Like Kierkegaard, Jules Lequyer (Luh-key-eh) resisted, with every philosophical and literary tool at his disposal, the monistic philosophies that attempt to weave human choice into the seamless cloth of the absolute. Although haunted by the suspicion that freedom is an illusion fostered by an ignorance of the causes working within us, he maintained that in whatever ways we are made—by God, the forces of nature, or the conventions of society—there remain frayed strands in the fabric of human existence where self-making adds to the process. Declaring this freedom “the first truth” required by all genuine inquiry into truth, he also challenged traditional doctrines of divine creativity, eternity, and omniscience and he developed his own alternative based on what he saw as the implications of a true metaphysics of freedom.
Lequyer was a reclusive Breton who died in relative obscurity without having published anything. He held no important academic post and most of his literary and philosophical work remained unfinished. Despite these disadvantages, his influence on philosophy was much greater than the ignorance of his thought and of his name would suggest. Charles Renouvier and William James adopted many of his ideas about the meaning of human freedom, its reality, and how it is known. Echoes of Lequyer’s ideas, and sometimes the very phrases he used, are found in French existentialism and American process philosophy. A man of deep religious conviction but also of increasingly melancholy temperament, Lequyer expressed his philosophy in a variety of literary styles. As a consequence, he has been called “the French Kierkegaard,” although he and his more famous Danish contemporary knew nothing of each other.
Joseph-Louis-Jules Lequyer, born January 29, 1814 in the village of Quintin, France, was an only child. His father, Joseph Lequyer (1779-1837), was a respected physician, and his mother, Céleste-Reine-Marie-Eusèbe Digaultray (1772-1844), cared for the poor and sick in the Quintin hospital. The family name was subject to a variety of spellings, most notably, “Lequier” and “Lequyer” (occasionally with an accent aigu over the first e). Lequyer’s birth certificate had “Lequier” but in 1834 his father had the spelling legally fixed as “Lequyer” [Grenier, La Philosophie de Jules Lequier, 257-58]. Lequyer was not consistent in the way he spelled his name and the orthographic confusion persists in the scholarly literature. “Lequyer” is the spelling on the plaque marking his birthplace in Quintin and on his tombstone in Plérin.
Lequyer’s parents relocated from Quintin to the nearby town of St.-Brieuc along the north coast of Brittany where their son was educated in a little seminary. By the age of thirteen, he excelled in Greek and Latin. A pious Catholic upbringing, combined with his friendship with Louis Épivent (1805-1876), who himself became a cleric, nurtured Lequyer’s interests in philosophy and theology, especially the perennial question of human free will. The family spent vacations just north of St.-Brieuc near Plérin at an isolated cottage known as Plermont (a contraction of “Plérin” and “mont”) within walking distance of the coast. In this rural setting Lequyer spent many happy hours with his closest friend, Mathurin Le Gal La Salle (1814-1904). Another important attachment of his early years was Anne Deszille (1818-1909), also known as “Nanine.” Lequyer never married, although he twice proposed to Deszille (in 1851 and in 1861) and, to his great disappointment, she twice refused.
In 1834 Lequyer entered the École Polytechnique in Paris. The school regimen required students to rise at dawn, eat a meager breakfast, then study scientific subjects—mathematics, physics, and chemistry—until lunchtime. After lunch, there were military exercises, fencing, and horse riding, as well as lessons in dance and music. After supper, students retired to their studies until nightfall. The rigid schedule did not suit Lequyer’s contemplative habits so he was at cross purposes with some of his superiors. His troubles were exacerbated by the unexpected death of his father in 1837. The following year he failed the exam that would have qualified him to become a lieutenant. Viewing an offer to enter the infantry as an insult, he made a dramatic exit. He announced his resignation to the examining officer with these words: “My general, there are two types of justice, mine and yours” [Hémon, 145]. Of some interest is Lequyer’s physical description from his matriculation card: he stood just under five and a half feet, had blond hair, brown eyes, a straight nose, a small mouth, an oval face, a round chin, and scars under his left eye and on the right side of his chin [Brimmer 1975, Appendix III]. The scar on his chin was from a riding accident at the school which, in later years, he covered by wearing a beard.
The course of study in Paris introduced Lequyer to the determinism of Pierre Simon LaPlace (1749-1827). As the school’s military schedule had conflicted with his temperament, so the idea that every event is necessitated by its causes was in tension with his cherished religious ideas, in particular, the conviction of free will. By happy coincidence, he found in his new friend and classmate Charles Renouvier (1815-1903) a sounding board for his quandaries about freedom and necessity. Renouvier saw in Lequyer a strange combination of religious naïveté and philosophical profundity. Indeed, Renouvier never failed to acknowledge Lequyer’s genius and to refer to him—literally, to his dying days—as his “master” on the subject of free will [Derniers entretiens, 64]. Lequyer, chronically unable to complete most of what he wrote, benefited from Renouvier’s industry. Renouvier eventually published a small library of books, in some of which he included excerpts from Lequyer’s writing. Three years after his friend’s death Renouvier published, at his own expense, one-hundred and twenty copies of a handsome edition of his selection of Lequyer’s writings which he distributed free of charge to any interested party.
Upon leaving the École Polytechnique, Lequyer used the inheritance from his father to retire to Plermont where he lived with his mother and the family servant, Marianne Feuillet (probably born in 1792). Lequyer never had a head for finances, so his money was soon exhausted, although there remained properties in St.-Brieuc that his father had owned. In 1843, the three moved to Paris where Lequyer acquired a position teaching French composition to Egyptian nationals at the École Égyptienne. He had the misfortune of teaching at the school during its decline. Nevertheless, he worked to redesign its curriculum after the model of the École Polytechnique, but centered more on literature, poetry, and even opera. Lequyer’s mother died the year following the move to Paris. Worried over the state of her son’s mind, she entrusted him to the care of Feuillet with these words: “Oh, Marianne, keep watch over my poor Jules. He has in his heart a passion which, I greatly fear, will be the cause of his death” [Hémon, 172]. The exact object of his mother’s concern is unknown but in the fullness of time her words became prophetic.
On August 15, 1846, the day of celebration of the Assumption of Mary, Lequyer underwent a mystical experience that was occasioned by his meditations on the Passion of Christ. He wrote down his experience, alternating between French and Latin, which invites a comparison with Pascal’s Memorial. Lequyer’s indignation at those who caused Christ’s suffering is transformed, first, into a profound sense of repentance as he realizes that he too had “added some burden to the cross” by his sins, and, second, into the gratitude for the love of God in being forgiven his sins. On August 19th, the religious ecstasy recurred, this time as he took communion at the church of St.-Sulpice. Again, the theme of the suffering of Christ is paramount, but now giving way to a determination to share in those sufferings to such an extent that the Virgin Mary would be unable to distinguish him from her own son. Lequyer’s first biographer, Proper Hémon (1846-1918), spoke of the philosopher’s “bizarre religiosity” [Hémon, 184], but there can be no question that, despite his shortcomings and misfortunes, his mystical experiences found outlet in acts of devotion and charity for the remainder of his life.
Lequyer returned to Plermont with Feuillet in 1848, after the February revolution in Paris. Full of zeal for a rejuvenated Republic, he announced, with Renouvier’s help, his candidacy for a seat in the parliament of the Côtes-du-Nord as a “Catholic Republican” [Hémon, 188]. His published platform identifies freedom as the basis of rights and duties and it explicitly mentions the freedoms of the press, of association, of education, and of religion [Le Brech, 56-57]. Of note is that Lequyer received a glowing recommendation for political office from one of his former teachers at the École Polytechnique, Barthélémy Saint-Hilaire. However, like many in more rural areas who identified, or seemed to identify, with the Parisian revolutionaries, Lequyer was not elected. He came in twentieth on the list of candidates, receiving far too few votes to be among those who won a seat in the parliament.
After the election, which was in April 1848, Lequyer retired to Plermont and spent his days in study and meditation, which included long walks along the coast; sometimes he would stay out overnight. There was, however, the persistent problem of finances. Hémon reports that Lequyer would throw change wrapped in paper from his second floor study to the occasional beggar that passed by. From March 30, 1850 into 1851, he sold the family property in St.-Brieuc, leaving him only Plermont. When his aunt Digaultray died on March 31, 1850 he was hopeful of an inheritance of 10,000 francs. As luck would have it, the aunt’s will directed that the sum be doubled, but only on the condition that it be used to pay a debt of 20,000 francs that Lequyer owed to his first cousin, Palasme de Champeaux! The cousin died in August of the same year, so the inheritance went to his estate [Hémon, 245].
Lequyer’s letters to Renouvier indicate a heightened level of creativity in which he made major progress on his philosophical work. In a November 1850 letter, he claimed that he was writing “something unheard of,” namely that the first and most certain of truths is the declaration of one’s own freedom. This movement of thought ends with the idea that one is one’s own work, responsible to oneself, and “to God, who created me creator of myself” (Lequyer had written “creature of myself” but later changed it to “creator of myself”) [OC 70, 538]. Philosophical insights, however, were not enough to save Lequyer from the weight of his failed projects and his destitution which, arguably, contributed to a mental breakdown. On February 28, 1851, a neighbor found Lequyer wandering about with an axe with which he intended to cut his own arm; Lequyer was taken to the hospital in St.-Brieuc for observation. The doctors determined that he was a danger to himself and should be transferred to a mental institution. On March 3rd, Le Gal La Salle and the Abbot Cocheril took Lequyer to the asylum near Dinan, using subterfuge to lure him there. On April 12th, with the help of Paul Michelot (1817-1885) and some other friends, Lequyer was taken to Passy, near Paris, to the celebrated hospital-resort of Dr. Esprit Blanche, the well-known physician who specialized in mental disorders.
Lequyer was discharged from Passy on April 29th, improved but not completely recovered, according to the doctors. He returned to Plermont, there to be welcomed by the faithful Feuillet and to renew contact with an elderly neighbor, Madame Agathe Lando de Kervélégan (born 1790). Relations with others, however, were broken or became strained. Never accepting that his confinement was justified, he severed ties with Le Gal La Salle who he regarded as the one who had orchestrated it. In the book that he planned, a major section was labeled “Episode: Dinan.” Since the book was never completed, we cannot know Lequyer’s exact thoughts about his two months under medical supervision. That his perceptions were cloudy is indicated by the fact that, only a few months after his confinement, he proposed marriage to Nanine, believing she would accept. Her family, with a view to Lequyer’s mental and financial instability, encouraged her to refuse. This she did in a most forceful way by returning all of his letters and by instructing him to burn her letters to him. This he did, but not before making copies of certain excerpts.
For two years after the events of 1851 Lequyer’s whereabouts are unknown. His letters to Renouvier in the closing months of 1855 indicate that two years earlier he had gone to Besançon as a professor of mathematics at the Collège Saint-François Xavier. By Easter of 1854, however, relations with the head of the college, a Monsieur Besson, had gone sour. The details of the problem are unknown, but it seems that Besson scolded Lequyer for not coming to him to ask for something. According to Lequyer, Besson boasted that men of influence as great as the arch-bishop, “crawl at my feet” [OC 546]. Lequyer related this conversation to the Cardinal and Besson was demoted. One of Lequyer’s friends, Henri Deville, had written a well-intentioned letter to the Cardinal requesting that he find Lequyer another place in his diocese. The Cardinal, perhaps misinterpreting the request, turned against Lequyer. As a result, Lequyer was entangled in law suits with both Besson and the Cardinal over indemnities. Lequyer’s lawyer told him “all was lost” when he decided to act with dignity and not crawl at Besson’s feet [OC 549]. An interesting aspect of Lequyer’s sketchy account is that he says he was inspired by the memory of Dinan, imitating the man he had been there by controlling his anger in spite of the wrongs he perceived to have been done to him. Furthermore, he recognized Deville’s good intentions and, though he thought his intervention inappropriate, did not blame him for it.
By the close of 1855 Lequyer had returned to Plermont, never to leave again. Many of the most touching stories about Lequyer come from the last six years of his life. Though his relations with his friends were often strained, he inspired in them a seemingly unconditional loyalty. It was they after all who underwrote the considerable cost of staying at Passy. In his final years, his friends—including Le Gal La Salle who he had disowned—came to his aid more than once. For example, Lequyer frequented a restaurant in St.-Brieuc but would order embarrassingly meager portions. When the owner of the establishment told his friends, they instructed him to give Lequyer full meals and they would pay the difference. When the owner wondered whether Lequyer would notice the charity, the reply was, “Non, il est dans le ciel” [Hémon, 205]—his head is in the clouds—an apt metaphor for his impracticality and his philosophical preoccupations.
In 1858, on the recommendation of Madame Lando, Lequyer became the tutor of Jean-Louis Ollivier, the thirteen year old son of a customs officer of the same name who admired Lequyer’s rhetorical skills; the father once described Lequyer as “a magician of words” [Hémon, 191]. Lequyer taught young Ollivier but also employed him in transcribing Lequyer’s own writing into a more legible script. Ollivier studied with Lequyer for two years but at the close of 1860, passing the exam that allowed him the chance to study to become an administrator of the state, the boy left. A few months earlier (in April) Lequyer had the misfortune of losing a chance to become chief archivist for the Côtes-du-Nord because of a delay in mail service. With this opportunity missed and Ollivier gone, Lequyer was without his student and unemployed. Jean-Louis Le Hesnan, a man of twenty who was too frail to work in the fields took Olliver’s place as Lequyer’s secretary. This partnership, however, was not enough to lift the weight of loneliness.
In the year that followed, Lequyer’s condition deteriorated. His neighbors reported that he would lose track of time and come calling at late hours with no explanation. His hair and beard, no longer cared for, grew prematurely white. His gaze took on a lost and vacant stare. Lequyer’s quixotic hopes of marriage to Nanine were rekindled when, on December 28, 1861, her father died—he believed her father was the main obstacle to the marriage. He again proposed marriage; sometime in the first week of February he learned of her refusal, which she made clear was final. Lequyer’s behavior became frenzied and erratic. He was subject to bizarre hallucinations and he spoke of putting an end to his misery. On Tuesday, February 11, 1862, Lequyer went to the beach with Le Hesnan, shed his clothes, threw water on his chest, and jumped into the bay. He swam to the limits of his strength until he was visible only as a dot among the waves and he cried out. According to Le Hesnan, Lequyer’s last words would not have been a cry of distress but a farewell to Deszille—“Adieu Nanine” [Hémon, 232] At nine o’clock in the evening, Lequyer’s body washed ashore. Feuillet, who Lando described as Lequyer’s “second mother,” was waiting at Plermont to receive the body.
The official police report mentioned Lequyer’s “disturbed spirit” but ruled his death accidental. Nevertheless, a controversy erupted when a newspaper published a poem, “Les Adeiux de Jules Lequyer,” [The Farewells of Jules Lequyer] which was written in Lequyer’s voice and which suggested that he had committed suicide [Grenier, La Philosophie, 272]. Madame Lando eventually revealed herself as the author of the poem; she explained that she was saying Lequyer’s farewells for him in a way that he would have wished. The most propitious result of the controversy is that Charles Le Maoût, writing for Le Publicateur des Côtes-du-Nord (March 1, 1862), published an article titled “Derniers Moments de Jules Lequyer” [Last Moments of Jules Lequyer]. The article includes reports of Lequyer’s friends and neighbors about his final days, thereby providing insight into the disoriented and melancholy condition into which the philosopher had fallen. In November 1949, Dr. Yves Longuet, a psychiatrist at Nantes gave his professional opinion from the available evidence. He concluded that Lequyer suffered a “clear cyclopthemia,” that is to say, a manic-depressive personality [Grenier 1951, 37].
Renouvier’s edition of Lequyer’s work, noted above, bore the title La Recherche d’une première vérité [The Search for a First Truth]. The book is divided into three sections. The first, titled Comment trouver, comment chercher une première vérité? [How to Find, How to Search for a First Truth?], is prefaced by a brief quasi-autobiographical meditation, “La Feuille charmille” [The Hornbeam Leaf]. The second and third sections are, respectively, Probus ou le principe de la science: Dialogue [Probus or the Principle of Knowledge: Dialogue] and Abel et Abel—Esaü et Jacob: Récit biblique [Abel and Abel—Esau and Jacob: Biblical Narrative]. Collections edited by Jean Grenier in 1936 and 1952 brought together most of Lequyer’s extant work, including excerpts from his correspondence. Curiously absent from Grenier’s editions is a meditation on love and the Trinity; longer and shorter versions of this were published in subsequent collections (Abel et Abel 1991, pp. 101-08; La Recherche 1993, pp. 319-22). An unfinished short story from Lequyer’s earlier years titled La Fourche et la quenouille [The Fork and the Distaff] was published in 2010 and edited by Goulven Le Brech. Other collections have been published, but these form the corpus of Lequyer’s work.
“The Hornbeam Leaf” is Lequyer’s best known work. It was the one thing he wrote that he considered complete enough to distribute to his friends. It addresses, in the form of a childhood experience, the meaning and reality of freedom. Lequyer intended it to be the introduction to his work. It exhibits the best qualities of Lequyer’s writing in its dramatic setting, its poetic language, and its philosophical originality. Lequyer recalls one of his earliest memories as he played in his father’s garden. He is about to pluck a leaf from a hornbeam when he considers that he is the master of his action. Insignificant as it seems, the decision whether or not to pluck the leaf is in his power. He marvels at the idea that his act will initiate a chain of events that will make the world forever thereafter different than it might have been. As he reaches for the leaf, a bird in the foliage is startled. It takes flight only to be seized by a sparrow hawk. Recovering from the shock of this unintended consequence of his act, the child reflects on whether any other outcome was really possible. Perhaps the decision to reach for the leaf was one in a series of events in which each cause was itself the inevitable effect of a prior cause. Perhaps the belief that he could have chosen otherwise, that the course of events might have been different, is an illusion fostered by an ignorance of the antecedent factors bearing on the decision. The child is mesmerized by the thought that he might be unknowingly tangled in a web of necessity, but he recovers the faith in his freedom by a triumphant affirmation of his freedom.
Renouvier remarked that “The Hornbeam Leaf” recorded the point of departure of Lequyer’s philosophical effort [OC 3]. More than this, it illustrates the salient characteristics of freedom as Lequyer conceived them. For Lequyer, at a minimum, freedom involves the twin ideas that an agent’s decision is not a mere conduit through which the causal forces of nature operate and that it is itself the initiator of a chain of causes. Prior to the decision, the future opens onto alternate possibilities. The agent’s decision closes some of these possibilities while it opens others. After the decision is made, the feeling persists that one could have decided differently, and that the past would have been different because of the decision one might have made. Because the course of events is at least partially determined by the agent’s decision, Lequyer maintains that it creates something that, prior to the decision, existed only as a possibility. If one is free in this sense, then one is part creator of the world, and also of others. The child’s gesture leads to the bird’s death. Lequyer draws the corollary that the smallest of beginnings can have the greatest of effects that are unforeseen by the one who initiated the causal chain, a thought that makes even the least of decisions potentially momentous [OC 14, compare OC 201]. This is Lequyer’s version of what Edward Lorenz much later, and in a different context, dubbed “the butterfly effect”—a butterfly flaps its wings in Brazil which leads to a tornado in Texas.
For Lequyer, one’s decisions not only create something in the world, they double back on oneself. If one is free then, in some respects, one is self-creative. These ideas are expressed cryptically in Lequyer’s maxim which occurs in the closing pages of How to Find, How to Search for a First Truth?: “TO MAKE, not to become, but to make, and, in making, TO MAKE ONESELF” [OC 71]. When Lequyer denies that making is a form of becoming he is saying that the free act is not a law-like consequence of prior conditions. This is not to say that making or self-making is wholly independent of prior conditions. Lequyer borrows the language of Johann Fichte and speaks of the human person as a “dependent independence” [OC 70; compare OC 441]. Lequyer is clear that one is not responsible for having come to exist nor for all the factors of nature and nurture that brought one to the point of being capable of thinking for oneself and making one’s own decisions. All of these are aspects of one’s dependence and Lequyer often underscores their importance. On the other hand, one’s independence, as fragile and seemingly insignificant as it may be, is the measure of one’s freedom. This freedom, moreover, is the essential factor in one’s self-making. For Lequyer, it makes sense not only to speak of one’s decisions as being expressions of one’s character as so far formed, but also to speak of one’s character as an expression of one’s decisions as so far made.
Lequyer considers the objection that his view of freedom involves “a sort of madness of the will” [OC 54; compare OC 381]; by claiming that the free act, like a role of dice, could go one way or another, Lequyer seems to imply that freedom is only randomness, a “liberty of indifference” undisciplined by reason. Lequyer replies that arbitrariness is indeed not the idea of freedom, but he claims that it is its foundation. In Lequyer’s view, one is oneself the author of the chance event and that event is one’s very decision. His meaning seems to be that indeterminism—the idea that, in some instances, a single set of causal factors is compatible with more than one possible effect—is a necessary but not a sufficient condition of acts for which we hold a person accountable. In the process of deliberation, motives are noticed and reasons are weighed until one decides for one course of action over another. The will is manifested in the sphere of one’s thought when one causes one idea to prevail over others and one’s hesitation is brought to an end. The act resulting in a decision may be characterized in any number of ways—capricious, selfish, reasonable, moral—but it is in no sense a product of mere brute force. The entire process of deliberation, Lequyer says, is animated by the self-determination of the will. Should an explanation be demanded, appealing to antecedent conditions for exactly why the decision was made one way rather than another, Lequyer replies that the demand is question-begging, for it presupposes determinism [OC 47]. The free act is not a mere link in a causal chain; it is at the origin of such chains. In Lequyer’s words, “To act is to begin” [OC 43].
It is clear that Lequyer did not believe that freedom and determinism can both be true. He acknowledged that we often act, without coercion, in accordance with our desires. Lequyer says that “the inner feeling”—presumably, introspectively discerned—guarantees it [OC 50]. Some philosophers look no further than this for a definition of freedom. For Lequyer, however, this is not enough, for non-human animals often act without constraint [OC 334, 484]. To speak of free will one must also include the idea that one is the ultimate author of one’s decisions. He counsels not to confuse the lack of a feeling of dependence upon causal conditions that would necessitate one’s decision with the feeling of independence of such conditions. The confusion of these ideas, Lequyer claims, leads us to believe that we have more freedom than we actually have. All that we are allowed to say, based on introspection, is that we sometimes do not feel necessitated by past events. An analogous argument for determinism is likewise inconclusive. When we come to believe through a careful examination of a past decision that causes were at work of which we were unaware and which strongly suggest that the decision was inevitable, we are not warranted in generalizing to all of our decisions, supposing that none of them are free [OC 50].
In the dramatic finale of “The Hornbeam Leaf” the child affirms his own freedom. This affirmation is not based on an argument in the sense of inferring a conclusion from premises that are more evident than freedom itself. Lequyer reaches a theoretical impasse—an aporia—on the question of freedom and necessity. Somewhat anticipating Freud, he never tires of emphasizing the depth of our ignorance about the ultimate causes of our decisions. Indeed, the final sentence of How to Find, How to Search for a First Truth? cautions that we never know whether a given act is free [OC 75]. Moreover, he denies that we experience freedom [OC 52; compare OC 349, 353]. He argues that this would involve the impossibility of living through the same choice twice over and experiencing the decision being made first in one way and then being made in the contrary way. The memory of the first choice—or at least the mere fact of its having taken place—would intrude on the second and thus it would not be the same choice in identical circumstances. Lequyer speaks, rather, of a “presentiment” of freedom, the stubbornly persistent sense that we have that, in a given circumstance, we could have chosen differently [OC 52]. Yet, Lequyer maintains, such is the extent of our ignorance—our lack of self-knowledge—that it is often easier to believe that one is free when one is not than to believe that one is free when one really is [OC 53].
Notwithstanding Lequyer’s many caveats about the limitations on freedom and even of knowing whether free will exists, he is above all a champion of human liberty. What remains to be explained is the ground of this affirmation. Despite the fragmentary nature of his literary remains, the general outline of his thinking is clear. How to Find, How to Search for a First Truth? begins as a Cartesian search for an indubitable first truth but it diverges from Descartes’ project in being more than a theoretical exercise. Lequyer speaks of the “formidable difficulty” that stands in the way of inquiry: if one seeks truth without prejudice one runs the risk of changing one’s most cherished convictions [OC 32]. He uses a Pascalian image to illustrate the attempt to seek truth without risk of losing one’s convictions. He says that it would be like walking along a road imagining a precipice on either side; something would be missing from the experience, “the precipice and the vertigo.” Lequyer continues in Pascal’s vein by raising the possibility that honest investigation may not support one’s faith. The heart can place itself above reason but what one most desires is that faith and reason be in harmony [OC 33]. There is, finally, the difficulty that sincere doubt is “both impossible and necessary from different points of view” [OC 30]. It is impossible because doubting what is evident (for example, that there is a world independent of one’s mind) is merely feigned doubt; it is necessary because one cannot assume that what is evident is true (for example, even necessary truths may seem false and people have genuine disagreements about what they firmly believe), otherwise, the search for truth would never begin.
Lequyer’s differences with Descartes are also apparent in his treatment of the skeptical argument from dreaming: because dreams can feel as real as waking life, one cannot be certain that one is awake. Lequyer notes that the search for a first truth requires a sustained effort of concentration in which one actively directs one’s thoughts. In dreams, impressions come pell-mell and one is more a spectator of fantastic worlds than an actor sustaining one’s own thoughts. Lequyer concedes that he cannot be certain that he is awake, but he can be certain that he does not inhabit any ordinary dream. If one sleeps it is one’s thoughts that one doubts; if one is awake, it is one’s memory that one doubts [OC 36]. Lequyer avers that the former is a less feigned doubt than the latter. Pushed further by the radical skepticism to justify one’s belief in the external world, Lequyer prefers the answer of the child: “Just because” [OC 37]. His discussion takes a decidedly existential detour as he reflects on the solitude implicit in the impossibility of directly knowing the thoughts of another. Lequyer’s is not the academic worry of Descartes of how we know that another person is not a mere automaton, it is rather the sense of isolation in contemplating the gulf between two minds even when there is the sincere desire on both of their parts to communicate [OC 37].
It is Lequyer’s treatment of the cogito (“I think”) that takes one to the heart of his philosophy of freedom. He acknowledges the certainty of Descartes’ “I think therefore I am” but he criticizes his predecessor for leaving the insight obscure and therefore of not making proper use of it [OC 329]. The obscurity, Lequyer says, is in the concept of a self-identical thinking substance—sum res cogitans. The cogito is precisely the activity of a thinking subject having itself as an object of thought. In the language of the phenomenologists, Lequyer is puzzled by the intentionality within self-consciousness—the mind representing itself to itself [compare OC 362]. He argues that there is an essentially temporal structure to this relation; the “self” of which one is aware in self-awareness is a previous state of oneself. Lequyer goes so far as to call consciousness “nascent memory” [OC 339-40]. This is a significant departure from Descartes who does not even include memory in his list of characteristics of thought. Descartes says that by “thought” he means understanding, willing, sensing, feeling, and imagining (abstaining by methodical doubt, to be sure, from any judgment about the reality of the object of one’s thought). The omission of “remembering” is curious; “I (seem to) remember, therefore I am” is an instance of the cogito and memory is not obviously reducible to any of the other characteristics of thought. Although Lequyer does not claim that self-memory is perfect, he maintains that each aspect of self-consciousness—as subject and as object—requires the other. Their unity, he maintains, is nothing other than the activity of unifying subject and object. Furthermore, the on-going sequence of events that is consciousness requires that each emergent “me” becomes an object remembered by a subsequent “me.” The “Hornbeam Leaf” is itself the report of such an act of remembering.
For Lequyer, the analysis of the “I think” reveals a more fundamental fact, to wit, “I make.” The making, moreover, is a self-making, for one is continually unifying the dual and interdependent aspects of oneself as subject and as object [OC 329]. Because this process of self-formation is not deterministic, it is open-ended. Lequyer characterizes the relation of cause and effect in a free act as asymmetrical. He labels the relation from effect (subject) to cause (object) as “the necessary” because the subject would not be what it is apart from the object that it incorporates into self-awareness; however, he labels the relation from cause (object) to effect (subject) as “the possible” in the sense that the object remains what it is independent of the subject incorporating it. Lequyer says that “the effect is the movement by which the cause determines itself” [OC 473]. Lequyer’s asymmetrical view of causation, at least where the free act is concerned, diverges from that of the determinist. In deterministic thinking, necessity flows symmetrically from cause to effect and from effect to cause; “the possible,” for determinism, is only a product of our ignorance of the causal matrix that produces an effect. Lequyer agrees that ignorance is a factor in our talk of possibility. He notes that the hand that opens a letter that contains happy or fatal news still trembles, hoping for the best and fearing the worst, each “possibility” considered, although one knows that one of the imagined outcomes is now impossible [OC 60]. Lequyer’s indeterminism, on the other hand, allows that possibilities outrun necessities, that the future is sometimes open whether or not we are ignorant of causes.
Lequyer writes that “it is an act of freedom which affirms freedom” [OC 67]. As already noted, for Lequyer, free will is not deduced from premises whose truth is more certain than the conclusion. We have also seen that he denies that free will can be known directly in experience [OC 353]. The logical possibility remains—entertained by the child in “The Hornbeam Leaf” and spelled out in greater detail in the fourth part of How to Find, How to Search for a First Truth?—that free will is an illusion, that one’s every thought and act is necessitated by the already completed course of events reaching into the past before one’s birth. Lequyer addresses the impasse between free will and determinism with the following reasoning (Renouvier called this Lequyer’s double dilemma). Either free will or determinism is true, but which one is true is not evident. Lequyer says that one must choose one or the other by means of one or the other. This yields a four-fold array: (1) one chooses freedom freely; (2) one chooses freedom necessarily; (3) one chooses necessity freely; (4) one chooses necessity necessarily [OC 398; compare Renouvier’s summary, OC 64-65]. One’s affirmation should at least be consistent with the truth, which means that the array reduces to the first and last options. Of course, the determinist believes that the second option characterizes the advocate of free will; by parity of reasoning, the free willist believes that the third option characterizes the determinist. Again, there is stalemate.
Inspired by the example of mathematics, Lequyer proposes to break the deadlock by considering “a maximum and a minimum at the same time, the least expense of belief for the greatest result” [OC 64, 368]. He compares the hypotheses of free will and determinism as postulates for how they might make sense of or fail to make sense of human decisions. Lequyer, it should be noted, conceives the non-human world of nature as deterministic, so his discussion of free will is limited to the human realm and, in his theology, to that of the divine [OC 475]. It is in considering the two postulates, according to Lequyer, that the specter of determinism casts its darkest shadow. First, with Kant, Lequyer accepts that free will is a necessary postulate to make sense of the moral life [OC 345; compare OC 484-85]. If no one could have chosen otherwise than they chose, there is no basis for claiming that they should have chosen otherwise; judgments of praise and blame, especially of past actions, are groundless if determinism is true. Second, Lequyer goes beyond Kant by claiming that free will is necessary for making sense of the search for truth [OC 398-400]. Lequyer’s reasoning is not as clear as one would like, but the argument seems to be as follows. The search for truth presupposes that the mind can evaluate the reasons for and against a given proposition. The mechanisms of determinism are not, however, sensitive to reasons; indeed, no remotely plausible deterministic laws have been found or proposed for understanding intellectual inquiry. Renouvier elaborated this point by saying that, as the freedom of indifference involves (as Lequyer says) an active indifference to reasons, so determinism involves a passive indifference to reasons. Thus, determinism, by positing necessity as the explanation for our reasoned judgments, undermines the mind’s sensitivity to reasons and therefore allows no way clear of skepticism.
Lequyer’s reasoning, even if it is sound, does not decide the issue in favor of free will. Nor does Lequyer claim that it does. Determinism may yet be true and, if Lequyer is correct, the consequences are that morality is founded on a fiction and we can have no more trust in our judgments of truth and falsity than we can have in a random assignment of truth values to propositions. In the final analysis, the truth that Lequyer seeks is less a truth that is discovered than it is a truth that is made. The free act affirms itself, but because the act is self-creative, it is also a case of the act creating a new truth, namely, that such and such individual affirmed freedom. If freedom is true, and if Lequyer’s reasoning is correct, then the one who creates this fact has the virtue of being able to live a life consistent with moral ideals and of having some hope of discovering truth.
Renouvier deemphasized the theological dimensions of Lequyer’s thought. He said he was bored by Lequyer’s views on the Trinity. He suggested demythologizing Lequyer’s religious ideas so as to salvage philosophical kernels from the theological husk in which they were encased. Obviously, Lequyer did not agree with this approach. Indeed, he devoted approximately twice as much space in his work to topics in philosophy of religion and Christian theology as he did to strictly non-religious philosophizing. Grenier convincingly argued that Lequyer’s design was a renewal of Christian philosophy [OC 326]. One may, however, sympathize with Renouvier’s concerns, for a few of Lequyer’s ruminations are now dated. He seemed to have no knowledge of the sciences that, in his own day, were revealing the astounding age of the earth and the universe. Adam and Eve were real characters in his mind and he speculated on Christ’s return in a few years because of the symmetry between the supposed two-thousand year interval from the moment of creation until the time of Christ and the fact that nearly two-thousand more years had elapsed since Jesus walked the earth [OC 439-40]. Despite these limitations Lequyer’s treatment of religious themes is not, for the most part, dependent on outdated science. His views prefigure developments in philosophical theology in the century and a half since his death, giving his thought a surprisingly contemporary flavor.
Lequyer’s more explicitly theological works are as notable for their literary qualities as for their philosophical arguments. Probus or the Principle of Knowledge, also known as the Dialogue of the Predestinate and the Reprobate, is a nearly complete work in three parts. The first section is a dialogue between two clerics who have been made privy to the future by means of a tableau that pictures for them the contents of divine foreknowledge. Neither character is named, but one is sincerely faithful while the other exhibits only a superficial piety. They see in the tableau that the hypocritical cleric will repent and enter heaven but the pious cleric will backslide and live with the demons. When “the reprobate” begins to despair, “the predestinate” tries to offer him hope of going to heaven. Hope comes in the form of arguments from medieval theologians that are designed to show the compatibility of God’s foreknowledge and human freedom. In the style of Scholastic quaestiones disputatae, the clerics debate the classical arguments. The pious cleric criticizes and is unconvinced by each argument. In the second part, the impious cleric appeals to the tableau for events occurring twenty years in the future. The pious cleric has become a master in a monastery and, ironically, has become a partisan of the very arguments that he had earlier criticized. In the future scene, the master monitors and eventually enters a Socratic discussion between Probus, a young divine, and Caliste, a child. Probus defends the idea that God faces a partially open future precisely because God is perfect and must know, and therefore be affected by, what the creatures do. The scene closes as the master counters these arguments with the claim that the future is indeterminate for human perception but determinate for God. The final and shortest section returns to the clerics. The reprobate’s closing speech answers through bitter parodies the ideas that he has just heard uttered by his future self, the master. The speech reveals that the clerics are having dreams that will be mostly forgotten when they awake. The drama closes when they wake up, each remembering only the end of his dream: one singing with the angels, the other in agony with the demons. Satan, who appears for the first time, has the final word. He will lie in wait for one of the men to stumble.
The dialogue is operatic in its intricacy and drama; its philosophical argument is complex and rigorous. The intertwining of its literary and philosophical aspects is evident in the final pages when the clerics are made to forget the content of their shared dream. They must forget their dream in order for the revelation of the dream to come to pass without interference from the revelation itself. Likewise, Satan is not privy to the content of the dreams, so he must lie in wait, not knowing whether he will catch his prey. It is clear both from the tone of the dialogue and from other things that Lequyer wrote that the reprobate in the first and third parts and Probus in the second part are his spokespersons. The overall message of the dialogue is that the position on divine knowledge and human freedom that had been mapped out by Church theologians is nightmarish. Reform in both the meaning of freedom and how this affects ideas about God are in order. In short, the dialogue is a good example of Lequyer’s attempt to renew Christian philosophy. It should be said, however, that specifically Christian (and Jewish) ideas are used primarily by way of illustration and thus, it is less Christian philosophy than it is philosophical theology that is under consideration.
Lequyer was conversant with what most of the great theologians said about the foreknowledge puzzle—from Augustine and Boethius to Albert the Great, Thomas Aquinas, and John Duns Scotus. The concluding fragments of How to Find, How to Search for a First Truth? make clear that he rejected the Thomistic claim that the creatures can have no affect on God. The relation from the creatures to God, says Lequyer, is as real as the relation from God to the creatures [OC 73]. This rejection of Thomism follows from his analysis of freedom as a creative act that initiates causal chains. One’s free acts make the world, other persons, and even oneself, different than they otherwise would have been. Lequyer never doubted that God is the author of the universe, but the universe, he emphasized, includes free creatures. Thus, he speaks of “God, who created me creator of myself” [OC 70]. Aquinas explained that, in the proper sense of the word, creativity belongs to God alone; the creatures cannot create. For Lequyer, on the other hand, God has created creatures that are lesser creators. That they are God’s creation entails that they are dependent upon God, but since they are also creative they are in some measure independent of God. Because the acts of a free creature produce novel realities, they also create novel realities for God. In a striking turn of phrase, Lequyer says that the free acts of the creatures “make a spot in the absolute, which destroys the absolute” [OC 74].
Lequyer never doubts the omniscience of God. What is in doubt is what there is for God to know and how God comes by this knowledge. The dominant answers to these questions, expressed most thoroughly by Aquinas, were that God has detailed knowledge of the entire sweep of events in space and time—all that has been, is, and will be—and this knowledge is grounded in the fact that God created the universe. The deity has perfect self-knowledge and, as the cause of the world, knows the world as its effect. God’s creativity, according to the classical theory, has no temporal location, nor is omniscience hampered by time. Divine eternity, in the seminal statement of Boethius, is the whole, complete, simultaneous possession of endless life [compare OC 423]. Lequyer’s theory of free will challenges Aquinas’ view of the mechanics of omniscience. On Lequyer’s view, God cannot know human creative acts by virtue of creating them. To be sure, the ability to perform such acts is granted by God, but the acts themselves are products of the humans that make them and are not God’s doing. These lesser creative acts are the necessary condition of God’s knowledge of them; they create something in God that God could not know apart from their creativity. Their creative choices, moreover, are not re-enactments in time of what God decided for them in eternity, nor do they exist in eternity [OC 212]. It follows that they cannot be present to God in eternity. If it is a question of the free act of a creature, what is present to God is that such and such a person is undecided between courses of action and that both are equally possible. God too faces an open future precisely because more than one future is open to a creature to help create. In Lequyer’s words, “A frightful prodigy: man deliberates, and God waits!” [OC 71].
It is tempting to say that Lequyer offers a view of divine knowledge as limited. Lequyer demurs. As Probus explains, it is no more a limitation on God’s knowledge not to be able to know a future free act than it is a limitation on God’s power not to be able to create a square circle—the one is as impossible as the other [OC 171]. A future free act is, by its nature, indeterminate and must be known as such, even by God. Lequyer counsels that his view of divine knowledge only seems to be a limitation on God because we have an incorrect view of creativity. Prefiguring Henri Bergson, he speaks of the “magic in the view of accomplished deeds” that makes them appear, in retrospect, as though they were going to happen all along [OC 280; compare OC 419]. Lequyer—through Probus—speaks of divine self-limitation, but this is arguably an infelicitous way for him to make his case [OC 171]. It is not as though God could remove blinders or exert a little more power and achieve the knowledge of an as yet to be enacted free decision. Prior to the free decision, there is nothing more to be known than possibilities (and probabilities); by exerting more power, God could deprive the decision of its freedom, but it would, by the nature of the case, no longer be a free decision that God was foreseeing. Lequyer argues, however, that one may freely set in motion a series of events that make it impossible for one’s future self to accomplish some desired end. In that case, it would have been impossible for God to foreknow the original free decision, but God would infallibly know the result once the decision had been made.
Lequyer does not tire of stressing that if God is omniscient, then God must know the extent to which the future is open at any given juncture [OC 205]. Recall that Lequyer is mindful of how easily we fool ourselves into thinking we are free when we are not. We mistake merely imagined possibilities for real possibilities. God is not subject to this limitation. For these reasons, his view of divine creativity and knowledge allows for a significant degree of providential control, although there can be no absolute guarantees that everything God might wish to occur will occur. Risk remains. Lequyer disparages the idea that every detail of the world is willed by God; this view of divine power, he says, yields “imitations of life” that make of the work of God something frivolous [OC 212]. Even if creatures are ignorant of the extent of their freedom, free will is nonetheless real and so the world is no puppet show. When it comes to the question of prophecy, Lequyer emphasizes how often biblical prophecies are warnings rather than predictions. Those involving predictions, especially of free acts (for example, Peter’s denials of Christ and Judas’ betrayal), can be accounted for, he avers, by highlighting human ignorance and pride in comparison with divine knowledge of the extent to which the future is open [compare OC 206-07]. God is able to see into the heart of a person to know perfectly what is still open for the person not to do and what is certain that he or she will do. On Lequyer’s view, a deed for which a person is held accountable must be free in its origin but not necessarily in its consequences. One may freely make decisions that deprive one’s future self of freedom, but this does not relieve the person of moral accountability [OC 211].
A peculiarity of Lequyer’s theory as it appears in Probus is that he denies the law of non-contradiction where future contingents are concerned. In this, he follows what he understood (and what some commentators understand) to be Aristotle’s views. Lequyer claims that it is true to say of things past or present that they either are or they are not. On the other hand, for future contingents (like free decisions that might go one way or another), Lequyer says that both are false; where A is a future contingent, both A-will-be and A-will-not-be are false [OC 194]. Doubtless this is the least plausible aspect of Lequyer’s views since abandoning the law of non-contradiction is an extremely heavy price to pay for an open future. It is interesting to speculate, however, on what he would have thought of Charles Hartshorne’s view that the contradictory of A-will-be is A-may-not-be and the contradictory of A-will-not-be is A-may-be. This makes A-will-be and A-will-not-be contraries rather than contradictories. As in Aristotle’s square, contraries may both be false; in this way, Lequyer could have achieved at no damage to elementary logic a doctrine of an open future. He certainly leaned in this direction in the closing pages of How to Find, How to Search for a First Truth? There, he declares that it is contradictory to say that a thing will be and that it is entirely possible that it may not be [OC 75].
Besides Probus, the curiously titled Abel and Abel—Esau and Jacob: Biblical Narrative is Lequyer’s other major work that addresses specifically religious themes. As the title suggests, it is closely tied to biblical motifs. Although it is yet another exploration of the idea of freedom, the examination of philosophical arguments is replaced by a fiction informed by philosophical ideas. Lequyer imagines an old man of Judea, living a little after the time of Christ, who has quoted St. Paul to his grandson that God preferred Jacob to Esau before their birth (Romans 9.11). The child is astonished and saddened by the statement, because it seems to place God’s goodness in doubt. The old man tells a story to the child that is designed to help explain the enigma. The tale, set some generations after Jacob and Esau, concerns the identical twin sons—identical even in their names, “Abel”—of a widowed patriarch, Aram. Before telling this story, however, he recounts the biblical episode of Abraham’s attempted sacrifice of Isaac (Gen. 22). He explains that he wishes the grandson to be reminded of Isaac under Abraham’s knife when he tells the story of the Abels, saying, “Faith is a victory; for a great victory, there must be a great conflict” [OC 235]. In the epilogue, the wizened grandfather gives what amounts to a Christian midrash on the story of Jacob and Esau with special attention to Jacob’s wrestling with the angel (Gen. 32.24-32). Thus, the story of the Abel twins is intercalated between two biblical stories. The theme uniting the three stories is God’s tests and the possible responses to them.
The Abel twins are as alike as twins could be, sharing thoughts and sometimes even dreams, but always in bonds of love for one another. They are introduced to an apparent injustice that saddens them when two brothers, slaves of their father, commit a theft and Aram pardons one but punishes the other. The seeming unfairness of the slave’s punishment reminds the twins of Esau’s complaint that he had been cheated when his brother Jacob stole their father’s blessing from him (Gen. 27). The Abels come close to passing judgment on their own father for treating the guilty slaves unequally. They resist the thought and then are told by Eliezer, the senior servant in the household, that Aram recognized the slave he condemned as having led his companions into some misdeed prior to having committed the theft. The boys are relieved to hear their father vindicated. His judgment of the slaves only seemed unjust to the twins because they lacked information that their father possessed. The episode of the unequally treated thieves serves as a parable counseling faith in the justice of God even when God seems to act in morally arbitrary ways.
The twins themselves must also face the test of being treated unequally. Aram shows them an elaborately decorated cedar ark. He explains that the day will come when one of the twins will be favored over the other to open the ark and discover inside the name which God reserves for him and his brother. Mysteriously, the name will apply to both of them but it will separate them as well. The dreams of the twins are disturbed by this favor that will separate them. Aram leaves, perhaps never to return again, giving charge of his sons to Eliezer. After a time, Eliezer brings the boys again to the cedar ark and there explains to them the decree of Aram. The favored son will be given a ring to denote that he is the chosen of God. The other son may either submit to his brother or depart from the country with a third of Aram’s inheritance, leaving the other two-thirds of the wealth for the chosen Abel. Their father’s possessions are great, so to receive a third of the inheritance is a significant amount. Nevertheless, the fact remains that the twins, equal in every way, will have been treated unequally by Aram’s decree.
It is not given to the child who is being told the story of the Abel twins (or to the reader) to know the outcome of their trial. Instead, he is told of three mutually exclusive ways in which the story could go, depending on how the brothers respond to their unequal treatment. In the first scenario, the favored Abel succumbs to pride and his brother shows resentment. Calling to mind the name of the first murderer in the Bible, Lequyer writes, “And, behind the sons of Aram, Satan who was promising himself two Cains from these two Abels, was laughing” [OC 265]. In the second scenario, the favored brother refuses the gift out of a generous feeling for his brother. In that case, Lequyer says that the favored Abel can be called “the Invincible.” In the third scenario, the favored brother, in great sorrow for what his brother has not received, accepts the ring while the other Abel, out of love for his twin, rejoices in his brother’s gift and helps him to open the gilded cedar chest. Lequyer says that, in this case, the other Abel can be called “the Victorious.” Lequyer presents the three scenarios in the order in which he believes they ought to be valued, from the least (the first scenario) to the greatest (the third scenario). When the ark is opened the mystery is revealed of the single name that is given to the brothers that nevertheless distinguishes them. Written within are the words: YOUR NAME IS: THAT WHICH YOU WERE IN THE TEST [OC 276]. The test was to see how the twins would respond to the apparent injustice of one being favored over the other. In effect, God’s predestined name for the brothers is like a mathematical variable whose value will be determined by the choices that the brothers make in response to the test.
Lequyer is clear that the lesson of Abel and Abel is not simply that God respects the free will of the twins. One also learns that God’s richer gifts may be more in what is denied than in what is given [OC 271]. Put somewhat differently, the denial of a gift may itself be a gift of an opportunity to exercise one’s freedom in the best possible way. To be sure, the favored Abel has his own opportunities. By accepting the ring, graciously and without pride, he is a noble figure. He is greater still (“the Invincible”) if he refuses the ring out of love for his brother. It is open to the other Abel, however, to win an incomparable victory (signified by the name, “the Victorious”) should his brother accept the ring. He is victorious over the apparent injustice done to him and over the resentment and envy he might have felt. He has been given a great opportunity to exhibit a higher virtue and he has taken it. In Lequyer’s words, “It is sweet to be loved . . . but it is far sweeter to love” [OC 272]; he argues that one can be loved without finding pleasure in it, although this may be a fault, but one cannot love without feeling joy. It should also be noted that by becoming “the Victorious” the other Abel in no way diminishes the virtue or the reward open to his twin. In this way, Lequyer avers, one may go far in vindicating God’s justice as well as God’s magnificence (that is, giving more to a person than is strictly merited by their deeds). This is a long way from a complete theodicy but Lequyer surely meant these reflections to be an important contribution to a renewal of Christian philosophy.
In the epilogue Lequyer reemphasizes the importance of accepting the will of God even when it seems harsh. The grandfather returns to the story of Jacob and Esau whose unequal treatment so saddened the grandson in the first place. According to the grandfather’s imaginative retelling, Jacob was tested by God when he wrestled with the angel. As Jacob anxiously awaits the arrival of Esau who had vowed to kill him (Gen. 27.41), he is filled with terror contemplating “the stubbornness of the Lord’s goodwill” in allowing him to buy Esau’s birthright (Gen. 25.29-33) and to steal Isaac’s blessing [OC 296]. Perhaps he fears that Esau will finally exact God’s judgment against him. A stranger approaches Jacob from the shadows and demands to know whether he will bless the name of God even if God should strike him. Jacob promises to bless God. He is shown several terrifying episodes in his future, from the rape of his daughter Dinah (Gen. 34.1-5) to the presumed death of his son Joseph (Gen. 37.33). In the final vision, a perfectly righteous man he does not recognize suffers an ignominious death on a cross. After each vision, Jacob “wrestles” with the temptation to impiety but instead blesses God’s name. Jacob is thus found worthy of the favors bestowed upon him. As the stranger leaves, Jacob sees his face and recognizes it as the face of the man on the cross. When morning comes, Esau arrives and greets his brother with kisses of fraternal love (Gen. 33.4).
Probus and Abel and Abel address different problems and in very different styles. Yet, in some sense they are a diptych, to borrow the apt metaphor of André Clair. Each work deals with a different kind of necessity. The necessity in Probus (also in How to Find, How to Search for a First Truth?) is that of deterministic causes resulting inevitably in certain effects, included among the latter, one’s supposedly free decisions. The necessity in Abel and Abel is the inalterability of the past, especially as it pertains to Aram’s decree. The decree sets the conditions of the test but does not determine its outcome. This is very different from the decree of damnation of the unhappy cleric. The tableau of God’s foreknowledge includes every detail of how the cleric will act in the future. In the dialogue, there is no equivalent of the “name” that is written in the cedar ark, no variable whose value can be decided by one’s free choice. Indeed, Probus can be read as an extended reductio against traditional teachings about foreknowledge and predestination. The predestinate fails to console the reprobate. There can be no hope for him for he knows with certainty that he will be damned. The dialogue, however, offers hope for the reader, the hope of breaking free of a nightmarish theology by rethinking the concepts of freedom and the nature of God along the lines that the character of Probus suggests—after all, Probus is the name of the dialogue. Abel and Abel reinforces the idea that God faces a relatively open future. The story does not tell which of the three options is chosen, nor does it suggest that one of them is predestined to occur.
The story of the Abel twins goes beyond the dialogue, however, by returning to the question raised in How to Find, How to Search for a First Truth? of how self-identity is constructed. Clair argues convincingly that Lequyer means to generalize from the Abel twins to all human beings. The twins represent the fact that one’s self-identity is not merely a question of not being someone else. They are different from each other but neither acquires a new “name”—that is, a distinctive identity—apart from exercising their freedom in response to the test. This is consistent with Lequyer’s theme of the self as a product of self-creative acts, although the self-creativity of the twins most clearly manifests itself in relation to other persons. In Abel and Abel, there is a shift in the question of self-creativity from metaphysics to axiology. The fulfillment of self-creativity, which is to say its highest manifestation, is in love. The “I” of self-creativity becomes inseparable from the “we”. Lequyer appropriates this idea for theology in his reflections on the Trinity. He says that a Divine Love that cannot say “You” to one that is equal to itself would be inconsolable by the eternal absence of its object [Abel et Abel 1991, 101]. If God is love, as Christianity maintains (I John 4.8), then the unity of God requires a plurality within the Godhead.
Renouvier once said that he saved Lequyer’s work from sinking [Esquisse d’une classification systématique, v. 2, 382]. In view of Lequyer’s drowning, it is a fitting if somewhat macabre metaphor. Renouvier often quoted his friend’s work at length in his own books. His edition of The Search for a First Truth, limited though it was to one-hundred and twenty copies, ensured that Lequyer’s philosophy was presented in something like a form of which he would have approved. Renouvier included a brief “Editor’s Preface” but his name appears nowhere in the book. In publishing the book, it was his friend’s contribution to philosophy that he intended to preserve and celebrate, not his own. More widely available editions of the book were published in 1924 and 1993. Another indication of Renouvier’s respect is the marker he was instrumental in erecting over Lequyer’s grave. The inscription reads in part, “to the memory of an unhappy friend and a man of great genius.” Throughout his career he called Lequyer his “master” on the subject of free will and he took meticulous care in attributing to Lequyer the ideas that he borrowed from him. In Renouvier’s last conversations, as recorded by his disciple Louis Prat, he quoted Lequyer’s maxim, “TO MAKE . . . and, in making, TO MAKE ONESELF” as a summary of his own philosophy of personalism [Derniers entretiens, 64].
Others did not take as much care as Renouvier in giving Lequyer the credit that he was due. William James learned of Lequyer from reading Renouvier’s works and wrote to him in 1872 inquiring about The Search for a First Truth which he had not been able to locate through a bookstore. Renouvier sent him a copy which he read, at least in part, and which he donated to the Harvard Library. The essential elements of James’s mature views on free will and determinism closely parallel those of Lequyer—freedom is not merely acting in accordance with the will, the impossibility of experiencing freedom, the importance of effort of attention in the phenomenon of will, the reality of chance, the theoretical impasse between freedom and necessity, and the idea that freedom rightly affirms its own reality. James’s Oxford Street/Divinity Avenue thought experiment in his essay “The Dilemma of Determinism” could be interpreted as an application of a similar passage in the third section of How to Find, How to Search for a First Truth? [OC 52]. There are, to be sure, profound differences between James and Lequyer on many subjects, but where it is a question of free will and determinism the similarities are uncanny.
James always credited Renouvier for framing the issue of free will in terms of “the ambiguity of futures,” but it is clear that Renouvier was a conduit for the ideas of Lequyer. This is nowhere more evident than in James’s 1876 review of two books, by Alexander Bain and Renouvier, published in the Nation. He praises Renouvier’s ideas about freedom, but the views he highlights are the very ideas that Renouvier attributed to Lequyer. In one instance, he confuses a quote from Lequyer as belonging to Renouvier. The unwary reader, like James, assumes that it is Renouvier speaking. In his personal letters James mentions Lequyer by name, but not in any of his works written for publication. It is clear, however, that he thought highly of him. In The Principles of Psychology (1890), James mentions “a French philosopher of genius” and quotes a phrase from the concluding section of How to Find, How to Search for a First Truth? He cites the same phrase, slightly altered, in Some Problems of Philosophy but again not revealing the name of its author [For references, see Viney 1997/2009].
Another famous philosopher who quoted Lequyer without mentioning his name is Jean-Paul Sartre. Sartre may have learned of Lequyer in 1935 when he sat on the board of editors for the Nouvelle Revue Française. The board was considering whether to publish Grenier’s doctoral thesis, La Philosophie de Jules Lequier. The decision was against publication, but not without Sartre objecting that there was still interest among readers in freedom. In 1944, Sartre responded to critics of existentialism and affirmed as his own, the saying, “to make and in making to make oneself and to be nothing except what one has made of oneself.” This is a nearly direct quote from Lequyer. Jean Wahl, who edited a selection of Lequyer’s writings, maintained that Sartre borrowed the principle idea of L’existentialisme est un humanisme (1945) from Lequyer, to wit, that in making our own choices, we are our own creators. Lequyer is not quoted in that presentation. Seven years later, however, in a discussion of Stéphane Mallarmé’s poetry, Sartre again mentions Lequyer’s maxim, placing it in quotation marks, but without reference to the name of the Breton. If one may speak of Lequyer’s anonymous influence on James, one may perhaps speak of Lequyer’s anonymous shadow in the work of Sartre [For references see Viney 2010, 13-14].
The irony in Sartre’s quotations of Lequyer’s maxim is that he uses it not only to express a belief in freedom but also to express his atheism. Sartre rejected the idea that, God creates creatures in accordance with a detailed conception of what they will be. This is what Sartre would characterize as essence preceding existence. The formula of Sartre’s existentialism is that existence precedes essence. In Sartre’s words, it is not the case that “the individual man is the realization of a certain concept in the divine understanding” [Existentialisme est un humanisme, 28]. Of course, Lequyer agrees, but rather than adopting atheism he opted for revising the concept of God as one capable of creating other, lesser, creators. Grenier outlined Lequyer’s theology in his dissertation (just mentioned) but there is no indication—unless his silence says something—of what Sartre thought of it. Other philosophers, however, did not remain silent on Lequyer’s suggestions for revising traditional ideas about God.
After Renouvier, Grenier, and Wahl, the philosopher who made most explicit use of Lequyer’s ideas and promoted their importance was the American Charles Hartshorne. Hartshorne learned of Lequyer from Wahl in Paris in 1948. By that time, Hartshorne was far along in his career with well-developed views of his own in what is known as process philosophy and theology. Nevertheless, he thereafter consistently promoted Lequyer’s significance as a forerunner of process thought. He often quoted the Lequyerian phrase, “God created me creator of myself” and cited Lequyer as the first philosopher to clearly affirm a bilateral influence between God and the creatures. With Hartshorne, Lequyer ceased being, as in James and Sartre, the anonymously cited philosopher. Hartshorne included the first English language excerpt from Lequyer’s writings in his anthology, edited with William L. Reese, Philosophers Speak of God (1953).
Harvey Brimmer (1924-1990), one of Hartshorne’s students, wrote a dissertation titled Jules Lequier and Process Philosophy (1975), which included as appendices translations of How to Find, How to Search for a First Truth? and Probus. This was the first book-length study of Lequyer in English. Brimmer argued, among other things, that the distinction for which Hartshorne is known between the existence/essence of God and the actuality of God is implicit in Lequyer’s thought. According to this idea, God’s essential nature (including the divine existence) is immutable and necessary but God is ever open to new experiences as the particular objects of God’s power, knowledge, and goodness, which are contingent, come to be. For example, it is God’s nature to know whatever exists, but the existence of this particular bird singing is contingent, and so God’s knowledge of it is contingent. Brimmer seems to be on firm footing, for Lequyer says both that God is unchanging but that there can be a change in God [OC 74, compare OC 243].
Hartshorne’s admiration for Lequyer introduced, if unintentionally, its own distortion, as though the only things that matter about Lequyer were the ways in which he anticipated process thought. It may be more accurate, for example, to interpret Lequyer as a forerunner of an evangelical “open theism”—at least a Catholic version—than of process philosophy’s version of divine openness. For example, Lequyer and the evangelical open theists affirm but Hartshorne denies the divine inspiration of the Bible and the doctrine of creation ex nihilo. We may, nevertheless, accentuate the positive by noting that many of Lequyer’s central ideas are incarnated in each variety of open theism. Also noteworthy is that some of those evangelicals who identify themselves as open theists—William Hasker, Richard Rice, and Gregory Boyd—were influenced to a greater or lesser extent by Hartshorne. That Lequyer is an important, if not the most important, pioneer of an open view of God cannot be doubted. Moreover, the combination of literary imagination and philosophical rigor that he brought to the exploration of an open view of God, especially in Probus and Abel and Abel, is unmatched.
The philosopher to whom Lequyer is most often compared is Kierkegaard. Each philosopher endeavored, in the words of Clair, to “think the singular” [Title of Clair 1993]. They would not allow, after the manner of Hegel, a dialectical aufheben in which, they believed, the individual is swallowed by the absolute [OC 347]. Choice and responsibility are central themes for both philosophers. The same can be said of the subject of faith and the “audacity and passion” (Lequyer) that it requires [OC 501]. Both men blurred the line between literature and philosophy, as often happens in superior spirits. Perhaps the best example of this is that they developed what might be called the art of Christian midrash, amending biblical narratives from their own imaginations to shed new light on the text. As Lequyer said in a Kierkegaardian tone, the Scriptures have “extraordinary silences” [OC 231]. Lequyer’s treatment of the story of Abraham and Isaac bears some similarities with what one finds in Kierkegaard’s Fear and Trembling. Both philosophers warn against reading the story in reverse as though Abraham knew all along that God would not allow Isaac to die. Lequyer says that Abraham faced a terrifying reversal of all things human and divine.
If there is a common idea that unites Lequyer and Kierkegaard it is the revitalization of Christianity. Yet, this commonality begins to dissolve under a multitude of qualifications. Kierkegaard’s criticisms of the established church in Denmark were in the truest spirit of Protestantism. Except for an early period of emotional detachment from the church, Lequyer was loyal to Catholicism. The renewal of Christianity meant something different for each philosopher. Kierkegaard spoke of reintroducing Christianity into Christendom and he maintained that the thought behind his whole work was what it means to become a Christian. A distant analogy in Lequyer’s polemic to what Kierkegaard calls “Christendom” is the reasoning of the doctors of the church. Lequyer says that the reasoning of the doctors never had any power over him, even as a child [OC 13]. Whereas Kierkegaard launched an assault on the idea of identifying an institution with Christianity, Lequyer targets the theologians whose theories he believes undercut belief in the freedom of God and of the creatures. Lequyer’s willingness to engage medieval theology on its own terms, matching argument with argument in an attempt to develop a more adequate, logically consistent, and coherent concept of God, stands in contrast to Kierkegaard’s negative dialectic that leads to faith embracing paradox.
Lequyer wrote to Renouvier in 1850 that he was writing “something unheard of” [OC 538]. The way in which his ideas and his words have sometimes been invoked without mention of his name makes this sadly ironic. Too often he has been heard from but without himself being heard of. Until recently, the unavailability of his writings in translation tended to confine detailed knowledge of his work to francophones. To make matters more difficult, as Grenier noted, he is something of an απαξ (hapax)—one of a kind. His philosophy does not readily fit any classification or historical development of ideas. Grenier wryly commented on those eager to classify philosophical schools and movements: “Meteors do not have a right to exist because they enter under no nomenclature” [Grenier 1951, 33]. The same metaphor, used more positively, is invoked by Wahl in his edition of Lequyer’s writings. Lequyer, he remarked, left mostly fragments of philosophy, but he left “brief and vivid trails” in the philosophical firmament.
Lequyer worked outside the philosophical mainstream. Yet, he can be regarded, in the expression of Xavier Tilliette, as a scout or a precursor of such diverse movements as personalism, pragmatism, existentialism, and openness theologies. Of course, it is an honor to be considered in such a light. On the other hand, like a point on the horizon on which lines converge, the distinctiveness and integrity of Lequyer’s own point-of-view is in danger of being lost by such a multitude of comparisons. It does not help matters that Lequyer failed to complete his life’s work. It is often reminiscent of Pascal’s Pensées: nuggets of insight and suggestions for argument are scattered throughout the drafts that he made of his thought. In any event, Goulven Le Brech’s assessment seems secure: “The fragmentary and unfinished work of Jules Lequier is far from having given up all its secrets” [Cahiers Jules Lequier, v. 1, 5].
Donald Wayne Viney
Pittsburg State University
U. S. A.
Last updated: September 18, 2013 | Originally published: