A salonnière during the reign of Louis XIV, Ninon de Lenclos embodied libertinism in both theory and practice. As a notorious courtesan, Lenclos scandalized France by her numerous affairs with prominent statesmen and ecclesiastics. As a philosopher, she justified sexual license by her naturalistic theories of human nature and of morality. In Lenclos’s perspective, the human person is demonstrably a part of material nature. Allegedly spiritual human experiences, love in particular, are only a sophisticated variation on animal instincts. Rather than being a pursuit of spiritualized virtue, human moral conduct is the effort to expand pleasure and to eliminate pain. Within the hierarchy of pleasures, romantic love constitutes the pinnacle. Lenclos condemns the ascetical ethics of monastic Christianity and of Platonism because it has exalted a spiritualized love which is illusory and impossible to practice. In her mechanistic theory of the world, material causation is responsible for many of the intellectual and volitional activities other philosophers wrongly attribute to an immaterial soul. Through her naturalistic metaphysics and her ethics of the primacy of pleasure, Lenclos contributed to the Epicurean revival of the French Renaissance. In her insistence on the equal rights of women and men to the pursuit of pleasure, Lenclos developed a gendered version of Epicureanism which challenged her society’s subordination of women to men.
Anne de Lenclos was born in Paris on November 10, 1620, and she died on October 17, 1705. She was nicknamed “Ninon” by her father. Her family was philosophically divided. A devout Catholic, her mother attempted to raise the precocious daughter according to the strict moral standards of Counter-Reformational Catholicism. A neo-Epicurean, her father introduced her to a more skeptical world outlook and to a libertine code of ethics. From an early age, Ninon clearly sided with her father’s perspective.
A child prodigy, Ninon de Lenclos enchanted Parisian salons with her mastery of the lute and clavichord. She mastered multiple foreign languages, including Spanish and Italian. A voracious reader, she maintained a life-long affection for her favorite philosopher, Montaigne.
During her teen years, Lenclos began her career as one of Paris’s most celebrated courtesans. During her many public affairs, she became the mistress of numerous prominent men. Statesmen included the Grand Condé, Gaston de Cligny; Louis de Mornay, marquis de Villarceaux; and François, duc de la Rochefoucauld. Clergy included the Abbé de Chateauneuf and Canon Gédoyn. Cardinal Richelieu counted among one of her spurned petitioners.
If Lenclos’s bold libertinism titillated the more skeptical salons, it scandalized the capital’s devout circles. Queen Anne of Austria, regent of France, placed Lenclos under house arrest at the Convent of the Madelonnettes in 1656. Thanks to the intervention of the exiled Christine, Queen of Sweden, who visited Lenclos in her convent cell, Lenclos was quickly freed from the convent and returned to her life as a courtesan.
Starting in 1667, Lenclos conducted a salon at the Hôtel de Sagonne in Paris. Major philosophical writers participating in the salon included the Cartesian Fontenelle and a group of neo-Epicurean authors: Charles de Saint-Évremond; Antoine Gombaud, chevalier de Méré; and Damien Mitton. The religious skepticism of this circle permeated the libertine atmosphere of Lenclos’s salon. Prominent literary figures included the aphorist François de la Rochefoucauld; the fabulist Jean de La Fontaine; the memorialist Louis de Rouvroy, duc de Saint-Simon; the chronicler Roger de Rabutin, comte de Bussy; the poet Jean Chapelle; the dramatist Jean Racine; and the literary critic Nicolas Boileau. Lenclos was especially close to Molière, whose anticlerical Tartuffe received an earlier reading in her salon. Other artists included the painter Nicolas Mignard and the musical composer Jean-Baptiste Lully. One of the central members of the salon was Henri de Sévigné, the husband of the famous epistoler; the correspondence between the Marquis de Sévigné and Lenclos would survive as Lenclos’s major piece of philosophical reflection. Numerous women also participated in the salon. Notable female authors included Marguerite de la Sablière; Henriette de Coligny, comtesse de la Suze; and Françoise d’Aubigné, the future Madame de Maintenon and morganatic wife of Louis XIV.
Over the decades, Lenclos’s salon became a protected meeting place for those who treated Christianity with skepticism and who championed a neo-Epicurean ethics of pleasure, with romantic love canonized as the supreme good. Lenclos impressed her guests with her wit and her defense of a life devoted to the pursuit of refined pleasure without conventional religious restraints. To the outrage of the devout, she presented lectures on love, with detailed counsels on romantic conquest and disentanglement. Female students were admitted for free; male students paid tuition. A generous patron of authors in need, she provided the young Voltaire with a substantial gift for the purchase of books in her will and testament.
The major extant philosophical work of Lenclos is found in her correspondence. In 1750, Crébillon fils published a posthumous collection of Lenclos’s correspondence with the Marquis de Sévigné [LMDS]. In the letters, Lenclos details her philosophy of love and the naturalistic metaphysics and ethics underpinning it. Lenclos conducted a later correspondence (1697-1702) with Saint-Évremond, a neo-Epicurean friend and disciple of Gassendi. First published in 1752, these letters express her views on aging and death.
A 1659 pamphlet, The Coquette Avenged, has long been attributed to her. This brief work defends the possibility of a virtuous life independent of all formal religious influence. Contemporary literary scholars doubt that Lenclos is the actual author of this work, but it does express the secularist moral philosophy which characterized Lenclos and her inner salon circle.
Throughout her career, Lenclos declared herself a disciple of Epicurus. In a letter to her, Saint-Évremond defines the neo-Epicurean creed of their milieu:
It would be useless to press the arguments, repeated a hundred times by the Epicureans, that the love of pleasure and the abolition of pain are the primary and most natural inclinations noticed in all people. Wealth, power, honor, and virtue contribute to our happiness, but the enjoyment of pleasure, let us call it voluptuousness, to sum up everything in a word, is the true aim and purpose to which all human acts are inclined. (Letter to the modern Leontium)
For Lenclos, the activity of love is the clearest human manifestation of the fundamental inclination to maximize pleasure and to minimize pain. Rather than the virtues, it is the passions which dominate the human will in its moral choices. Natural inclination determines psychological interaction as surely as it does the physical interaction of bodies. In exploring the romantic pursuit of pleasure, Lenclos argues for the fundamental equality and reciprocity between the genders.
The sentiment of love is predominantly an instinct. It is a passion which owes little to reason. “The precise truth is that love is just a blind instinct which one must personally experience in order to appreciate it. It is an appetite which one has for one object in preference to another. One is not able to provide reasons for why one has this particular taste (LMDS no. 2).” The instinctual and emotive nature of love precludes rational justification for its emergence and development.
Lenclos stresses the sensate nature of love. The stereotyped practices of the lover indicate the sensual nature of the passion and its associated states. “Now tell me honestly: If your love were not the work of the senses, would you experience such pleasure in pondering that form, those eyes you find so beguiling, that mouth which you describe to me in such glowing colors (LMDS no. 11)?” While friendship may be contracted with many different types of people, love maintains a close connection with physical attraction. The obsessions common to the state of love indicate its sensate framework.
The attempt to tie the phenomenon of love to human reason leads to illusion. Especially damaging is the effort to refine love according to the canons of chivalry.
If you attempt to walk in the footsteps of our ancient heroes of the romances and attempt to develop great and restrained sentiments, you will soon discover that this alleged heroism only turns love into a sad and occasionally lethal folly. Love in fact is fanaticism. If you separate it from the romantic baggage public opinion has added to it, it will soon give you its proper sort of pleasure and happiness. Trust me: If it were reason that designed the affairs of the heart, love would be insipid (LMDS no. 4).
Divorced from its distinctive emotive violence, love would disappear and deteriorate into simple affection based on convenience or calculation.
Love also eludes moral subordination. It is basically an amoral passion. The characterization of the moral character of an amorous experience is the responsibility of the moral agent who has undergone it. “Love is a passion which is neither good nor bad in and of itself. Only those who have been affected by it can decide whether it is good or evil (LMDS no. 8).”
Especially illusory is the effort to conflate love with moral virtue. Despite efforts to subordinate love to virtue, love will govern even the most virtuous person as the natural instinct which it is.
Oh, you mortals, who rely so much on the power of your virtue! No matter how great your strength may be, there are moments when the most virtuous person becomes the weakest. The reason for this strange fact is that nature is always pursuing us. It is always aiming to achieve its ends. The desire for love in a woman is a substantial part of her natural constitution; her virtue has only been patched on (LMDS no. 10).
The effort to present love as a virtue masks the fundamental fact that love is a natural instinct, accountable to neither intellect nor will. Ascetical efforts to eliminate the arational dimensions of love will fail, given this natural inclination’s violent claim over the human person.
Since love can be explained by natural causation, it should be the object of neither praise nor blame. It is no more moral or immoral than the human instinct toward hydration and nutrition. “If I were you, I would not speculate on whether it is a good or bad thing to fall in love. I would rather have you speculate on whether it is good or bad to be thirsty, or whether it should be forbidden to give someone a drink just because some people might end up inebriated (LMDS no.9).” The natural causation of human love justifies Lenclos’s sexual libertinism. Like other natural impulses, sexual desire should be discussed in an objective, non-moral way. The possible distortions of this impulse should not lead to a moral censure of it or an attempt to repress it.
Lenclos’s naturalistic theory of the origin of love often uses mechanistic rhetoric. Echoing Descartes, Lenclos perceives amorous desire as the reflex reactions of the body-machine to external stimuli. “We have our need to have our emotions stimulated. Connected to our emotions is our basic physical machinery. This machinery is the ultimate and necessary cause of love (LMDS no. 8).” This mechanistic account of the origin and nature of human love reinforces Lenclos’s critique of efforts to rationalize or moralize what is simply a powerful natural instinct. Attempts to locate love’s origins in the allegedly spiritual faculties of intellect and will not only obscure its actual material roots; they ground ethical codes of love which mandate an unrealistic regulation of a powerful and necessary impulse.
According to Lenclos, love is only the highest of goods in the hierarchy of pleasures which human beings pursue. “All that I can say in favor of love is that it gives us a greater pleasure than any of the other comforts of life. It pulls us out of our routines and stirs us up. It is love which satisfies one of our most urgent needs (LMDS no.8).” An authentic moral compass gauges the greater pleasures and the greater pains in light of the natural human inclinations which demand satisfaction. Herein lies the authentic path of human happiness.
Although love represents the highest pleasure known to the mature adult, it is a complex pleasure, often bearing concomitant pain.
When I spoke about temper I only meant the type which gives a stronger attraction, anxiety, and a little jealousy: that, in a word, which springs from love alone and not from any natural vulgarity, the vulgarity we often call ‘bad temper.’ When it is love that makes a woman difficult, when that alone is the cause of her prickliness, how can a lover be so insensitive as to complain about it? Don’t those rough spots only demonstrate the violence of this passion? Personally, I have always believed that those lovers who try to keep themselves within reasonable bounds are not completely in love. Can we really be in love without permitting ourselves to be pushed on by the fire of a consuming impetuosity, without experiencing all the commotion it necessarily causes? No, without any doubt (LMDS no.5)!
The mental and physical anguish provoked by the experience of authentic love is only a necessary dolor intrinsic to the greater pleasure of love itself. In fact, this violent moodiness constitutes one of the darker pleasures for the connoisseurs of sophisticated passion.
Love’s mixed pleasure is especially challenging for women. The contemporary Frenchwoman suffers from two social desires springing from romantic love: the desire to make her romantic conquest known by others and the desire to avoid censure by society.
A woman is always trying to balance two irreconcilable passions which continually agitate her soul: the desire to please and the fear of dishonor. You can easily recognize our embarrassment. On the one hand, we are consumed with the desire to have an audience to notice the effect of our charms….We would like the entire world to witness the favors we encounter and the homage paid to us….We enjoy the despair of our rivals and the indiscretions which betray the sentiments we inspire in others. We are delighted in proportion to the extent of the misery they suffer….But such sweet pleasures bring great bitterness….A sober and reasonable woman always prefers her reputation to romantic celebrity (LMDS no. 23).
The social context of love in the era of the salon complicates its mixed pleasures. The desire to be acclaimed as a triumphant courtesan, enjoying the rarified pleasure of revenge on one’s rivals, conflicts with the desire to maintain one’s moral status in a civil society which swiftly punishes the least trace of sexual transgression. The pleasure of sexual conquest contests the more sober pleasure of social esteem.
In her defense of an ethics of pleasure, Lenclos criticizes the dominant ethics of virtue. Led by the Platonists, philosophers have long mistakenly transformed the natural inclination of love, dominated by the axis of pain and pleasure, into the moralized field of virtue and vice.
Isn’t love a passion? Don’t very upright people argue that the passions and the vices are the same thing? Is vice ever more seductive than when it wears the cloak of virtue? In order to corrupt virtuous souls, it is sufficient for the alleged vice of love to appear in potential form. The Platonists deified love in an idealized form. In every age, in order to justify the passions, it was necessary to apotheosize them. What am I saying here? Am I so forward as to play the iconoclast with a prestigious superstition? Such temerity! Don’t I deserve to be attacked by all women for questioning their favorite cult (LMSD no.27)?
Both the condemnation of love as a vice and the exaltation of Platonic love to a virtue mask the material origins and nature of the amatory impulse. The contemporary morals of love occult the amoral nature of this mechanical inclination and delude moral agents into the censure of all carnal romance or into the pursuit of an impossibly rarified love emptied of all passion.
In her critique of the ethics of virtue, Lenclos attacks the moral asceticism that has long distorted the practice of love in France. Both Christianity and philosophy bear responsibility for the refusal to accord pleasure its natural rights in the human experience of love.
How I pity our good ancestors! What they thought was a mortal weariness and a melancholic madness we consider a joyous folly and a delightful delirium. They were fools. They preferred the austerities of deserts and rocks to the pleasures of a garden bursting with flowers. The habit of reflection has visited such prejudices upon us (LMDS no.8).
Christian and philosophical asceticism has not only attempted to eradicate sexual pleasure by considering love as a vice; it has turned all the pleasures of civilization into a temptation to be shunned in favor of the hermit-like illusions of the desert.
Lenclos’s treatment of love as a natural impulse is part of a broader naturalist metaphysics. The workings of nature, often conceived in mechanistic terms, cause many of the human actions wrongly interpreted as the offspring of a spiritual intellect or will.
The itinerary of romantic love indicates the all-embracing power of this natural causation. A romantic affair which begins in the illusion that it is the artifice of refined virtue quickly reveals its debt to the imperious powers of nature.
At the beginning of their affair, lovers fancy themselves inspired by the noblest and most refined sentiments. They exhaust their ingenuity, exaggerations, and the gushing of the most exquisite metaphysics. For a period they are intoxicated with the belief that their love is of a superior nature. But let us follow them as their affair unfolds. Nature quickly recovers its rights and re-assumes its influence. Soon enough, vanity, tired by the effusions of such an exalted purpose, leaves the heart free to express its feelings without any restraint. The day arrives when these lovers become dissatisfied with the pleasures of love. After having traveled a long circuit, they are surprised to find themselves at the very point where a peasant, following the inclinations of nature, would have begun (LMDS no. 9).
Even the most exalted romantic itinerary ultimately reveals its debt to the same forces of nature which control the amorous urges of the most illiterate peasant. Nature, rather than soul, controls human action.
Love is not the only area where nature manifests its blind hold over human desire and action. Nature determines the entire spectrum of objects to which the human person is attracted in its moral deliberations. “In forming us, nature gave us a certain range of sentiments, which must expend themselves upon some particular object (LMDS no. 2).” The predictable objects of desire for the various human instincts indicate how determinative nature has been in the constitution of the human person.
This naturalistic metaphysics is often presented in mechanistic terms. The phenomenon of love is only the most prominent of the activities by which the human body reveals its fundamental nature as a machine whose internal instincts are manipulated by appropriate external stimuli. “We women enter the world with this necessity of loving undefined. If we take one man in preference to another, let us honestly admit that we yield less to some knowledge of merit than to some mechanical instinct, which is nearly always blind (LMDS no.14).” The mechanistic nature of human deliberation and interaction is only masked by philosophical efforts to attribute such functions to a chimerical soul.
In her analysis of love, Lenclos criticizes the roles assigned each gender in contemporary France. She insists that the psychological qualities of men do not differ from those of women. Furthermore, she insists that for love to yield its maximum pleasure, men must learn to treat women with a respect they have heretofore denied them.
In the dominant social prejudices of her era, men and women were perceived as fundamentally different in psyche as in body. In romantic intercourse, women were to be pleasant and amusing; men were to be intellectual and commanding. Lenclos argues, however, that the arts of politeness are as necessary for men as they are for women.
It is not because you [Marquis de Sévigné and other men] possess superior qualities that you are an agreeable companion….To be embraced with outstretched arms, you must be sympathetic, amusing, important to the pleasure of others. I warn you that you cannot succeed in any other manner, especially with women. Now tell me, what would you like me to do with your learning, with the geometry of your mind, and with the exactitude of your memory? Dear Marquis, if you only have such advantages, if you have no personal charm to balance your austerity, you will not please women. I can vouch for that. Far from pleasing them, you will seem to them like an intimidating critic. You will so constrain them that any pleasure they might have enjoyed in your presence will be banished (LMDS no. 7).
For romantic love to flourish, reciprocity must reign between the two partners. Men as well as women must cultivate the gentle arts of charm, flirtation, and fascination. The sexual stereotype of the emotional woman and the rational man must be abolished in favor of a more egalitarian vision of both genders called to develop both their intellectual and affective personalities.
In her critique of masculine misperceptions of women, Lenclos argues that men must learn to treat women as they themselves would like to be treated. She criticizes the Marquis de Sévigné for his misinterpretation of the reactions of a countess he is seeking to conquer romantically. Men must learn to empathize with the complex emotions women experience in the adventure of romantic love; like men, women must balance physical desire with public reputation.
A man without prejudice would see in the countess only a lover as reasonable as she is tender. Without stressing virtue, she remains attached to her reputation. In short, she is a woman who seeks to reconcile love and duty. The difficulty in allying these two contrary qualities is not slight. It is the source of the complexities which wound you. You yourself should imagine the battles she must sustain, the upheavals she endures, and the embarrassment she must be suffering on account of a lover who is too easily put off by signs of resistance (LMDS no. 43).
The masculine attempt to overwhelm women by a display of force and by a refusal to negotiate patiently destroys the possibility of authentic romance. In respecting the psychological complexity of women, a complexity more similar to that of men than men would usually imagine, men can both maximize their chance of romantic success and place the desired woman in a position of equality.
Lenclos’s long life as a bold courtesan, cheerfully mating prominent aristocrats and clerics of Parisian high society, has long overshadowed her contribution to philosophy. Most biographies detail the remarkable beauty of this courtesan into her eightieth year, her colorful affairs, and the scandals of her libertine salon. A series of artists have fictionalized her as the courtesan par excellence. In the nineteenth century, Henrion Ragueneau de la Chainaye wrote the drama Ninon de l’Enclos: comédie historique en un acte and Eugène de Mirecourt published the novel Mémoires de Ninon de Lenclos. In the twentieth century, director Abel Gance featured her in his film Cyrano et D’Artagnan and the cartoonist Patrick Cothias turned her into a comic spy in his graphic novels, especially Ninon secrète. An exception to this emphasis on scandal is the philosopher Victor Cousin (1792-1867), who treated Ninon de Lenclos as a philosopher who continued the hedonistic brand of philosophy she had learned from Saint-Évremond.
The recent revival of feminism has altered the racy popular portrait of Lenclos the naughty courtesan. Recent biographies have focused more extensively on the political sophistication, philosophical culture, and Epicurean theories of Lenclos. Duchêne (1984) underscores the complex philosophy of love by which Lenclos justified her numerous romantic liaisons. Debriffe (2002) presents Lenclos as a proto-feminist rebel against the submissive roles assigned to women in the genteel French society of the period.
Recent scholarship has focused on the actual writings and philosophical theories of Lenclos. Arenberg (2005), for example, studies the neo-Epicurean theories of aging and death present in Lenclos’s correspondence with Saint-Évremond. Lenclos’s theory of gender reciprocity and the role of her salon in the diffusion of Cartesianism and Epicureanism invite further investigation.
John J. Conley
Loyola University Maryland
U. S. A.
Last updated: March 26, 2011 | Originally published: