What it means to be a “libertarian” in a political sense is a contentious issue, especially among libertarians themselves. There is no single theory that can be safely identified as the libertarian theory, and probably no single principle or set of principles on which all libertarians can agree. Nevertheless, there is a certain family resemblance among libertarian theories that can serve as a framework for analysis. Although there is much disagreement about the details, libertarians are generally united by a rough agreement on a cluster of normative principles, empirical generalizations, and policy recommendations. Libertarians are committed to the belief that individuals, and not states or groups of any other kind, are both ontologically and normatively primary; that individuals have rights against certain kinds of forcible interference on the part of others; that liberty, understood as non-interference, is the only thing that can be legitimately demanded of others as a matter of legal or political right; that robust property rights and the economic liberty that follows from their consistent recognition are of central importance in respecting individual liberty; that social order is not at odds with but develops out of individual liberty; that the only proper use of coercion is defensive or to rectify an error; that governments are bound by essentially the same moral principles as individuals; and that most existing and historical governments have acted improperly insofar as they have utilized coercion for plunder, aggression, redistribution, and other purposes beyond the protection of individual liberty.
In terms of political recommendations, libertarians believe that most, if not all, of the activities currently undertaken by states should be either abandoned or transferred into private hands. The most well-known version of this conclusion finds expression in the so-called “minimal state” theories of Robert Nozick, Ayn Rand, and others (Nozick 1974; Rand 1963a, 1963b) which hold that states may legitimately provide police, courts, and a military, but nothing more. Any further activity on the part of the state—regulating or prohibiting the sale or use of drugs, conscripting individuals for military service, providing taxpayer-funded support to the poor, or even building public roads—is itself rights-violating and hence illegitimate.
Libertarian advocates of a strictly minimal state are to be distinguished from two closely related groups, who favor a smaller or greater role for government, and who may or may not also label themselves “libertarian.” On one hand are so-called anarcho-capitalists who believe that even the minimal state is too large, and that a proper respect for individual rights requires the abolition of government altogether and the provision of protective services by private markets. On the other hand are those who generally identify themselves as classical liberals. Members of this group tend to share libertarians’ confidence in free markets and skepticism over government power, but are more willing to allow greater room for coercive activity on the part of the state so as to allow, say, state provision of public goods or even limited tax-funded welfare transfers.
As this article will use the term, libertarianism is a theory about the proper role of government that can be, and has been, supported on a number of different metaphysical, epistemological, and moral grounds. Some libertarians are theists who believe that the doctrine follows from a God-made natural law. Others are atheists who believe it can be supported on purely secular grounds. Some libertarians are rationalists who deduce libertarian conclusions from axiomatic first principles. Others derive their libertarianism from empirical generalizations or a reliance on evolved tradition. And when it comes to comprehensive moral theories, libertarians represent an almost exhaustive array of positions. Some are egoists who believe that individuals have no natural duties to aid their fellow human beings, while others adhere to moral doctrines that hold that the better-off have significant duties to improve the lot of the worse-off. Some libertarians are deontologists, while others are consequentialists, contractarians, or virtue-theorists. Understanding libertarianism as a narrow, limited thesis about the proper moral standing, and proper zone of activity, of the state—and not a comprehensive ethical or metaphysical doctrine—is crucial to making sense of this otherwise baffling diversity of broader philosophic positions.
This article will focus primarily on libertarianism as a philosophic doctrine. This means that, rather than giving close scrutiny to the important empirical claims made both in support and criticism of libertarianism, it will focus instead on the metaphysical, epistemological, and especially moral claims made by the discussants. Those interested in discussions of the non-philosophical aspects of libertarianism can find some recommendations in the reference list below.
Furthermore, this article will focus almost exclusively on libertarian arguments regarding just two philosophical subjects: distributive justice and political authority. There is a danger that this narrow focus will be misleading, since it ignores a number of interesting and important arguments that libertarians have made on subjects ranging from free speech to self-defense, to the proper social treatment of the mentally ill. More generally, it ignores the ways in which libertarianism is a doctrine of social or civil liberty, and not just one of economic liberty. For a variety of reasons, however, the philosophic literature on libertarianism has mostly ignored these other aspects of the theory, and so this article, as a summary of that literature, will generally reflect that trend.
Probably the most well-known and influential version of libertarianism, at least among academic philosophers, is that based upon a theory of natural rights. Natural rights theories vary, but are united by a common belief that individuals have certain moral rights simply by virtue of their status as human beings, that these rights exist prior to and logically independent of the existence of government, and that these rights constrain the ways in which it is morally permissible for both other individuals and governments to treat individuals.
Although one can find some earlier traces of this doctrine among, for instance, the English Levellers or the Spanish School of Salamanca, John Locke‘s political thought is generally recognized as the most important historical influence on contemporary natural rights versions of libertarianism. The most important elements of Locke’s theory in this respect, set out in his Second Treatise, are his beliefs about the law of nature, and his doctrine of property rights in external goods.
Locke’s idea of the law of nature draws on a distinction between law and government that has been profoundly influential on the development of libertarian thought. According to Locke, even if no government existed over men, the state of nature would nevertheless not be a state of “license.” In other words, men would still be governed by law, albeit one that does not originate from any political source (c.f. Hayek 1973, ch. 4). This law, which Locke calls the “law of nature” holds that “being all equal and independent, no one ought to harm another in his life, liberty, or possessions” (Locke 1952, para. 6). This law of nature serves as a normative standard to govern human conduct, rather than as a description of behavioral regularities in the world (as are other laws of nature like, for instance, the law of gravity). Nevertheless, it is a normative standard that Locke believes is discoverable by human reason, and that binds us all equally as rational agents.
Locke’s belief in a prohibition on harming others stems from his more basic belief that each individual “has a property in his own person” (Locke 1952, para. 27). In other words, individuals are self-owners. Throughout this essay we will refer to this principle, which has been enormously influential on later libertarians, as the “self-ownership principle.” Though controversial, it has generally been taken to mean that each individual possesses over her own body all those rights of exclusive use that we normally associate with property in external goods. But if this were all that individuals owned, their liberties and ability to sustain themselves would obviously be extremely limited. For almost anything we want to do—eating, walking, even breathing, or speaking in order to ask another’s permission—involves the use of external goods such as land, trees, or air. From this, Locke concludes, we must have some way of acquiring property in those external goods, else they will be of no use to anyone. But since we own ourselves, Locke argues, we therefore also own our labor. And by “mixing” our labor with external goods, we can come to own those external goods too. This allows individuals to make private use of the world that God has given to them in common. There is a limit, however, to this ability to appropriate external goods for private use, which Locke captures in his famous “proviso” that holds that a legitimate act of appropriation must leave “enough, and as good… in common for others” (Locke 1952, para. 27). Still, even with this limit, the combination of time, inheritance, and differential abilities, motivation, and luck will lead to possibly substantial inequalities in wealth between persons, and Locke acknowledges this as an acceptable consequence of his doctrine (Locke 1952, para. 50).
By far the single most important influence on the perception of libertarianism among contemporary academic philosophers was Robert Nozick in his book, Anarchy, State, and Utopia (1974). This book is an explanation and exploration of libertarian rights that attempts to show how a minimal, and no more than a minimal, state can arise via an “invisible hand” process out of a state of nature without violating the rights of individuals; to challenge the highly influential claims of John Rawls that purport to show that a more-than-minimal state was justified and required to achieve distributive justice; and to show that a regime of libertarian rights could establish a “framework for utopia” wherein different individuals would be free to seek out and create mediating institutions to help them achieve their own distinctive visions of the good life.
The details of Nozick’s arguments can be found at Robert Nozick. Here, we will just briefly point out a few elements of particular importance in understanding Nozick’s place in contemporary libertarian thought—his focus on the “negative” aspects of liberty and rights, his Kantian defense of rights, his historical theory of entitlement, and his acceptance of a modified Lockean proviso on property acquisition. A discussion of his argument for the minimal state can be found in the section on anarcho-capitalism below.
First, Nozick, like almost all natural rights libertarians, stresses negative liberties and rights above positive liberties and rights. The distinction between positive and negative liberty, made famous by Isaiah Berlin (Berlin 1990), is often thought of as a distinction between “freedom to” and “freedom from.” One has positive liberty when one has the opportunity and ability to do what one wishes (or, perhaps, what one “rationally” wishes or “ought” to wish). One has negative liberty, on the other hand, when there is an absence of external interferences to one’s doing what one wishes—specifically, when there is an absence of external interferences by other people. A person who is too sick to gather food has his negative liberty intact—no one is stopping him from gathering food—but not his positive liberty as he is unable to gather food even though he wants to do so. Nozick and most libertarians see the proper role of the state as protecting negative liberty, not as promoting positive liberty, and so toward this end Nozick focuses on negative rights as opposed to positive rights. Negative rights are claims against others to refrain from certain kinds of actions against you. Positive rights are claims against others to perform some sort of positive action. Rights against assault, for instance, are negative rights, since they simply require others not to assault you. Welfare rights, on the other hand, are positive rights insofar as they require others to provide you with money or services. By enforcing negative rights, the state protects our negative liberty. It is an empirical question whether enforcing merely negative rights or, as more left-liberal philosophers would promote, enforcing a mix of both negative and positive rights would better promote positive liberty.
Second, while Nozick agrees with the broadly Lockean picture of the content and government-independence of natural law and natural rights, his remarks in defense of those rights draw their inspiration more from Immanuel Kant than from Locke. Nozick does not provide a full-blown argument to justify libertarian rights against other non-libertarian rights theories—a point for which he has been widely criticized, most famously by Thomas Nagel (Nagel 1975). But what he does say in their defense suggests that he sees libertarian rights as an entailment of the other-regarding element in Kant’s second formulation of the categorical imperative—that we treat the humanity in ourselves and others as an end in itself, and never merely as a means. According to Nozick, both utilitarianism and theories that uphold positive rights sanction the involuntary sacrifice of one individual’s interests for the sake of others. Only libertarian rights, which for Nozick take the form of absolute side-constraints against force and fraud, show proper respect for the separateness of persons by barring such sacrifice altogether, and allowing each individual the liberty to pursue his or her own goals without interference.
Third, it is important to note that Nozick’s libertarianism evaluates the justice of states of affairs, such as distributions of property, in terms of the history or process by which that state of affairs arose, and not by the extent to which it satisfies what he calls a patterned or end-state principle of justice. Distributions of property are just, according to Nozick, if they arose from previously just distributions by just procedures. Discerning the justice of current distributions thus requires that we establish a theory of justice in transfer—to tell us which procedures constitute legitimate means of transferring ownership between persons—and a theory of justice in acquisition—to tell us how individuals might come to own external goods that were previously owned by no one. And while Nozick does not fully develop either of these theories, his skeletal position is nevertheless significant, for it implies that it is only the proper historical pedigree that makes a distribution just, and it is only deviations from the proper pedigree that renders a distribution unjust. An implication of this position is that one cannot discern from time-slice statistical data alone—such as the claim that the top fifth of the income distribution in the United States controls more than 80 percent of the nation’s wealth—that a distribution is unjust. Rather, the justice of a distribution depends on how it came about—by force or by trade? By differing degrees of hard work and luck? Or by fraud and theft? Libertarianism’s historical focus thus sets the doctrine against both outcome-egalitarian views that hold that only equal distributions are just, utilitarian views that hold that distributions are just to the extent they maximize utility, and prioritarian views that hold that distributions are just to the extent they benefit the worse-off. Justice in distribution is a matter of respecting people’s rights, not of achieving a certain outcome.
The final distinctive element of Nozick’s view is his acceptance of a modified version of the Lockean proviso as part of his theory of justice in acquisition. Nozick reads Locke’s claim that legitimate acts of appropriation must leave enough and as good for others as a claim that such appropriations must not worsen the situation of others (Nozick 1974, 175, 178). On the face of it, this seems like a small change from Locke’s original statement, but Nozick believes it allows for much greater freedom for free exchange and capitalism (Nozick 1974, 182). Nozick reaches this conclusion on the basis of certain empirical beliefs about the beneficial effects of private property:
it increases the social product by putting means of production in the hands of those who can use them most efficiently (profitably); experimentation is encouraged, because with separate persons controlling resources, there is no one person or small group whom someone with a new idea must convince to try it out; private property enables people to decide on the pattern and type of risks they wish to bear, leading to specialized types of risk bearing; private property protects future persons by leading some to hold back resources from current consumption for future markets; it provides alternative sources of employment for unpopular persons who don’t have to convince any one person or small group to hire them, and so on. (Nozick 1974, 177)
If these assumptions are correct, then persons might not be made worse off by acts of original appropriation even if those acts fail to leave enough and as good for others to appropriate. Private property and the capitalist markets to which it gives rise generate an abundance of wealth, and latecomers to the appropriation game (like people today) are in a much better position as a result. As David Schmidtz puts the point:
Original appropriation diminishes the stock of what can be originally appropriated, at least in the case of land, but that is not the same thing as diminishing the stock of what can be owned. On the contrary, in taking control of resources and thereby removing those particular resources from the stock of goods that can be acquired by original appropriation, people typically generate massive increases in the stock of goods that can be acquired by trade. The lesson is that appropriation is typically not a zero-sum game. It normally is a positive-sum game. (Schmidtz and Goodin 1998, 30)
Relative to their level of well-being in a world where nothing is privately held, then, individuals are generally not made worse off by acts of private appropriation. Thus, Nozick concludes, the Lockean proviso will “not provide a significant opportunity for future state action” in the form of redistribution or regulation of private property (Nozick 1974, 182).
Nozick’s libertarian theory has been subject to criticism on a number of grounds. Here we will focus on two primary categories of criticism of Lockean/Nozickian natural rights libertarianism—namely, with respect to the principle of self-ownership and the derivation of private property rights from self-ownership.
Criticisms of the self-ownership principle generally take one of two forms. Some arguments attempt to sever the connection between the principle of self-ownership and the more fundamental moral principles that are thought to justify it. Nozick’s suggestion that self-ownership is warranted by the Kantian principle that no one should be treated as a mere means, for instance, is criticized by G.A. Cohen on the grounds that policies that violate self-ownership by forcing the well-off to support the less advantaged do not necessarily treat the well-off merely as means (Cohen 1995, 239–241). We can satisfy Kant’s imperative against treating others as mere means without thereby committing ourselves to full self-ownership, Cohen argues, and we have good reason to do so insofar as the principle of self-ownership has other, implausible, consequences. The same general pattern of argument holds against more intuitive defenses of the self-ownership principle. Nozick’s concern (Nozick 1977, 206), elaborated by Cohen (Cohen 1995, 70), that theories that deny self-ownership might license the forcible transfer of eyes from the sight-endowed to the blind, for instance, or Murray Rothbard’s claim that the only alternatives to self-ownership are slavery or communism (Rothbard 1973, 29), have been met with the response that a denial of the permissibility of slavery, communism, and eye-transplants can be made—and usually better made—on grounds other than self-ownership.
Other criticisms of self-ownership focus on the counterintuitive or otherwise objectionable implications of self-ownership. Cohen, for instance, argues that recognizing rights to full self-ownership allows individuals’ lives to be objectionably governed by brute luck in the distribution of natural assets, since the self that people own is largely a product of their luck in receiving a good or bad genetic endowment, and being raised in a good or bad environment (Cohen 1995, 229). Richard Arneson, on the other hand, has argued that self-ownership conflicts with Pareto-Optimality (Arneson 1991). His concern is that since self-ownership is construed by libertarians as an absolute right, it follows that it cannot be violated even in small ways and even when great benefit would accrue from doing so. Thus, to modify David Hume, absolute rights of self-ownership seem to prevent us from scratching the finger of another even to prevent the destruction of the whole world. And although the real objection here seems to be to the absoluteness of self-ownership rights, rather than to self-ownership rights as such, it remains unclear whether strict libertarianism can be preserved if rights of self-ownership are given a less than absolute status.
Even if individuals have absolute rights to full self-ownership, it can still be questioned whether there is a legitimate way of moving from ownership of the self to ownership of external goods.
Left-libertarians, such as Hillel Steiner, Peter Vallentyne, and Michael Otsuka, grant the self-ownership principle but deny that it can yield full private property rights in external goods, especially land (Steiner 1994; Vallentyne 2000; Otsuka 2003). Natural resources, such theorists hold, belong to everyone in some equal way, and private appropriation of them amounts to theft. Rather than returning all such goods to the state of nature, however, most left-libertarians suggest that those who claim ownership of such resources be subjected to a tax to compensate others for the loss of their rights of use. Since the tax is on the value of the external resource and not on individuals’ natural talents or efforts, it is thought that this line of argument can provide a justification for a kind of egalitarian redistribution that is compatible with full individual self-ownership.
While left-libertarians doubt that self-ownership can yield full private property rights in external goods, others are doubtful that the concept is determinate enough to yield any theory of justified property ownership at all. Locke’s metaphor on labor mixing, for instance, is intuitively appealing, but notoriously difficult to work out in detail (Waldron 1983). First, it is not clear why mixing one’s labor with something generates any rights at all. As Nozick himself asks, “why isn’t mixing what I own with what I don’t own a way of losing what I own rather than a way of gaining what I don’t?” (Nozick 1974, 174–175). Second, it is not clear what the scope of the rights generated by labor-mixing are. Again, Nozick playfully suggests (but does not answer) this question when he asks whether a person who builds a fence around virgin land thereby comes to own the enclosed land, or simply the fence, or just the land immediately under it. But the point is more worrisome than Nozick acknowledges. For as critics such as Barbara Fried have pointed out, following Hohfeld, property ownership is not a single right but a bundle of rights, and it is far from clear which “sticks” from this bundle individuals should come to control by virtue of their self-ownership (Fried 2004). Does one’s ownership right over a plot of land entail the right to store radioactive waste on it? To dam the river that runs through it? To shine a very bright light from it in the middle of the night (Friedman 1989, 168)? Problems such as these must, of course, be resolved by any political theory—not just libertarians. The problem is that the concept of self-ownership seems to offer little, if any, help in doing so.
While Nozickian libertarianism finds its inspiration in Locke and Kant, there is another species of libertarianism that draws its influence from David Hume, Adam Smith, and John Stuart Mill. This variety of libertarianism holds its political principles to be grounded not in self-ownership or the natural rights of humanity, but in the beneficial consequences that libertarian rights and institutions produce, relative to possible and realistic alternatives. To the extent that such theorists hold that consequences, and only consequences, are relevant in the justification of libertarianism, they can properly be labeled a form of consequentialism. Some of these consequentialist forms of libertarianism are utilitarian. But consequentialism is not identical to utilitarianism, and this section will explore both traditional quantitative utilitarian defenses of libertarianism, and other forms more difficult to classify.
Philosophically, the approach that seeks to justify political institutions by demonstrating their tendency to maximize utility has its clearest origins in the thought of Jeremy Bentham, himself a legal reformer as well as moral theorist. But, while Bentham was no advocate of unfettered laissez-faire, his approach has been enormously influential among economists, especially the Austrian and Chicago Schools of Economics, many of whom have utilized utilitarian analysis in support of libertarian political conclusions. Some influential economists have been self-consciously libertarian—the most notable of which being Ludwig von Mises, Friedrich Hayek, James Buchanan, and Milton Friedman (the latter three are Nobel laureates). Richard Epstein, more legal theorist than economist, nevertheless utilizes utilitarian argument with an economic analysis of law to defend his version of classical liberalism. His work in Principles for a Free Society (1998) and Skepticism and Freedom (2003) is probably the most philosophical of contemporary utilitarian defenses of libertarianism. Buchanan’s work is generally described as contractarian, though it certainly draws heavily on utilitarian analysis. It too is highly philosophical.
Utilitarian defenses of libertarianism generally consist of two prongs: utilitarian arguments in support of private property and free exchange and utilitarian arguments against government policies that exceed the bounds of the minimal state. Utilitarian defenses of private property and free exchange are too diverse to thoroughly canvass in a single article. For the purposes of this article, however, the focus will be on two main arguments that have been especially influential: the so-called “Tragedy of the Commons” argument for private property and the “Invisible Hand” argument for free exchange.
The Tragedy of the Commons argument notes that under certain conditions when property is commonly owned or, equivalently, owned by no one, it will be inefficiently used and quickly depleted. In his original description of the problem of the commons, Garrett Hardin asks us to imagine a pasture open to all, on which various herders graze their cattle (Hardin 1968). Each additional animal that the herder is able to graze means greater profit for the herder, who captures that entire benefit for his or her self. Of course, additional cattle on the pasture has a cost as well in terms of crowding and diminished carrying capacity of the land, but importantly this cost of additional grazing, unlike the benefit, is dispersed among all herders. Since each herder thus receives the full benefit of each additional animal but bears only a fraction of the dispersed cost, it benefits him or her to graze more and more animals on the land. But since this same logic applies equally well to all herders, we can expect them all to act this way, with the result that the carrying capacity of the field will quickly be exceeded.
The tragedy of the Tragedy of the Commons is especially apparent if we model it as a Prisoner’s Dilemma, wherein each party has the option to graze additional animals or not to graze. (See figure 1, below, where A and B represent two herders, “graze” and “don’t graze” their possible options, and the four possible outcomes of their joint action. Within the boxes, the numbers represent the utility each herder receives from the outcome, with A’s outcome listed on the left and B’s on the right). As the discussion above suggests, the best outcome for each individual herder is to graze an additional animal, but for the other herder not to—here the herder reaps all the benefit and only a fraction of the cost. The worst outcome for each individual herder, conversely, is to refrain from grazing an additional animal while the other herder indulges—in this situation, the herder bears costs but receives no benefit. The relationship between the other two possible outcomes is important. Both herders would be better off if neither grazed an additional animal, compared to the outcome in which both do graze an additional animal. The long-term benefits of operating within the carrying capacity of the land, we can assume, outweigh the short-term gains to be had from mutual overgrazing. By the logic of the Prisoner’s Dilemma, however, rational self-interested herders will not choose mutual restraint over mutual exploitation of the resource. This is because, so long as the costs of over-grazing are partially externalized on to other users of the resource, it is in each herder’s interest to overgraze regardless of what the other party does. In the language of game theory, overgrazing dominates restraint. As a result, not only is the resource consumed, but both parties are made worse off individually than they could have been. Mutual overgrazing creates a situation that not only yields a lower total utility than mutual restraint (2 vs. 6), but that is Pareto-inferior to mutual restraint—at least one party (indeed, both!) would have been made better off by mutual restraint without anyone having been made worse off.
Figure 1. The Tragedy of the Commons as Prisoner’s Dilemma
The classic solution to the Tragedy of the Commons is private property. Recall that the tragedy arises because individual herders do not have to bear the full costs of their actions. Because the land is common to all, the costs of overgrazing are partially externalized on to other users of the resource. But private property changes this. If, instead of being commonly owned by all, the field was instead divided into smaller pieces of private property, then herders would have the power to exclude others from using their own property. One would only be able to graze cattle on one’s own field, or on others’ fields on terms specified by their owners, and this means that the costs of that overgrazing (in terms of diminished usability of the land or diminished resale value because of that diminished usability) would be borne by the overgrazer alone. Private property forces individuals to internalize the cost of their actions, and this in turn provides individuals with an incentive to use the resource wisely.
The lesson is that by creating and respecting private property rights in external resources, governments can provide individuals with an incentive to use those resources in an efficient way, without the need for complicated government regulation and oversight of those resources. Libertarians have used this basic insight to argue for everything from privatization of roads (Klein and Fielding 1992) to private property as a solution to various environmental problems (Anderson and Leal 1991).
Libertarians believe that individuals and groups should be free to trade just about anything they wish with whomever they wish, with little to no governmental restriction. They therefore oppose laws that prohibit certain types of exchanges (such as prohibitions on prostitution and sale of illegal drugs, minimum wage laws that effectively prohibit low-wage labor agreements, and so on) as well as laws that burden exchanges by imposing high transaction costs (such as import tariffs).
The reason utilitarian libertarians support free exchange is that, they argue, it tends to allocate resources into the hands of those who value them most, and in so doing to increase the total amount of utility in society. The first step in seeing this is to understand that even if trade is a zero-sum game in terms of the objects that are traded (nothing is created or destroyed, just moved about), it is a positive-sum game in terms of utility. This is because individuals differ in terms of the subjective utility they assign to goods. A person planning to move from Chicago to San Diego might assign a relatively low utility value to her large, heavy furniture. It’s difficult and costly to move, and might not match the style of the new home anyway. But to someone else who has just moved into an empty apartment in Chicago, that furniture might have a very high utility value indeed. If the first person values the furniture at $200 (or its equivalent in terms of utility) and the second person values it at $500, both will gain if they exchange for a price anywhere between those two values. Each will have given up something they value less in exchange for something they value more, and net utility will have increased as a result.
As Friedrich Hayek has noted, much of the information about the relative utility values assigned to different goods is transmitted to different actors in the market via the price system (Hayek 1980). An increase in a resource’s price signals that demand for that resource has increased relative to supply. Consumers can respond to this price increase by continuing to use the resource at the now-higher price, switching to a substitute good, or discontinuing use of that sort of resource altogether. Each individual’s decision is both affected by the price of the relevant resources, and affects the price insofar as it adds to or subtracts from aggregate supply and demand. Thus, though they generally do not know it, each person’s decision is a response to the decisions of millions of other consumers and producers of the resource, each of whom bases her decision on her own specialized, local knowledge about that resource. And although all they are trying to do is maximize their own utility, each individual will be led to act in a way that leads the resource toward its highest-valued use. Those who derive the most utility from the good will outbid others for its use, and others will be led to look for cheaper substitutes.
On this account, one deeply influenced by the Austrian School of Economics, the market is a constantly churning process of competition, discovery, and innovation. Market prices represent aggregates of information and so generally represent an advance over what any one individual could hope to know on his own, but the individual decisions out of which market prices arise are themselves based on imperfect information. There are always opportunities that nobody has discovered, and the passage of time, the changing of people’s preferences, and the development of new technological possibilities ensures that this ignorance will never be fully overcome. The market is thus never in a state of competitive equilibrium, and it will always “fail” by the test of perfect efficiency. But it is precisely today’s market failures that provide the opportunities for tomorrow’s entrepreneurs to profit by new innovation (Kirzner 1996). Competition is a process, not a goal to be reached, and it is a process driven by the particular decisions of individuals who are mostly unaware of the overall and long-term tendencies of their decisions taken as a whole. Even if no market actor cares about increasing the aggregate level of utility in society, he will be, as Adam Smith wrote, “led by an invisible hand to promote an end which was no part of his intention” (Smith 1981). The dispersed knowledge of millions of market actors will be taken into account in producing a distribution that comes as close as practically possible to that which would be selected by a benign, omniscient, and omnipotent despot. In reality, however, all that government is required to do in order to achieve this effect is to define and enforce clear property rights and to allow the price system to freely adjust in response to changing conditions.
The above two arguments, if successful, demonstrate that free markets and private property generate good utilitarian outcomes. But even if this is true, it remains possible that selective government intervention in the economy could produce outcomes that are even better. Governments might use taxation and coercion for the provision of public goods, or to prevent other sorts of market failures like monopolies. Or governments might engage in redistributive taxation on the grounds that given the diminishing marginal utility of wealth, doing so will provide higher levels of overall utility. In order to maintain their opposition to government intervention, then, libertarians must produce arguments to show that such policies will not produce greater utility than a policy of laissez-faire. Producing such arguments is something of a cottage industry among libertarian economists, and so we cannot hope to provide a complete summary here. Two main categories of argument, however, have been especially influential. We can call them incentive-based arguments and public choice arguments.
Incentive arguments proceed by claiming that government policies designed to promote utility actually produce incentives for individuals to act in ways that run contrary to promotion of utility. Examples of incentive arguments include arguments that (a) government-provided (welfare) benefits dissuade individuals from taking responsibility for their own economic well-being (Murray 1984), (b) mandatory minimum wage laws generate unemployment among low-skilled workers (Friedman 1962, 180–181), (c) legal prohibition of drugs create a black market with inflated prices, low quality control, and violence (Thornton 1991), and (d) higher taxes lead people to work and/or invest less, and hence lead to lower economic growth.
Public choice arguments, on the other hand, are often employed by libertarians to undermine the assumption that government will use its powers to promote the public interest in the way its proponents claim it will. Public choice as a field is based on the assumption that the model of rational self-interest typically employed by economists to predict the behavior of market agents can also be used to predict the behavior of government agents. Rather than trying to maximize profit, however, government agents are thought to be aiming at re-election (in the case of elected officials) or maintenance or expansion of budget and influence (in the case of bureaucrats). From this basic analytical model, public choice theorists have argued that (a) the fact that the costs of many policies are widely dispersed among taxpayers, while their benefits are often concentrated in the hands of a few beneficiaries, means that even grossly inefficient policies will be enacted and, once enacted, very difficult to remove, (b) politicians and bureaucrats will engage in “rent-seeking” behavior by exploiting the powers of their office for personal gain rather than public good, and (c) certain public goods will be over-supplied by political processes, while others will be under-supplied, since government agents lack both knowledge and incentives necessary to provide such goods at efficient levels (Mitchell and Simmons 1994). These problems are held to be endemic to political processes, and not easily subject to legislative or constitutional correction. Hence, many conclude that the only way to minimize the problems of political power is to minimize the scope of political power itself by subjecting as few areas of life as possible to political regulation.
The quantitative utilitarians are often both rationalist and radical in their approach to social reform. For them, the maximization of utility serves as an axiomatic first principle, from which policy conclusions can be straightforwardly deduced once empirical (or quasi-empirical) assessments of causal relationships in the world have been made. From Jeremy Bentham to Peter Singer, quantitative utilitarians have advocated dramatic changes in social institutions, all justified in the name of reason and the morality it gives rise to.
There is, however, another strain of consequentialism that is less confident in the ability of human reason to radically reform social institutions for the better. For these consequentialists, social institutions are the product of an evolutionary process that itself is the product of the decisions of millions of discrete individuals. Each of these individuals in turn possess knowledge that, though by itself is insignificant, in the aggregate represents more than any single social reformer could ever hope to match. Humility, not radicalism, is counseled by this variety of consequentialism.
Though it has its affinities with conservative doctrines such as those of Edmund Burke, Michael Oakeshott, and Russell Kirk, this strain of consequentialism had its greatest influence on libertarianism through the work of Friedrich Hayek. Hayek, however, takes pains to distance himself from conservative ideology, noting that his respect for tradition is not grounded in a fetish for the status quo or an opposition to change as such, but in deeper, distinctively liberal principles (Hayek 1960). For Hayek, tradition is valuable because, and only to the extent that, it evolves in a peaceful, decentralized way. Social norms that are chosen by free individuals and survive competition from competing norms without being maintained by coercion are, for that reason, worthy of respect even if we are not consciously aware of all the reasons that the institution has survived. Somewhat paradoxically then, Hayek believes that we can rationally support institutions even when we lack substantive justifying reasons for supporting them. The reason this can be rational is that even when we lack substantive justifying reasons, we nevertheless have justifying reasons in a procedural sense—the fact that the institution is the result of an evolutionary procedure of a certain sort gives us reason to believe that there are substantive justifying reasons for it, even if we do not know what they are (Gaus 2006).
For Hayek, the procedures that lend justifying force to institutions are, essentially, ones that leave individuals free to act as they wish so long as they do not act aggressively toward others. For Hayek, however, this principle is not a moral axiom but rather follows from his beliefs regarding the limits and uses of knowledge in society. A crucial piece of Hayek’s arguments regarding the price system, (see above) is his claim that each individual possesses a unique set of knowledge about his or her local circumstances, special interests, desires, abilities, and so forth. The price system, if allowed to function freely without artificial floors or ceilings, will reflect this knowledge and transmit it to other interested individuals, thus allowing society to make effective use of dispersed knowledge. But Hayek’s defense of the price system is only one application of a more general point. The fact that knowledge of all sorts exists in dispersed form among many individuals is a fundamental fact about human existence. And since this knowledge is constantly changing in response to changing circumstances and cannot therefore be collected and acted upon by any central authority, the only way to make use of this knowledge effectively is to allow individuals the freedom to act on it themselves. This means that government must disallow individuals from coercing one another, and also must refrain from coercing them themselves. The social order that such voluntary actions produce is one that, given the complexity of social and economic systems and radical limitations on our ability to acquire knowledge about its particular details (Gaus 2007), cannot be imposed by fiat, but must evolve spontaneously in a bottom-up manner. Hayek, like Mill before him (Mill 1989), thus celebrates the fact that a free society allows individuals to engage in “experiments in living” and therefore, as Nozick argued in the neglected third part of his Anarchy, State, and Utopia, can serve as a “utopia of utopias” where individuals are at liberty to organize their own conception of the good life with others who voluntarily choose to share their vision (Hayek 1960).
Hayek’s ideas about the relationship between knowledge, freedom, and a constitutional order were first developed at length in The Constitution of Liberty, later developed in his series Law, Legislation and Liberty, and given their last, and most accessible (though not necessarily most reliable (Caldwell 2005)) statement in The Fatal Conceit: The Errors of Socialism (1988). Since then, the most extensive integration of these ideas into a libertarian framework is in Randy Barnett’s The Structure of Liberty, wherein Barnett argues that a “polycentric constitutional order” (see below regarding anarcho-capitalism) is best suited to solve not only the Hayekian problem of the use of knowledge in society, but also what he calls the problems of “interest” and “power” (Barnett 1998). More recently, Hayekian insights have been put to use by contemporary philosophers Chandran Kukathas (1989; 2006) and Gerald Gaus (2006; 2007).
Consequentialist defenses of libertarianism are, of course, varieties of consequentialist moral argument, and are susceptible therefore to the same kinds of criticisms leveled against consequentialist moral arguments in general. Beyond these standard criticisms, moreover, consequentialist defenses of libertarianism are subject to four special difficulties.
First, consequentialist arguments seem unlikely to lead one to full-fledged libertarianism, as opposed to more moderate forms of classical liberalism. Intuitively, it seems implausible that simple protection of individual negative liberties would do a better job than any alternative institutional arrangement at maximizing utility or peace and prosperity or whatever. And this intuitive doubt is buttressed by economic analyses showing that unregulated capitalist markets suffer from production of negative externalities, from monopoly power, and from undersupply of certain public goods, all of which cry out for some form of government protection (Buchanan 1985). Even granting libertarian claims that (a) these problems are vastly overstated, (b) often caused by previous failures of government to adequately respect or enforce private property rights, and (c) government ability to correct these is not as great as one might think, it’s nevertheless implausible to suppose, a priori, that it will never be the case that government can do a better job than the market by interfering with strict libertarian rights.
Second, consequentialist defenses of libertarianism are subject to objections when a great deal of benefit can be had at a very low cost. So-called cases of “easy rescue,” for instance, challenge the wisdom of adhering to absolute prohibitions on coercive conduct. After all, if the majority of the world’s population lives in dire poverty and suffer from easily preventable diseases and deaths, couldn’t utility be increased by increasing taxes slightly on wealthy Americans and using that surplus to provide basic medical aid to those in desperate need? The prevalence of such cases is an empirical question, but their possibility points (at least) to a “fragility” in the consequentialist case for libertarian prohibitions on redistributive taxation.
Third, the consequentialist theories at the root of these libertarian arguments are often seriously under-theorized. For instance, Randy Barnett bases his defense of libertarian natural rights on the claim that they promote the end of “happiness, peace and prosperity” (Barnett 1998). But this leaves a host of difficult questions unaddressed. The meaning of each of these terms, for instance, has been subject to intense philosophical debate. Which sense of happiness, then, does libertarianism promote? What happens when these ends conflict—when we have to choose, say, between peace and prosperity? And in what sense do libertarian rights “promote” these ends? Are they supposed to maximize happiness in the aggregate? Or to maximize each person’s happiness? Or to maximize the weighted sum of happiness, peace, and prosperity? Richard Epstein is on more familiar and hence, perhaps, firmer ground when he says that his version of classical liberalism is meant to maximize utility, but even here the claim that utility maximization is the proper end of political action is asserted without argument. The lesson is that while consequentialist political arguments might seem less abstract and philosophical (in the pejorative sense) than deontological arguments, consequentialism is still, nevertheless, a moral theory, and needs to be clearly articulated and defended as any other moral theory. Possibly because consequentialist defenses of libertarianism have been put forward mainly by non-philosophers, this challenge has yet to be met.
A fourth and related point has to do with issues surrounding the distribution of wealth, happiness, opportunities, and other goods allegedly promoted by libertarian rights. In part, this is a worry common to all maximizing versions of consequentialism, but it is of special relevance in this context given the close relation between economic systems and distributional issues. The worry is that morality, or justice, requires more than simply producing an abundance of wealth, happiness, or whatever. It requires that each person gets a fair share—whether that is defined as an equal share, a share sufficient for living a good life, or something else. Intuitively fair distributions are simply not something that libertarian institutions can guarantee, devoid as they are of any means for redistributing these goods from the well-off to the less well-off. Furthermore, once it is granted that libertarianism is likely to produce unequal distributions of wealth, the Hayekian argument for relying on the free price system to allocate goods no longer holds as strongly as it appeared to. For we cannot simply assume that a free price system will lead to goods being allocated to their most valued use if some people have an abundance of wealth and others very little at all. A free market of self-interested persons will not distribute bread to the starving man, no matter how much utility he would derive from it, if he cannot pay for it. And a wealthy person, such as Bill Gates, will still always be able to outbid a poor person for season tickets to the Mariners, even if the poor person values the tickets much more highly than he, since the marginal value of the dollars he spends on the tickets is much lower to him than the marginal value of the poor person’s dollars. Both by an external standard of fairness and by an internal standard of utility-maximization, then, unregulated free markets seem to fall short.
Anarcho-capitalists claim that no state is morally justified (hence their anarchism), and that the traditional functions of the state ought to be provided by voluntary production and trade instead (hence their capitalism). This position poses a serious challenge to both moderate classical liberals and more radical minimal state libertarians, though, as we shall see, the stability of the latter position is especially threatened by the anarchist challenge.
Anarcho-capitalism can be defended on either consequentialist or deontological grounds, though usually a mix of both arguments is proffered. On the consequentialist side, it is argued that police protection, court systems, and even law itself can be provided voluntarily for a price like any other market good (Friedman 1989; Rothbard 1978; Barnett 1998; Hasnas 2003; Hasnas 2007). And not only is it possible for markets to provide these traditionally state-supplied goods, it is actually more desirable for them to do so given that competitive pressures in this market, as in others, will produce an array of goods that is of higher general quality and that is diverse enough to satisfy individuals’ differing preferences (Friedman 1989; Barnett 1998). Deontologically, anarcho-capitalists argue that the minimal state necessarily violates individual rights insofar as it (1) claims a monopoly on the legitimate use of force and thereby prohibits other individuals from exercising force in accordance with their natural rights, and (2) funds its protective services with coercively obtained tax revenue that it sometimes (3) uses redistributively to pay for protection for those who are unable to pay for themselves (Rothbard 1978; Childs 1994).
Robert Nozick was one of the first academic philosophers to take the anarchist challenge seriously. In the first part of his Anarchy, State, and Utopia he argued that the minimal state can evolve out of an anarcho-capitalist society through an invisible hand process that does not violate anyone’s rights. Competitive pressures and violent conflict, he argued, will provide incentives for competing defensive agencies to merge or collude so that, effectively, monopolies will emerge over certain geographical areas (Nozick 1974). Since these monopolies are merely de facto, however, the dominant protection agency does not yet constitute a state. For that to occur, the “dominant protection agency” must claim that it would be morally illegitimate for other protection agencies to operate, and make some reasonably effective attempt to prohibit them from doing so. Nozick’s argument that it would be legitimate for the dominant protection agency to do so is one of the most controversial aspects of his argument. Essentially, he argues that individuals have rights not to be subject to the risk of rights-violation, and that the dominant protection agency may legitimately prohibit the protective activities of its competitors on grounds that their procedures involve the imposition of risk. In claiming and enforcing this monopoly, the dominant protection agency becomes what Nozick calls the “ultraminimal state”—ultraminimal because it does not provide protective services for all persons within its geographical territory, but only those who pay for them. The transition from the ultraminimal state to the minimal one occurs when the dominant protection agency (now state) provides protective services to all individuals within its territory, and Nozick argues that the state is morally obligated to do this in order to provide compensation to the individuals who have been disadvantaged by its seizure of monopoly power.
Nozick’s arguments against the anarchist have been challenged on a number of grounds. First, the justification for the state it provides is entirely hypothetical—the most he attempts to claim is that a state could arise legitimately from the state of nature, not that any actual state has (Rothbard 1977). But if hypotheticals were all that mattered, then an equally compelling story could be told of how the minimal state could devolve back into merely one competitive agency among others by a process that violates no one’s rights (Childs 1977), thus leaving us at a justificatory stalemate. Second, it is questionable whether prohibiting activities that run the risk of violating rights, but do not actually violate any, is compatible with fundamental liberal principles (Rothbard 1977). Finally, even if the general principle of prohibition with compensation is legitimate, it is nevertheless doubtful that the proper way to compensate the anarchist who has been harmed by the state’s claim of monopoly is to provide him with precisely what he does not want—state police and military services (Childs 1977).
Until decisively rebutted, then, the anarchist position remains a serious challenge for libertarians, especially of the minimal state variety. This is true regardless of whether their libertarianism is defended on consequentialist or natural rights grounds. For the consequentialist libertarian, the challenge is to explain why law and protective services are the only goods that require state provision in order to maximize utility (or whatever the maximandum may be). If, for instance, the consequentialist justification for the state provision of law is that law is a public good, then the question is: Why should other public goods not also be provided? The claim that only police, courts, and military fit the bill appears to be more an a priori article of faith than a consequence of empirical analysis. This consideration might explain why so many consequentialist libertarians are in fact classical liberals who are willing to grant legitimacy to a larger than minimal state (Friedman 1962; Hayek 1960; Epstein 2003). For deontological libertarians, on the other hand, the challenge is to show why the state is justified in (a) prohibiting individuals from exercising or purchasing protective activities on their own and (b) financing protective services through coercive and redistributive taxation. If this sort of prohibition, and this sort of coercion and redistribution is justified, why not others? Once the bright line of non-aggression has been crossed, it is difficult to find a compelling substitute.
This is not to say that anarcho-capitalists do not face challenges of their own. First, many have pointed out that there is a paucity of empirical evidence to support the claim that anarcho-capitalism could function in a modern post-industrial society. Pointing to quasi-examples from Medieval Iceland (Friedman 1979) does little to alleviate this concern (Epstein 2003). Second, even if a plausible case could be made for the market provision of law and private defense, the market provision of national defense, which fits the characteristics of a public good almost perfectly, remains a far more difficult challenge (Friedman 1989). Finally, when it comes to rights and anarchy, one philosopher’s modus ponens is another’s modus tollens. If respect for robust rights of self-ownership and property in external goods, as libertarians understand them, entail anarcho-capitalism, why not then reject these rights rather than embrace anarcho-capitalism? Rothbard, Nozick and other natural rights libertarians are notoriously lacking in foundational arguments to support their strong belief in these rights. In the absence of strong countervailing reasons to accept these rights and the libertarian interpretation of them, the fact that they lead to what might seem to be absurd conclusions could be a decisive reason to reject them.
This entry has focused on the main approaches to libertarianism popular among academic philosophers. But it has not been exhaustive. There are other philosophical defenses of libertarianism that space prevents exploring in detail, but deserve mention nevertheless. These include defenses of libertarianism that proceed from teleological and contractual considerations.
One increasingly influential approach takes as its normative foundation a virtue-centered ethical theory. Such theories hold that libertarian political institutions are justified in the way they allow individuals to develop as virtuous agents. Ayn Rand was perhaps the earliest modern proponent of such theory, and while her writings were largely ignored by academics, the core idea has since been picked up and developed with greater sophistication by philosophers like Tara Smith, Douglas Rasmussen, and Douglas Den Uyl (Rasmussen and Den Uyl 1991; 2005).
Teleological versions of libertarianism are in some significant respects similar to consequentialist versions, insofar as they hold that political institutions are to be judged in light of their tendency to yield a certain sort of outcome. But the consequentialism at work here is markedly different from the aggregative and impartial consequentialism of act-utilitarianism. Political institutions are to be judged based on the extent to which they allow individuals to flourish, but flourishing is a value that is agent-relative (and not agent-neutral as is happiness for the utilitarian), and also one that can only be achieved by the self-directed activity of each individual agent (and not something that can be distributed among individuals by the state). It is thus not the job of political institutions to promote flourishing by means of activist policies, but merely to make room for it by enforcing the core set of libertarian rights.
These claims lead to challenges for the teleological libertarian, however. If human flourishing is good, it must be so in an agent-neutral or in an agent-relative sense. If it is good in an agent-neutral sense, then it is unclear why we do not share positive duties to promote the flourishing of others, alongside merely negative duties to refrain from hindering their pursuit of their own flourishing.
Teleological libertarians generally argue that flourishing is something that cannot be provided for one by others since it is essentially a matter of exercising one’s own practical reason in the pursuit of a good life. But surely others can provide for us some of the means for our exercise of practical reason—from basics such as food and shelter to more complex goods such as education and perhaps even the social bases of self-respect. If, on the other hand, human flourishing is a good in merely an agent-relative sense, then it is unclear why others’ flourishing imposes any duties on us at all—positive or negative. If duties to respect the negative rights of others are not grounded in the agent-neutral value of others’ flourishing, then presumably they must be grounded in our own flourishing, but (a) making the wrongness of harming others depend on its negative effect on us seems to make that wrongness too contingent on situational facts—surely there are some cases in which violating the rights of others can benefit us, even in the long-term holistic sense required by eudaimonistic accounts. And (b) the fact that wronging others will hurt us seems to be the wrong kind of explanation for why rights-violating acts are wrong. It seems to get matters backwards: rights-violating actions are wrong because of their effects on the person whose rights are violated, not because they detract from the rights-violator’s virtue.
Another moral framework that has become increasingly popular among philosophers since Rawls’s Theory of Justice (1971) is contractarianism. As a moral theory, contractarianism is the idea that moral principles are justified if and only if they are the product of a certain kind of agreement among persons. Among libertarians, this idea has been developed by Jan Narveson in his book, The Libertarian Idea (1988), which attempts to show that rational individuals would agree to a government that took individual negative liberty as the only relevant consideration in setting policy. And, while not self-described as a contractarian, Loren Lomasky’s work in Persons, Rights, and the Moral Community (1987) has many affinities with this approach, as it attempts to defend libertarianism as a kind of policy of mutual-advantage between persons.
Most of the libertarian theories we have surveyed in this article have a common structure: foundational philosophical commitments are set out, theories are built upon them, and practical conclusions are derived from those theories. This approach has the advantage of thoroughness—one’s ultimate political conclusions are undergirded by a weighty philosophical system to which any challengers can be directed. The downside of this approach is that anyone who disagrees with one’s philosophic foundations will not be much persuaded by one’s conclusions drawn from them—and philosophers are not generally known for their widespread agreement on foundational issues.
As a result, much of the most interesting work in contemporary libertarian theory skips systematic theory-building altogether, and heads straight to the analysis of concrete problems. Often this analysis proceeds by accepting some set of values as given—often the values embraced by those who are not sympathetic to libertarianism as a political theory—and showing that libertarian political institutions will better realize those values than competing institutional frameworks. Daniel Shapiro’s recent work on welfare states (Shapiro 2007), for instance, is a good example of this trend, in arguing that contemporary welfare states are unjustifiable from a variety of popular theoretical approaches. Loren Lomasky (2005) has written a humorous but important piece arguing that Rawls’s foundational principles are better suited to defending Nozickian libertarianism than even Nozick’s foundational principles are. And David Schmidtz (Schmidtz and Goodin 1998) has argued that market institutions are supported on grounds of individual responsibility that any moral framework ought to take seriously. While such approaches lack the theoretical completeness that philosophers naturally crave, they nevertheless have the virtue of addressing crucially important social issues in a way that dispenses with the need for complete agreement on comprehensive moral theories.
A theoretical justification of this approach can be found in John Rawls’s notion of an overlapping consensus, as developed in his work Political Liberalism (1993). Rawls’s idea is that decisions about which political institutions and principles to adopt ought to be based on those aspects of morality on which all reasonable theories converge, rather than any one particular foundational moral theory, because there is reasonable and apparently intractable disagreement about foundational moral issues. Extending this overlapping consensus approach to libertarianism, then, entails viewing libertarianism as a political theory that is compatible with a variety of foundational metaphysical, epistemological, and ethical views. Individuals need not settle their reasonable disagreements regarding moral issues in order to agree upon a framework for political association; and libertarianism, with its robust toleration of individual differences, seems well-suited to serve as the principle for such a framework (Barnett 2004).
University of San Diego
U. S. A.
Last updated: March 26, 2008 | Originally published: