Leucippus was the founder of Atomism. We know next to nothing about his life, and his book appears to have been incorporated in the collected works of Democritus. No writer subsequent to Theophrastos seems to have been able to distinguish his teaching from that of his more famous disciple. Indeed his very existence has been denied, though on wholly insufficient grounds.
Aristotle gives a clear and intelligible account of the way Leucippus’ theory arose. It originated from Parmenides’ denial of the void, from which the impossibility of multiplicity and motion had been deduced. Leucippus supposed himself to have discovered a theory which would avoid this consequence. He admitted that there could be no motion if there was no void, and he inferred that it was wrong to identify the void with the non-existent. Leucippus was the first philosopher to affirm, with a full consciousness of what he was doing, the existence of empty space. The Pythagorean void had been more or less identified with ‘air’, but the void of Leucippus was really a vacuum.
Besides space there was body, and to this Leucippus ascribed all the characteristics of Parmenides notion of the real. The assumption of empty space, however, made it possible to affirm that there was an infinite number of such reals, invisible because of their smallness, but each possessing all the marks of the Parmenidean One, and in particular each indivisible like it. These moved in the empty space, and their combinations can give rise to the things we perceive with the senses. Pluralism was at least stated in a logical and coherent way. Democritus compared the motions of the atoms of the soul to that of the particles in the sunbeam which dart hither and thither in all directions even when there is no wind, and we may fairly assume that he regarded the original motion of the other atoms in much the same way.
The atoms are not mathematically indivisible like the Pythagorean monads, but they are physically indivisible because there is no empty space in them. Theoretically, then, there is no reason why an atom should not be as large as a world. Such an atom would be much the same thing as the Sphere of Parmenides, were it not for the empty space outside it and the plurality of worlds. As a matter of fact, however, all atoms are invisible. That does not mean, of course, that they are all the same size; for there is room for an infinite variety of sizes below the limit of the minimum visible. Leucippus explained the phenomenon of weight from the size of the atoms and their combustions, but he did not regard weight itself as a primary property of bodies. Aristotle distinctly says that none of his predecessors had said anything of absolute weight and lightness, but only of relative weight and lightness, and Epicurus was the first to ascribe weight to atoms. Weight for the earlier atomists is only a secondary phenomenon arising, in a manner to be explained, from excess of magnitude. It will be observed that in this respect the early atomists were far more scientific than Epicurus and even than Aristotle. The conception of absolute weight has no place in science, and it is really one of the most striking illustrations of the true scientific instinct of the Greek philosophers that no one before Aristotle ever made use of it, and Plato expressly rejected it.
The first effect of the motion of the atoms is that the larger atoms are retarded, not because they are ‘heavy’, but because they are more exposed to impact than the smaller. In particular, atoms of an irregular shape become entangled with one another and form groups of atoms, which are still more exposed to impact and consequent retardation. The smallest and roundest atoms, on the other hand, preserve their original motions best, and these are the atoms of which fire is composed. In an infinite void in which an infinite number of atoms of countless shapes and sizes are constantly impinging upon one another in all directions, there will be an infinite number of places where a vortex motion is set up by their impact. when this happens, we have the beginning of a world. It is not correct to ascribe this to chance, as later writers do. It follows necessarily from the presuppositions of the system. The solitary fragment of Leucippus we possess is to the effect that ‘Naught happens for nothing, but all things from a ground (logos) and of necessity’.
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Last updated: April 17, 2001 | Originally published: