consider the above claims in application to the mind-body relation. Leibniz held that for any mental state, the real cause of that state is neither a state of a body nor the state of some other mind. And for any bodily state, the real cause of that state is neither a state of a mind nor the state of some other body. Further, every non-initial, non-miraculous, mental state of a substance has as a real cause some previous state of that very mind, and every non-initial, non-miraculous, bodily state has as a real cause some previous state of that very body. Finally, created minds and bodies are programmed at creation such that all their natural states and actions are carried out in mutual coordination, with no intersubstantial mind-body causation involved.
For example, suppose that Troy is hit in the head with a hammer (call this bodily state Sb) and pain ensues (call this mental state Sm), a case of apparent body to mind causation. Leibniz would say that in such a case some state of Troy’s mind (soul) prior to Sm was the real cause of Sm, and Sb was not a real causal factor in the obtaining of Sm. Suppose now that Troy has a desire to raise his arm (call this mental state Sm), and the raising of his arm ensues (call this bodily state Sb), a case of apparent mind to body causation. Leibniz would say that in such a case some state of Troy’s body prior to Sb was the real cause of Sb and Sm was not a causal factor in the obtaining of Sb. So although substances do not causally interact, their states accommodate one another as if there were causal interaction among substances.
Mind-body causation was merely one case of causation, for Leibniz believed that a similar analysis is to be given in any case of natural causation. When one billiard ball in motion causes another one to move, there exists, metaphysically speaking, no real interaction between them. Rather, the struck billiard ball moved spontaneously upon contact by the billiard ball in motion. It did so in perfect harmony, that is, in such a way that it appears as though the first causes the second to move. All of this is summarized in Leibniz’s New System of Nature (1695), right after his rejection of occasionalism and physical influx:
Therefore, since I was forced to agree that it is not possible for the soul or any other true substance to receive something from without … I was led, little by little, to a view that surprised me, but which seems inevitable, and which, in fact, has very great advantages and rather considerable beauty. That is, we must say that God originally created the soul (and any other real unity) in such a way that everything must arise for it from its own depths, through a perfect spontaneity relative to itself, and yet with a perfect conformity relative to external things. … There will be a perfect agreement among all these substances, producing the same effect that would be noticed if they communicated through the transmission of species or qualities, as the common philosophers imagine they do. (GP IV, 484 [AG 143f.])
In the last sentence of the above passage, Leibniz refers to what the “common philosophers imagine.” As we have seen, Leibniz is here referring to those who endorse influx theory, the view that postulates “the transmission of species or qualities” (see Against Influx Theory above). Although Leibniz clearly found this theory unacceptable at the end of the day, he did nonetheless indicate that it is an acceptable way of understanding phenomenal nature. It is worth underscoring this point as it helps to highlight what exactly Leibniz has in mind. He writes in the New System:
Besides all the advantages that recommend this hypothesis [that is, preestablished harmony], we can say that it is something more than a hypothesis, since it hardly seems possible to explain things in any other intelligible way, … Our ordinary ways of speaking may also be easily preserved. For we may say that the substance whose state explains a change in an intelligible way (so that we may conclude that it is this substance to which the others have in this respect been adapted from the beginning, in accordance with the order of the decrees of God) is the one which, so far as this change goes, we should therefore think of as acting upon the others. Furthermore, the action of one substance on another is neither the emission nor the transplanting of an entity, as commonly conceived, and it can be reasonably understood only in the way I have just described. It is true that we can easily understand in connection with matter both the emission and receiving of parts, by means of which we quite properly explain all the phenomena of physics mechanically. But a material mass is not a substance, and so it is clear that action as regards an actual substance can only be as I have described. (GP IV, 487 [WF 20]; my emphasis)
There are at least two points worth emphasizing in this passage. First, Leibniz was clearly aware that his theory was at odds with common sense, that is, it is at odds with “our ordinary ways of speaking.” As the above passage indicates, he was concerned to preserve our usual ways of speaking about causal interactions. As a result, Leibniz held that there was a sense in which one could say, for example, that mental events influence bodily events, and vice-versa. He wrote to Antoine Arnauld that although “one particular substance has no physical influence on another … nevertheless, one is quite right to say that my will is the cause of this movement of my arm …; for the one expresses distinctly what the other expresses more confusedly, and one must ascribe the action to the substance whose expression is more distinct” (GP II, 71 [LA 87]). In this passage, Leibniz sets forth what he believed the metaphysical reality of apparent intersubstantial causation amounts to. We begin with the thesis that every created substance perceives the entire universe, though only a portion of it is perceived distinctly, most of it being perceived unconsciously, and, hence, confusedly. Now consider two created substances, x and y (x not identical to y), where some state of x is said to be the cause of some state of y. Leibniz’s analysis is this: when the causal state of affairs occurred, the relevant perceptions of substance x became more distinct, while the relevant perceptions of substance y became more confused. Insofar as the relevant perceptions of x become increasingly distinct, it is “causally” active; insofar as the relevant perceptions of substance y become increasingly confused, it is passive. In general, causation is to be understood as an increase in distinctness on the part of the causally active substance, and an increase in confusedness on the part of the passively effected substance. Again, each substance is programmed at creation to be active/passive at the relevant moment, with no occurrence of real substantial interaction. Thus, ordinary ways of speaking are preserved on the grounds that it is true according to the “distinct/confused analysis” to say that one object is the cause of another.
Second, the above passage indicates that when it comes to a mechanical study of phenomenal nature––that is, when it comes to natural philosophy––the influx model may be used. In a way this is not surprising, for as Leibniz makes clear in this passage, the objects of mechanics are physical masses, and these objects have parts (they have “windows”) via which parts can enter and exit and cause change. They are not substances, which again, have no such parts. So, it appears to be Leibniz’s view that at the level of the most real, the level of substances (monads), preestablished harmony is the correct view. However, the influx model is acceptable at the phenomenal level of mechanics, perhaps as an abstraction from, or idealization of the underlying reality. But note that this level is indeed phenomenal, that is, only an appearance, and any analysis on this level is not the end of the story. Still, for Leibniz, the fact that it is acceptable when it comes to mechanics preserves our ordinary ways of speaking, since it is a model of genuine intersubstantial causation. But such a way of speaking, for Leibniz, is certainly not metaphysically rigorous.
This last point about different Leibnizian metaphysical levels relates to another unique characteristic of Leibniz’s system. Although at the deepest level of analysis, preestablished harmony reigns supreme in Leibniz’s metaphysics, it is also true that Leibniz embraced a specific taxonomy of types of naturally operative causes, one that incorporated both ancient and modern conceptions of causation. Specifically, Leibniz maintained, in accordance with his belief that the phenomenal level can be treated as engaging in intersubstantial causation, that “laws of efficient causes” govern bodies. Consider the following from the Monadology:
The soul follows its own laws and the body likewise follows its own; and they agree by virtue of the preestablished harmony among all substances, because they are all representations of one self-same universe.
Souls act according to the laws of final causes through appetition, ends, and means. Bodies act according to the laws of efficient causes or of motions. And the two realms, that of efficient causes and that of final causes, are harmonious with one another. (GP VI, 620 [AG 223])
In accordance with the mechanical philosophy that prevailed during Leibniz’s lifetime, he held that the motions of bodies are to be understood as engaging in efficient causal relations, or behaving according to “laws of efficient causes.” But Leibniz also believed, as the above passage indicates, that final causation was prevalent in the world, and that it operated in harmony with the realm of efficient causation. Indeed, in the passage above, Leibniz presented his usual bifurcation of the world into two realms: the bodily realm is governed by efficient causation, and the realm of souls (individual substances) is governed by final causation.
A final cause of some activity is that for which that activity occurs; it is a goal, or end, or purpose of some activity. In claiming that souls act according to final causes, Leibniz seems to have in mind that they are essentially goal driven entities. Any given substance (such as a soul), according to Leibniz, is endowed with two powers: perception and appetite. Leibniz characterizes appetition thus: “The action of the internal principle which brings about the change or the passage from one perception to another may be called appetition” (GP VI, 609 [AG 215]). Appetitions are the ultimate principles of change in the Leibnizian universe, as they are responsible for the activity of the ultimately real things, substances. In claiming, therefore, that substances are governed by laws of final causes, Leibniz has in mind that appetitions lead a substance to strive for certain future perceptual states:
[S]ince the nature of a simple substance consists of perception and appetite, it is clear that there is in each soul a series of appetites and perceptions, through which it is lead from the end to the means, from the perception of one object to the perception of another. (C 14 [MP 175])
It is a matter of some controversy whether Leibniz held that appetitive states of a substance are intrasubstantial productive causes of change (that is, efficient causes of change), and there are texts that can be brought to bear on both sides of the issue. (See Carlin, 2004, 2006; Davidson, 1998; Murray, 1995, 1996; Paull, 1992.) In some passages, Leibniz separates the world into what appear to be functionally autonomous causal realms:
Souls act according to the laws of final causes through appetition, ends, and means. Bodies act according to the laws of efficient causes or of motions. And the two realms, that of efficient causes and that of final causes, are harmonious with one another. (GP VI, 620 [AG 223])
But in other texts, Leibniz seems clearly to suggest that final causes are a species of efficient cause, and hence are productive causes of change. Consider the following:
[T]he present state of body is born from the preceding state through the laws of efficient causes; the present state of the soul is born from its preceding state through the laws of final causes. The one is the place of the series of motion, the other of the series of appetites; the one is passed from cause to effect, the other from end to means. And in fact, it may be said that the representation of the end in the soul is the efficient cause of the representation in the same soul of the means. (Dut, II, 2, 134; my emphasis)
Thus, in this text, Leibniz suggests that final causes themselves produce future perceptions by way of efficient causation.
In this connection, it is worth noting that there is a sense in which final causation is operative at the level of phenomenal bodies as well. “There is,” Leibniz writes in the New Essays, “a moral and voluntary element in what is physical, through its relation to God. . . . [B]odies do not choose for themselves, God having chosen for them” (A VI, 6, 179 [NE 179]). Mechanical bodies, understood as phenomenal hunks of matter, do not exhibit intentionality. Thus, they do not frame their own ends in the way that immaterial substances do. Still, there is a sense in which they are subject to final causes, for they act for the ends that God has set for them, and they do so by way of mechanical efficient causation. Thus, there is some suggestion that Leibniz held that both efficient and final causation permeated the universe at multiple ontological levels.
But whether or not Leibniz believed that both types of causes operated at multiple ontological levels, he did nonetheless believe that the harmony of efficient and final causes explained the ordinary conscious activity of substances, including that sort of activity often cited as involving free will:
[T]he laws that connect the thoughts of the soul in the order of final causes and in accordance with the evolution of perceptions must produce pictures that meet and harmonize with the impressions of bodies on our organs; and likewise the laws of movements in the body, which follow one another in the order of efficient causes, meet and so harmonize with the thoughts of the soul that the body is induced to act at the time when the soul wills it. (GP VI, 137 [T 62])
Although it might appear to some that such a view is inconsistent with freedom of the will, Leibniz did not think so, for he repeatedly maintained that human souls, though governed by preestablished laws of final causes, act with freedom of the will (e.g. GP VII, 419 [L 716f.]). (Whether he was entitled to such a view is another matter.) It is also worth noting that in a number of passages, Leibniz argues that this harmony between types of causation accounts for the very union of the human body and soul (cf. GP VI, 599 [AG 208]).
Finally, Leibniz does not restrict his doctrine of final causation to the conscious activity of rational agents, for he seems to recognize final causal activity everywhere in his system. Consider the following from his Notes on Stahl:
[T]hat motion is not improperly called voluntary, which is connected with a known distinct appetite, where we notice the means at the hands of our soul, being adapted to the end itself; although in other [non-voluntary] movement also, appetites proceed to their own ends through means, albeit they are not noticed by us. (Dut II, 2, 136; my emphasis)
Here Leibniz claimed that final causes operate at the level of the unconscious: a mental state can function as a final cause without our being aware of it. In a letter of 8 May 1704 to Sophie Charlotte, Leibniz made essentially the same point: “So that even in our instinctive or involuntary actions, where it seems only the body plays a part, there is in the soul an appetite for good or an aversion to evil which directs it, even though our reflection is not able to pick it out in the confusion” (GP III, 347 [WF 224f.]). It seems to follow that the preestablished harmony between efficient and final causes has wider application than one might suppose at first glance.
Although Leibniz maintained against the occasionalists and Spinoza that created substances were genuine sources of their own activity, and that it is not true that God alone is the source of all natural activity, he did nonetheless believe in a doctrine of divine conservation and concurrence. Briefly, according to the latter, God is not an absentee creator, but is involved in every aspect of the natural world, including the causal activity of created substances. Since Leibniz held that creatures are real causes of their own actions, this means that both God and creatures concur in bringing about the effects of the actions of created substances.
Although the texts on this aspect of Leibniz’s theory of natural causation are notoriously thorny, the following passage seems to represent what is his considered view:
The concurrence of God consists in giving us continually whatever there is of reality in us and our actions, insofar as it contains some perfection; but what there is therein of limitation or imperfection is a consequence of preceding limitations, which are originally in the creature. (GP VI, 340 [T 377])
In general, the idea seems to be this: creatures are real causes of the imperfections in actions, while God is responsible for the perfection contained in the action. But this general idea seems clearly inconsistent with a number of other doctrines put forth by Leibniz. For example, there is reason to believe that he holds that a substance can be said to act only insofar as it tends towards perfection (cf. GP VI, 615 [AG 219]). If this is the case, then in conjunction with the passage above, it appears that God is the only active agent. Moreover, Leibniz, along with many other seventeenth century thinkers, held that divine conservation of the world amounts to a continual recreation of every substance and all their states. If this is the case, one is left wondering how not to slip into the occasionalism of Malebranche, for it would seem once again that creatures are not producing anything. This notoriously difficult topic has recently spawned a body of secondary literature, as commentators have struggled with the apparent inconsistencies. (Adams, 1994; Lee, 2004; Sleigh, 1990)
References to works of Leibniz are cited by abbreviation according to the key below. Each one is cited by page number unless otherwise noted. ASämtliche Schriften und Briefe. Multiple volumes in seven series. Edited by the German Academy of Sciences. Darmstadt and Berlin: Berlin Academy, 1923–. Cited by series, volume, and page.
Philosophical Essays. Edited and translated by Roger Ariew and Daniel Garber. Indianapolis: Hackett, 1989.
Opera Omnia. Edited by L. Dutens. Geneva: Fratres De Tournes, 1768. Cited by volume, and page.
Die Philosophischen Schriften von Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz. 7 vols. Edited by C.I. Gerhardt. Berlin: Weidman, 1875-1890. Cited by volume and page.
Philosophical Papers and Letters. Edited by Leroy Loemker, 2nd ed. Dordrecht: Reidel, 1969.
The Leibniz-Arnauld Correspondence. Translated and edited by H.T. Mason. Manchester: Manchester UP, 1967.
Philosophical Writings. Translated and edited by Mary Morris and G.H.R. Parkinson. London: Dent, 1973.
New Essays on Human Understanding. Translated and edited by Peter Remnant and Jonathon Bennett. Cambridge: Cambridge UP, 1982. The original French text is in A VI, 6.
Theodicy. Edited by Austin Farrer and translated by E.M. Huggard. New Haven: Yale UP, 1952. Cited by section number as in GP VI.
Leibniz’s ‘New System’ and Associated Contemporary Texts. Translated and edited by R.S. Woolhouse and Richard Francks. Oxford: Oxford UP, 1997.
University of Wisconsin, Oshkosh
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Last updated: March 30, 2008 | Originally published: