Liezi (Lieh-tzu, cn. 4th cn. B.C.E.)
The Liezi (Lieh-tzu), or Master Lie may be considered to be the third of the Chinese philosophical texts in the line of thought represented by the Laozi and the Zhuangzi, subsequently classified as Daojia (“the School of the Way”) or Daoist philosophy. Whether Master Lie existed as an actual person or not, the text bears his name in order to indicate its adherence to the line of thought and practice associated with this name. This appears to be true of other early texts, such as the Laozi, the Heguanzi, and the Guiguzi, for example. Despite the controversy over its dating and authorship, this is a philosophical treatise that clearly stands in the same tradition as the Zhuangzi, dealing with many of the same issues, and on occasion with almost identical passages. The Liezi continues the line of philosophical thinking of the Xiao Yao You, and the Qiu Shui, from which it takes up the themes of transcending boundaries, spirit journeying, cultivation of equanimity, and acceptance of the vicissitudes of life. It also continues the line of thought of the Yang Sheng Zhu, and the Da Sheng, developing the theme of cultivating extreme subtlety of perception and extraordinary levels of skill. It is noteworthy that the Liezi stands out as more apparently metaphysical than the cosmologically oriented texts of the Zhou and Han dynasties (such as the Laozi, Zhong Yong, and the Xici of the Yijing). That is, it goes further towards explicitly articulating a conception of the ‘transcendent’ or ‘metaphysical’: that which is beyond the realm of observable things that come into and go out of existence, and that is prior to, superior to, and responsible for it as its necessary condition. While the Liezi does not unambiguously articulate the logical conditions that define transcendence as such (a necessarily asymmetrical relation of dependence between the world and its source), still, the traces of transcendence are intriguing and worth philosophical investigation.
Table of Contents
- Historical Background
- The Liezi Text
- Central Concepts in the Liezi
- Chapter 1: Tian Rui (Omens of Nature)
- Chapter 2: Huang Di (The Yellow Emperor)
- Chapter 3: Zhou Mu Wang (King Mu of Zhou)
- Chapter 4: Zhong Ni (Confucius)
- Chapter 5: Tang Wen (The Questions of Tang)
- Chapter 6: Li Ming (Effort and Circumstance)
- Chapter 7: Yang Zhu (Yang Zhu)
- Chapter 8: Shuo Fu (Explaining the Signs)
- Key Interpreters of Liezi
- References and Further Reading
The character after whom the text is named is called Lie Yukou; his personal name, “Yukou,” means ‘guard-against-bandits.’ According to the Liezi itself, he lived in the Butian game preserve in the principality of Zheng, but was eventually driven by famine to live in Wei. The first chapter of the Zhuangzi refers to Liezi, and so, if this character corresponds to a really existing person, he must have existed prior to the writing of that chapter. This means that Liezi would have flourished some time before the end of the fourth century BCE. W. T. Chan places him as early as the fifth century. He was said to have been a student of Huzi (Huqiu Zilin), and a fellow student of Bohun Wuren (wuren: “no person”), and teacher of Baifeng. However, it is not clear whether there ever really existed a philosopher named ‘Liezi.’ Liezi is not explicitly mentioned in any of the early classifications of philosophical schools: those of Xunzi, Zhuangzi’s Tianxia chapter, and Sima Qian. Moreover, the character is understood to be an adept with superhuman powers. Zhuangzi, for example, says that he had the ability to fly for fifteen days at a time. Yang Bojun insists that, despite the mythologizing of the character, there is sufficient scattered evidence that there probably did exist a real person on whom the stories were based. Nevertheless, scholars have for centuries been suspicious of the existence of Master Lie, and of the authenticity of the text.
The ideas expressed throughout the text have clear affinities with the philosophies expressed in the Laozi and the Zhuangzi, and so categorizing these three as belonging to roughly the same tradition of thought is not problematic—even if the authors, contributors, and commentators did not think of themselves as proponents of a single doctrine, or as belonging to the same ‘school’. The Laozi is sometimes quoted with approval, although the quotations are attributed either to the Book of the Yellow Emperor, or to Lao Dan. While the Liezi does not refer to the Zhuangzi, it shows clear signs of influence from the latter (even though the character Liezi is supposed to have lived before Zhuangzi). This indicates a later dating of much, if not all, of the text.
Unlike the Laozi, this text displays little interest in critiquing the Ruists or Confucians, and unlike the Zhuangzi, does not criticize the ‘Ru Mo’—the Ruists and Mohists. On the contrary, it shows signs of reconciliation of Ruist and Daoist ideas: many Ruist principles are given Daoist interpretation, and Confucius appears in several stories as a wise and sympathetic character, if not a sage. Incidentally, that one of the chapters of the text is named after Confucius should not, by itself, be taken as significant. The chapter is so named, solely because the name of Confucius appears at the beginning of the first story. This eclectic reconciliation of Ruism, Daoism, and on occasion Mohism, is indication of the post-Qin provenance of the relevant passages.
While Zhuangzi’s own philosophy is believed to have exerted a significant influence on the interpretation of Buddhism in China, the Liezi may constitute a possible converse case of Mahayana Buddhist influence on the development of the ideas of Zhuangzi. Stories here and there resonate with some of the tenets of Sanlun (the Chinese form of Madhyamaka), Weishilun (the Chinese form of Yogacara), and Huayan. The resonances are highly suggestive, but the evidence is not decisive enough to be sure of any influence, either of Buddhist ideas on the Liezi, or vice versa. If the conjecture of Buddhist influence is correct, it would also place the relevant passages of the text well into, if not after, the Han dynasty.
The text, like many other early Chinese ‘books,’ is a collection of various materials, written at different times, some of which can also be found in other sources. Liu Xiang, the Western Han scholar, says in his preface that he edited and collated material from twenty chapters distributed in other collections, and reduced them to eight by eliminating excess materials. The extant eight chapter version, with Zhang Zhan’s commentary, dates from the Western Jin (approximately three centuries later).
Each chapter contains a series of stories, each developing some theme whose antecedents can often be discerned from the Laozi or the Zhuangzi. Several themes are developed in each chapter, and some chapters overlap in themes, but as with the Zhuangzi, each chapter has its distinctive ‘feel’. About one quarter of the text consists of passages that can be found in other early works, such as the Zhuangzi, the Huainanzi, and the Lüshi Chunqiu. The remaining majority of the text, however, is distinctive in style, and with the exception of the “Yang Zhu” chapter quite consistent in the world view and way of life that it expresses. Most of the text contains material of philosophical interest. However, myths and folk tales based on similar themes, but with no apparent philosophical value, can be found side by side with stories that have profound philosophical significance.
The “Yang Zhu” chapter is problematic. While the earliest reference to the text (Liu Xiang) lists a chapter with the title, the currently extant version of this chapter has little to nothing in common with the rest of the book, and indeed espouses a hedonist philosophy of pleasure seeking that is inconsistent with the cultivation of indifference toward worldly things that is characteristic of much of the rest of the book, and of the Zhuang-Lie approach to Daoism in general.
The “authenticity” of the Liezi text has been challenged by Chinese scholars for centuries, and it has accordingly been taken by perhaps a majority of scholars to be a forgery. Their claim is that the textual material was compiled, edited, and written by a single author who intended to deceive readers into believing that this was an ancient text. Certainly, the text is an eclectic compilation consisting of early materials which can be found in other texts, together with original material dating from well after the time period from which its supposed author is said to have lived. However, as Zhuang Wanshou points out, the characteristics cited for classifying the text as a forgery—being composed by several authors over several centuries, and drawing from several sources—apply to other philosophical texts which are not dismissed as “forgeries,” including, for example, the Analects and the Zhuangzi. Moreover, it is not clear why this should be considered sufficient reason to reject, and neglect, the Liezi as a philosophical text. Moreover, from a purely philosophical point of view, whoever wrote the text, and whenever it was written, it contains much material that expresses distinctively recognizable strands of Lao-Zhuang thought, with sufficient complexity and sophistication to warrant serious study as the third of the important Daoist philosophical texts.
In the opening chapter of the Liezi we can identify the beginnings of an articulation of a concept of a ‘beyond’ (wai) that bears a striking resemblance to Western concepts of the “transcendent” or “metaphysical.” I mean these terms more or less synonymously, and in the strong philosophical sense of: that which lies beyond the realm of experience, and stands independently as its necessary condition. The idea of a ‘beyond’ occurs several times, in different formulations, but it is unclear how close this gets to the Western concept of a metaphysical transcendent. In particular, while the formulations suggest an asymmetric relation of dependence—namely, that a realm beyond the conditions of existing things is itself a necessary condition for the existing, changing, things that we encounter, and not vice versa—it does not clearly and explicitly assert it as a necessarily asymmetrical relation. Still, this chapter goes much further than the Laozi or the Zhuangzi toward articulating anything like this sort of transcendence, and so if we are going to claim to find anything like it in the Daoist tradition, our best bet is with the Liezi.
The chapter begins with an account of something that is the condition of the existence of living and changing things. At first glance, this appears to define a metaphysical beyond that can only be hinted at negatively: that which is beyond birth and transformation (the unborn/not-living, busheng, and the unchanging, buhua), and which is responsible for all birth and transformation. It is the unborn that is able to produce the living, and the unchanging that is able to change the changing. This strongly suggests a dependence of the living on the unborn, of the changing on the unchanging. However, while the text explicitly asserts that the unborn/not-living can produce the living, it does not explicitly deny the opposite. Without this explicit assertion of necessary asymmetry, it has not, strictly speaking, claimed a transcendent role for the unborn/unchanging. Thus, the passage can still be read as entirely consistent with the typical Daoist claim that the stages of living and not living, and of change and not changing, are interdependent contrasts, each giving rise to the other.
The chapter also contains an explicit cosmology (a philosophical account of the basic makeup of the world), and, asks about the beginnings of heaven and earth. The text postulates several great beginnings, (taiyi, taichu, taishi, taisu), which successively mark an undifferentiated stage, a stage of energy (qi), a stage of embodied form (xing), and a stage of intrinsic stuff (zhi). The energies (or perhaps forms, or stuff, the text is not explicit) divide into two kinds: the light becomes the ‘heavens’ (tian), the heavy becomes the earth, and the blending of the two becomes the human realm. Here again, with questions about ‘great origins,’ we sense a possible concern with transcendence, but everything that is explicitly stated is compatible with an organic, naturalistic cosmology, and does not require the imposition of the full-blooded concept of metaphysical transcendence.
There follows an intriguing passage in which it is stated that that which produces, shapes, and colors, has not yet tasted, existed, or appeared. Here, an attempt is made to articulate a distinction between a realm of form that has perceptible properties, and a realm prior to form, shape, smell, etc which is responsible for these, and which itself does not have these perceptible properties. This passage is significant, because in this case, an asymmetry is for the first time explicitly articulated. However, the asymmetry is not asserted as a necessity, but merely as a contingent fact, thus still leaving room for interpreting the producer and the produced as interdependent.
After considering the cosmic beginnings, the chapter ends with a discussion of the possible end of the world. If the heavens (and the earth) are accumulated qi, then why might they not eventually come apart? Several answers are considered: they couldn’t come apart, because they are qi of a specific kind. Or: they could come apart, but that is so far off it is not something we need worry about. Or: It is beyond our knowledge whether they could ever come apart. Finally, Liezi’s answer is that both alternatives are “nonsense”: to say that tiandi will perish is nonsense, and to say that it won’t is nonsense. While the logic of this answer is left incomplete, it reminds us of the logic of the Sanlun philosophy of Madhyamaka Buddhism. The Sanlun philosophy tries to articulate a rejection of simplistic dichotomies, and encourages a third way (a ‘middle path’) that involves transcending the perspective from which we must choose between such dichotomies. There are other places in the Liezi where these hints of Sanlun emerge more explicitly, suggesting the possibility of Buddhist influence, and thereby a later dating of the text (or at least of these passages). It is worth noting, however, that the anti-metaphysical stance of Madhyamaka Buddhism is inconsistent with the positing of a realm of transcendence—thereby complicating the issue still further.
The Daoists are known for extolling the marvellous abilities of people with extraordinary skills, and the Liezi is no exception. Stories abound of people who perform breathtaking, sometimes life-threatening, feats with tranquil ease and flawless artistry. While these people are not directly called sages, they are nevertheless looked up to as exemplary of the ideals of the Daoist way of life.
What they have is extraordinary ability, but it is not to be understood mere daring or bravery; nor is it to be understood as qiao, skill, dexterity, or craftsmanship, in the ordinary sense of those terms. It is not simply a matter of technique, but rather of inner cultivation. These abilities arise when one understands and follows the natures or tendencies of things, and it is an understanding that cannot be put into words. As such, it is not something that one consciously knows: one might say, using the language of Polanyi, that it is a form of “tacit knowing.” Liezi emphasizes the point with examples of unwitting sages, people who naturally have a potent ability, and yet have no idea of how extraordinary they are, and indeed whose ignorance is in some cases the necessary condition of their exceptional abilities.
In other cases, or for other people, years of fasting, training, and discipline are necessary to cultivate such abilities. To engage successfully with things requires penetrating through to the inner tendencies of things, to that which lies at the root of things, beyond their observable shape and form. The sage unifies his nature (xing), energies, and potency, with a single-minded concentration on the task at hand, aware of nothing except the circumstances and the goal, and is subtly in tune with the innermost core of things. When one is able, in this way, to penetrate to the place where things are ‘forged’, one is no longer at their mercy, and then the extremes of life’s circumstances cannot ‘enter’ (ru) to disturb one’s tranquility.
What is waking experience, or dream experience? What is the relation between them? From a realist perspective, only waking experience is experience of reality, while dream experience is an ‘imaginary’ reproduction of the experiences without there being a corresponding dream reality. From an idealist perspective, the difference is less radical. It is, to a large extent, a difference in degree, rather than in kind. Waking experience is simply more coherent and more enduring, and is shared by others. What, then, if there were a kind of dream experience that was more coherent and more enduring? How would we draw the distinction then? What if there a kind of dream experience that could be shared with others? Would this not constitute a radical challenge to the distinction between waking and dreaming?
It is notable that the term huan is used to talk of the status of dreams, and thereby also of our waking experience to the extent that it too is considered to be dreamlike. The term means ‘illusion’, and suggests a very strong devaluation of what we ordinarily take to be genuine experience. In some sense, all experience is for us a magnificent, magical display, a phantasmagoria of sensory delights and horrors. Seen in this light, dream and waking experience become equalized: the reality of dreams is of the same order as the illusory nature of waking experience. From an idealist perspective of this sort, waking experience is ultimately no different from a dream. This is reminiscent of the Vedanta conception of maya, and indeed it is noteworthy that huan is the word standardly used to translate the Buddhist concept of maya. If it is the case, as most scholars argue, that there is no evidence of an indigenous Chinese tradition developing a distinction between the realms of ‘Appearance’ and ‘Reality’, then this would seem to indicate the possibility of Indian influence, most probably via the Yogacara incorporation of Vedanta philosophical concepts, imparted through its Chinese form of Weishilun.
In the opening of this chapter, Confucius is found lamenting his lack of success in life, and his beloved disciple Yan Hui reminds him to cultivate indifference. Confucius responds in a manner that attempts to provide a reconciliation of Daoist virtue and cultivation with Ruist social involvement. Thus, coming to terms with tian and ming means more than simply accepting everything that happens to us with equanimity or indifference. Equanimity means rejoicing in nothing, but to rejoice in nothing requires rejoicing equally in everything. And to rejoice equally in everything requires being fully immersed in each and every one of our concerns, in our successes and failures. Thus, it is entirely appropriate, and consistent with Liezi’s form of Daoism, for Confucius to grieve that he did not succeed, during his lifetime, in transforming the state. This is a very clever reinterpretation of the Daoist cultivation of equanimity that makes it compatible with care and concern for social ventures. It takes Daoist logic that leads us away from worldliness, and follows it through so that it leads us right back into the thick of things. In doing so, it anticipates the Chan (Zen) response to Huayan Buddhism.
The intuitive ‘non-knowing’ of the Huang Di chapter is then applied to the subject of governing in order to describe a Daoist kind of ‘mystical’ rulership. One rules most skilfully by doing ‘nothing.’ The ruler cultivates an intuitive sensitivity to the natures of people and circumstances, and becomes so sensitive to all that happens that he or she can respond appropriately, without necessarily knowing, or consciously planning, or taking deliberate control, or making crude judgments regarding what is right and what is wrong.
This chapter opens up another kind of metaphysical problem: the problem of what things are like ‘outside’ of the realms of familiarity, and gives expression to a sense of the magnificence of the world: vast, unencompassable dimensions, and the extraordinary variety of things, creatures, cultures, and places. The problem is posed, and different answers are suggested, but I think it would be a mistake to try to find a consistent metaphysical position asserted as the correct one. Rather, the text engages in a literary-philosophical exploration of some possibilities. Also, several implications are explored, drawing together concepts from other chapters: sameness and difference, the vast and the petty, the infinite and inexhaustible, the skill of the imperceptible.
As we move from region to region throughout its boundless extent, we meet up with increasingly strange varieties of things. Yet despite their differences, are they after all just variations on a theme? All things are different, and yet is it not also the case that all things are in a deeper sense the same? In either case, to one who is truly at home in the universe, the extraordinary and wonderful varieties are remarkable but not to be considered weird. Thus, unlike our typical tendency to marvel at the peculiar weirdness of the ‘exotic,’ this chapter encourages us to de-exoticize the unfamiliar.
Going beyond the limits is conceived not simply as moving outwards along a trajectory, but as occuring between levels of containment. To go outside, or beyond, is to move to a higher level within which the previous level is contained. But this very movement immediately suggests the possibility of iteration, and thus leads to the Daoist formulation of a problem concerning finitude. Are there ultimate limits of containment to how far we can go beyond? If so, is there such a thing as what is beyond those limits? Or is the process limitless? If so, can there be such a thing as what is beyond the limitless?
Conversely, the ‘inexhaustible’ refers to movement in the opposite direction, inwardly from the vast to the minuscule. At its extreme, the inexhaustible, infinitesimal within things, approaches nothing. The more subtle and minuscule it gets, the more it escapes the purview of ordinary sensory awareness. It is the inexhaustible subtleties within things that enable things to be what they are, and so sensitivity to such subtleties can and should be cultivated. Since such an awareness is unavailable to ordinary perception, and since as we have seen in Chapter 2 it is also non-verbal, it is thought of as a kind of intuitive embodied insight that remains beneath the level of conscious awareness. When we cultivate this, we are able to sense the innermost tendencies of things, respond to changes before they manifest, and thus act without interfering. The sagely charioteer, for example, does not force the horses to move, nor fight the terrain, but has a subtle sensitivity to the terrain, and to the every movement of the horses, and is able to guide, even to “control”, merely by following intuitively, tacitly, the tendencies of things.
This distinction between the vast and the petty also has more familiar, less mystical application. Great things can be achieved by focusing on the here and now: no need for a long term plan, for far reaching vision. Just keep doing what you can, no matter how dense and shortsighted: the results will take care of themselves. Great things can thus be achieved unwittingly, stupidly even. Hence, the stupid man is able to move the mountain.
The chapter raises the question: to what must we attribute the vicissitudes of life, our successes and failures? Is it really something that is in our control, that can be changed by li, human effort? Or is it, after all, just circumstance, ming, in this case not inappropriately interpreted as ‘fate’? That is, is it something our efforts can affect, or is it something we can do nothing about?
In the Zhuangzi, an answer is given that is reminiscent of Stoicism: that the circumstances into which we emerge are simply the way things are. We must learn to accept our lot, ming, with equanimity. There appear to be two answers given in the Liezi, one of which, given at the end of the chapter, echoes this answer of Zhuangzi. But at the beginning of the chapter, the two alternatives of li and ming are rejected. Instead, the answer is given that we must learn to accept that whatever happens, it is just the way things are, Gu. In fact, these two answers are not different, since the sense being expressed by gu in the Liezi is precisely what is expressed by the word ming in the Zhuangzi. The answer to this problem lies in the fact that the word ming has two senses. In the Zhuangzi and other early texts, ming is the circumstances that surround us, the way things are. It also has aspects of the following senses: life, lifespan, lot (in life), calling, naming, command, circumstance, that into which we are thrown, and with which we must come to terms. Insofar as this does not necessarily imply an external determining force, it differs from the concept of ‘fate.’
But it also may be used in a less sophisticated sense to refer to an external force which is in control of things, that is “fate” or “destiny”. This sense of the word can be found as early as the Mozi, in the Fei Ming (Against Fate) chapter. When the Liezi contrasts li and ming, it is in this cruder sense that ming is being rejected. Instead, the word gu is used in this text as a synonym for what was expressed by ming in the Zhuangzi. What is being denied, then, in these passages is that neither effort, nor any external force of destiny is truly in control of what happens. Thus, it is the dichotomy of personal control vs external control that is being rejected: it is not that success or failure is determined by us, nor is it the case that success or failure is determined by external circumstances. Nor, incidentally, is the point that there is always a combination of both effort and circumstance. Rather, whatever effort is involved, and whatever the circumstances, in all cases it is always a matter of how things just happened to turn out. In the end, even if neither effort nor circumstance determine the outcome, yet the outcome has simply followed its gu, the way it is.
The ideas of this chapter are so inconsistent with the rest of the text that it is clearly out of place. Exactly how and why it made its way into this collection, and succeeded in remaining there, is unclear. It espouses a hedonistic philosophy: Life is short; Live for pleasure alone; Don’t waste time cultivating virtues. If it bears any relation to Daoist philosophy, then it appears to be a sophomoric misunderstanding of the ideas of the Xiao Yao You chapter of the Zhuangzi. Graham suggests that it comes from a former Yangist phase of the author’s philosophical career, and that it was written, in part, to provide a foil against which to understand his later philosophy.
This chapter is a mixed collection of stories, exploring themes of varying philosophical significance. A recurring theme expresses a particularist attitude that might be thought of as a kind of casuistry (according to which judgments are made by comparing the particularities of individual cases), or contextualism (according to which judgments ought to be made only when all differences of context are factored in). Several stories are told, in each of which we have apparently similar circumstances in which the outcome varies significantly. The point is to emphasize that we cannot simply assume that what appear to be similar situations require similar responses from us. We must treat each case in the light of its own unique circumstances. That is, instead of looking for simple rules to be applied at all times, we must instead learn how to read the subtleties of the ‘signs’. This may be done either through a clear and explicit awareness that arises from careful observation, or through an intuitive and embodied understanding that arises from familiarity and practice.
The first eight chapter edition of the text may have been edited and compiled by Liu Xiang (77—6BCE). If this edition ever existed, it is no longer extant. Zhang Zhan’s annotated edition (around 370 CE) became popular from the Tang dynasty, and this edition with Zhang’s commentary has become the received version. A second philosophical commentary was produced by Lu Chongxuan in the 8th century). After the Tang, doubts began to be raised about its authenticity, beginning with Liu Zongyuan (773—819). Unfortunately, most of the scholarly discussion around this text has concerned its dating and “authenticity,” and consequently, there has been little to no serious interpretation of the text regarding its philosophical content.
The concern to dismiss the text increased in the early twentieth century. In 1919, Ma Shulun argued that it was a forgery made by students of Wang Bi, stealing materials from many prior philosophical sources. In 1920, Takeuchi Yoshio published a refutation of Ma Shulun, but acknowledged that the text was a late compilation. In 1949, Cen Zhongmian, attempted to defend the text, using modern techniques of linguistic analysis to argue that it dated from the late Zhou, but his argument has not been influential. In 1927, Liang Qichao even suggested that it was in fact the commentator Zhang Zhan himself who forged the book.
In 1979, two excellent editions of the Liezi with important critical commentaries were published: one by Yang Bojun in Beijing, the other by Zhuang Wanshou in Taibei. It is important to note that Zhuang’s so-called Du Ben not merely a study book, but is a significant work in its own right.
- Barrett, T. H. “Lieh Tzu.” In Early Chinese Texts: A Bibliographical Guide, ed. Michael Loewe (Berkeley: Society for the Study of Early China and the Institute of East Asian Studies, University of California, Berkeley, 1993), 298-308.
- Graham, A. C. The Book of Lieh-tzu. New York: Columbia University Press, 1960.
- Graham, A. C. “The Date and Composition of the Lieh-Tzu.” In Studies in Chinese Philosophy and Philosophical Literature (Albany: State University of New York Press, 1990), 216-282.
- Yang, Bojun. Liezi Jishi. Beijing: Zhonghua Shuju, 1979.
- Wieger, Leo. Taoism: The Philosophy of China. Burbank, CA: Ohara Publications, 1976.
- Zhuang, Wanshou. Xinyi Liezi Duben. Taibei: Sanmin Shuju, 1979.
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