John Locke (1632-1704) presents an intriguing figure in the history of political philosophy whose brilliance of exposition and breadth of scholarly activity remains profoundly influential.
Locke proposed a radical conception of political philosophy deduced from the principle of self-ownership and the corollary right to own property, which in turn is based on his famous claim that a man earns ownership over a resource when he mixes his labour with it. Government, he argued, should be limited to securing the life and property of its citizens, and is only necessary because in an ideal, anarchic state of nature, various problems arise that would make life more insecure than under the protection of a minimal state. Locke is also renown for his writings on toleration in which he espoused the right to freedom of conscience and religion (except when religion was deemed intolerant!), and for his cogent criticism of hereditary monarchy and patriarchalism. After his death, his mature political philosophy leant support to the British Whig party and its principles, to the Age of Enlightenment, and to the development of the separation of the State and Church in the American Constitution as well as to the rise of human rights theories in the Twentieth Century.
However, a closer study of any philosopher reveals aspects and depths that introductory caricatures (including this one) cannot portray, and while such articles seemingly present a completed sketch of all that can ever be known of a great thinker, it must always be remembered that a great thinker is rarely captured in a few pages or paragraphs by a lesser one, or one that approaches him with particular philosophical interest or bias: the reader, once contented with the glosses provided here, should always return to and scrutinise Locke in the original – just as an academic exposition of Beethoven’s Eroica symphony will always be a sallow reflection of the actual music.
This article summarises the general drift of Locke’s political thinking, leaving the other IEP article on Locke to examine his general philosophy and his theory of knowledge. The article touches on his biography as it relates to the development of his political thought, and it also provides an analysis of some of the issues that his philosophy raises – especially with regards to the Two Treatises of Government. Locke is rightly famous for his Treatises, yet during his life he repudiated his authorship, although he subtly recommended them as essential reading in letters and thoughts on reading for gentlemen. The Treatises swiftly became a classic in political philosophy, and its popularity has remained undiminished since his time: the ‘John Locke academic industry’ is vibrant and broad with an academic journal (John Locke Studies) and books regularly coming out dealing with his philosophy.
The first caveat to note is that Locke’s political philosophy is divided into two discernible eras – his Oxford period (1652-66) and his Shaftesbury period, when he was employed by Lord Anthony Ashley-Cooper (later Earl of Shaftesbury) from 1666-1683 through his final years following Shaftesbury’s death. The ‘two Lockes’ are somewhat distinguishable and should certainly be born in mind, even if one were to concentrate solely on his Two Treatises, and ignore his earlier thinking. Nonetheless, the Treatises, written in his later incarnation should be read not just as classics in their own right but as the mature culmination of Locke’s political philosophy into an original and insightful theory of government, power, property, trust, and rights, for there are Lockean continuities in his political thinking that reach back into his earliest political sketches. For example, scriptural exegesis used to support his political ideas, and his fear of violence (national and towards him and his friends), uncertainty, war, and accordingly of any doctrine or behaviour that could lead to unsettling anarchy or persecution. It was a fear of persecution that kept him from admitting to authorship of the Two Treatises, after all Seventeenth Century Britain certainly produced many provocative and extreme opinions, and indeed a few writers, including some close associates, were executed for their seditious thoughts. Locke retained a fear for his life long after the troubles had died down.
The earlier Locke, a student and tutor at Oxford, was morally and politically conservative, Hobbesian one could say were such thoughts not so generally reflective of the post-bellum times in England in which strong and stable government was manifestly preferable to the apparent anarchy of the recent Civil Wars in the British Isles (1642-51). The mature Locke developed into a radical proponent of religious freedom, individual liberty and conscience. By no means did he become an anarchist or a thorough and consistent libertarian who decried the use of power – power, he believed, is essential to the running of a peaceful commonwealth, but it must be vigorously checked and controlled, as well as used to secure national interests. His later writings are certainly in the vein of what is now termed ‘classical liberalism’ upholding the sanctity of private property, self-ownership, minimal government, and the innate distrust of the use of power, yet throughout his political theorising and despite the later emphasis towards inviolable rights, he remains, politically conservative, economically mercantilist, morally authoritarian, highly Christian, and generally suspicious of swathes of people who could affect the Commonwealth’s peace and security (atheists, Quakers, Roman Catholics). Locke also enjoyed dabbling in rationalist designs for how societies ought to be run, which is far removed from the hero of libertarian thinking of live and let live that he is sometimes held to be.
For example, Locke retained an Oxford born academic scepticism of the people (tinted with a sense of noblesse oblige – he left money for the poor of the parishes of his birth and death) well into his Shaftesbury years, but this is later admixed with his political experiences in which he gained a healthier cynicism of those who wield power and of their effects on what he increasingly believed ought to remain private and thus beyond the remit of the magistrate. Throughout Locke’s writings those who would threaten or undermine government through their intolerance, leanings toward papal theocracy, or indulging in bone idleness are castigated and are to be outlawed according to his schemes: inconsistencies or at least intolerances or prudential considerations linger within his general libertarian framework. Indeed, writing in 1669 Locke accepts the institution of slavery (FCC) and as late as 1697 (a good decade and a half after writing the Two Treatises), he advises press-ganging beggars into military service and that begging minors should be “soundly whipped.” (EPL).
The second caveat is that Locke’s works deserve re-reading – only then, or even after several attempts, can one begin to enjoy the humour that sometimes punctuates the texts, and to see that Locke’s apparently circumlocutory style belies a great depth of thought peppered with qualifications and sub-clauses which are employed to tighten his argument. Locke neither rants from the extremes nor wraps his language in poetical mysticism to awe the superstitious, nor does he proffer snippets of profound metaphysical insights to satiate the quick reader. As a medical doctor and amateur scientist and the author of the classical work on epistemology and psychology, An Essay Concerning Human Understanding (1689, published the same year as the Two Treatise), it’s not surprising that Locke’s political writings are methodical and tightly argued. Locke’s arguments lifted from his texts present an uncompromising and modern vision of empiricism and scientific enquiry; however, his language is immersed in Old Testament anecdotes and references that when we peruse his writings, we must remember that John Locke was of Seventeenth Century Puritan and Scholastic background, and at Oxford he studied amidst the general University contract of religious uniformity until his departure on a freer, if relatively unsure foot, in employment with the politically ambitious courtier Lord Ashley.
The next section reviews Locke’s political biography and although it may be skipped for those interested in a cursory glance at the political arguments of the Two Treatises, it is of invaluable background for a more profound understanding.
This section outlines the broad political events surrounding Locke’s life and thereby provides a useful, although not exhaustive, sketch of the man and the context of his works.
The Seventeenth Century was a period of immense upheavals – across Europe the Thirty Years Wars had raged (1608-48), and in Locke’s Britain, Civil War broke out in 1642: “I no sooner perceived myself in the world but I found myself in a storm.” (FT). He lived through the overthrow and execution of the monarch, the interregnum of the Cromwell’s Republic, the Restoration, and the overthrow of another monarch in the Glorious Revolution. Without some knowledge of this political context and thus the world in which he wrote and acted, it is difficult to understand the thrust of Locke’s political philosophy.
John Locke was born in 1632 in a cottage in the village of Wrington, near the great port of Bristol, Somerset, and was raised at Pensford a few miles to the west. The second Stuart King of England, Wales, Scotland, and Ireland had been on the throne for seven years – the ill-fated Charles I, whose reign was to lead to a brutal Civil War dividing the British along religious and political lines and which ended in his execution in 1649. Somerset was one of the most populous and rich counties of the country, yet despite its affluence gained from hard work and a division of labour, social strata (albeit highly flexible since Tudor times) permeated social relations – each individual had a moral superior to look up to in a moral hierarchy that ended with the monarch, whose superior was God. This political and social context is vital to be aware of, for the tensions and violence of the era permeate the atmosphere in which Locke matured and wrote his political writings.
The essential divisions that operated in the Civil Wars may be thought of as splitting Puritan or Independent religious proponents with supporters of the rights of Parliament (generally lumped into ‘Parliamentarians’) from adherents to the Anglican Church, closet Catholics, and supporters of the Royal Establishment (generally referred to as ‘Royalists’). Locke’s parents were low gentry Puritans (tanners and clothiers), and his father, an attorney to the local Justices of the Peace, went to war on the Parliamentarian side in the cavalry. The local city of Bristol was a Royalist stronghold during the wars but fell to the Parliamentarians in 1645, and in 1647, a good acquaintance of Locke’s father, officer and Member of Parliament for the West Country, Alexander Popham, secured young Master Locke a place at Westminster School in London in the first example of patronage that was to assist Locke’s career.
Locke’s family instilled him good values of independence and self-discipline, which he retained throughout his life, but the move to London opened up Locke’s mind and took him far from his parochial Puritan upbringing (Dunn). Westminster School was run by the formidable Dr Richard Busby, a Royalist, who was apparently fond of beating the boys, something the older Locke was to recommend for young beggars. Young Locke was there the same time as the poet and future apologist for Charles II, John Dryden (1644-54) and was at school at the time of Charles I’s execution on the scaffolding erected in front of the nearby Banqueting House (Jan. 1649). The execution caused a sympathetic reaction to the Royalist cause to foment during the next decade – and a posthumously published pamphlet, allegedly written by Charles (Eikon Basilike) encouraged the raising of his status from traitor (in the eyes of the High Court that tried him) to one of martyr, and it popularised not just the Stuart doctrine that the Stuarts (or monarchs in general) were divinely appointed (rather than chancing upon the throne of England – the last Tudor monarch, Elizabeth I died without issue), but that Parliamentarians were guilty of the heinous crime of regicide.
In 1652 the twenty year old Locke moved onto Oxford’s Christ Church.
Oxford had enjoyed an influx of scientific inquiry and humanism – Roger Bacon (1220-92), John Wycliffe (1330-84), Desiderius Erasmus (1469-1536) and Sir Thomas More (1477-1535), all had their influence on the colleges. The present head of Christ Church for Locke was the Presbyterian John Owen (1616-83), a Puritan proponent of toleration and independence for Protestant sects and an earlier supporter and follower of Oliver Cromwell (1599-1658). (Owen travelled with Cromwell into his wars in Scotland and Ireland). Avoiding a career in theology and despising the dry Scholasticism (although the techniques and knowledge were of great use to his mind), Locke concentrated his studies on medical science at Oxford and later held teaching and diplomatic positions until meeting up with Lord Ashley Cooper in 1666 (later Earl of Shaftesbury). The position of a don was Locke’s preferred ambition and would have loved to live his whole life at Oxford – but events altered this path and he was illegally ejected on political grounds in 1684 from his studentship at Christ Church.
Locke’s politically formative years as a young man were dominated by the rise of Puritan dissenters and Parliamentarians, the outbreak of Civil War when he was ten, the fall of Bristol when he was 13, the execution of Charles I when he was 17 and the formation and government of a Republic until he was 28. His religious thinking had shifted from a traditional acceptance of his Puritan heritage to Latitudinarianism, which emphasises the employment of reason in understanding religious and Scriptural matters. A constant political problem he drew his attention to was the rights of the civil magistrates relative to the rights of the clergy; up until the mid-1660s, Locke espoused the primacy of civil institutions in defining the nation’s religious culture and forms – he was, in effect, an advocate of the earlier Acts of Supremacy (1534, 1559) establishing the Monarch as the head of the Church and State, and the Elizabethan Act of Uniformity (1559) that sought to unify religious worship in the Kingdom; the Republic contrarily had promoted diversity.
The Lords and the Monarchy were abolished by the reforming Republic, and Cromwell defeated Royalist and Catholic forces in Ireland (viciously at Drogheda [Droichead Átha] and Wexford [Loch Garman] in1649) and Charles II’s army in Scotland. John Lambert (1619-1684) penned the first British Constitution to give the Republic a stable form. The position of Lord Protector was created, which was passed to Cromwell. However, political divisions beset the Republic, which teetered into a dictatorship as Cromwell became increasingly frustrated with his attempts at reforming the country. Nonetheless, Cromwell was, in many respects, a highly capable ruler – rejecting the offered crown to become a de jure monarch, and realising what a political vacuum the dissolution of the monarchy implied he appointed good judges to ensure the rule of law, encouraged religious toleration, liberty of conscience and the immigration of Jews. The Republic was a strange political beast, taking over in a country wracked by war the powers that the Tudors and early Stuarts (James I and Charles I) had arrogated to themselves, and whose traditional, but by then very well worn down, checks on arbitrary executive and legislative power were thereby diminished. It is unsurprising that the country swiftly descended into a military dictatorship under Oliver Cromwell’s rule. The Republic became a pariah state, and European (notably the French) monarchs sought to assist Charles II to regain his throne.
The immanent political difficulties led to the Republic’s rapid demise following Cromwell’s death, and the ‘Long Parliament’ (whose Members were initially summoned by Charles I in 1640 and which was recalled by General Monck) soon sought out the exiled King Charles II to bring peace and calm to the vulnerable state. Yet relief following Charles’s return in 1660 soon turned to grave concern in many parts of the country, and the problems that had beset or been unleashed in the previous two decades of war and interregnum resurfaced.
In 1660, John Locke was aged twenty eight and a newly appointed tutor in Greek at Oxford. Oxford and Locke prudently rejoiced in the Restoration in a commissioned book of poetry: “Our prayers are heard,” penned Locke – but so had he and his Oxford colleagues praised Cromwell’s rule, “You, mighty Prince!” (V) Initially, Locke was unwilling to add to the political controversies of the era, until he penned his first two Tracts on Government. The occasion was a highly controversial reversal of policy on the part of Charles’s government.
In 1662 Charles II’s government passed a new Act of Uniformity, which Locke supported in his Tracts as being within the monarch’s rights. But the repercussions were severe. The Puritans and Parliamentarians had originally supported Charles’s restoration as being the most peaceful alternative the country possessed in 1660, and they had been assured that there would be a broad toleration of “tender consciences” as Charles described the beliefs of the various independent branches of Protestantism then flourishing in the Kingdom. However, the Uniformity Act dashed Puritan hopes for toleration. The Act and subsequent legislation ejected two thousand Puritan ministers from their churches, fined anyone over 16 attending ceremonies not conducted by the Anglican Book of Common Prayer, and forced ex-Puritan ministers to live at least five miles away from where they used to preach. An intolerant Act passed so soon after the dissolution of the Commonwealth caused concern and rebellion in parts of the Kingdom – nevertheless Locke was more of the opinion that the magistrate (King) possessed the right to demand uniformity, with the caveat that in their consciences men may remain free in order to secure peace in a troubled land. It was an opinion he gradually moved away from.
In 1666, Locke returned to Oxford from a year in Brandenburg (in modern Germany) acting as secretary to the diplomat Sir Walter Vane, and at Oxford Locke was introduced to a man who was to change his life, of whom it has been said that without him there would have been no ‘Locke’. To understand Locke’s change from a political conservative accepting the magistrate’s right to rule as both prudential and moral to a radical supporter of the individual against the government, it is worth considering a few details of Ashley’s life.
Anthony Ashley Cooper (1621-83) was a wealthy and politically powerful patron to work for, and Ashley worked for whomever was in power – Royalists, Parliamentarians, the Protectorate, and the Restoration monarchy. He had initially sided with Charles I in the first Civil War, but changed sides to fight with the Parliamentarians having become displeased with the political and religious advice afforded the King. He supported Cromwell and was promoted well till he became dissatisfied with the increasingly military leaning of the Protectorate (1653-54). A year after Cromwell’s death in 1660, Ashley sat on the commission for the Convention Parliament that invited Charles II to return to England; although Ashley was not a thoroughly enthusiastic supporter of the Restoration, it appeared to many Presbyterians to be the most prudential step for the country to take. From 1660-73 Ashley worked for Charles II, eventually rising to become Chancellor – and was promoted to an Earldom in 1672. Ashley argued for religious toleration for dissenting Protestants and supported the Anglo-Dutch wars on mercantilist grounds (Dutch profit equates to English losses), but his anti-Catholic stance eventually led to his dismissal from government.
Ashley actively engaged Parliament to keep Charles II’s brother, James, an open Catholic, from marrying another Catholic and from becoming King. James, the then Duke of York, was also a capable and efficient Lord High Admiral of the Fleet and had taken New Amsterdam from the Dutch in 1664, having it renamed New ‘York’; he later fought in the Anglo-Dutch wars. Initially, James had the backing of the establishment – he was more serious and thus more appreciable to the Anglicans, and he leaned towards toleration. However, his very Catholicism worried those of a more puritan and cynical leaning.
Out of office and in opposition, Shaftesbury formed ‘the Country Party’ to criticise the King’s government. From this evolved the first two political parties of modern times – the Whigs and the Tories. (The Whigs generally speaking followed Shaftesbury and the Tories supported the Anglican establishment). However, in 1679, a spurious plot was uncovered to assassinate Charles II to instate his Catholic brother on the throne; this gave Shaftesbury’s political stance momentum and growth, for the country feared a return to Catholic Stuart rule and the conditions that had created the Civil Wars. In 1681, Shaftesbury marched to Parliament with a force of men, but the King’s dissolution of the Parliament left him suddenly vulnerable – he was imprisoned and charged with treason, a charge rejected by the jury. The poet laureate and Westminster graduate, John Dryden, penned a satirical attack on Shaftesbury at this time (Absalom and Achitophel) and a year later Shaftesbury fled to Holland and died in exile in 1683.
Returning to how all this affected Locke’s life, in 1666 Lord Ashley had happened to go to Oxford to see his doctor about a liver complaint. Locke was introduced to him and the two became good friends. Locke gained employment at the heart of Lord Ashley’s household in London following the Great Fire until 1675. In 1668 he oversaw a life-saving operation on his patron to remove liver cists.
Locke learned much from Shaftesbury. For example, his first Essay on Toleration marked a substantial shift away from his earlier establishmentarian views that the ruler should prescribe the form of religious service for the country. This was very reflective of Lord Ashley’s philosophy of encouraging toleration rather than division. Debate had heated up following the Act of Uniformity (1662), and in Scotland, the Covenanters, who opposed any form of episcopalianism (hierarchical rule of bishops and archbishops) and uniformity, suffered brutally. There were various uprisings in Scotland in 1666, 1679, and 1685, which had led to thousands of martyrs burning at the stake and being hanged for their opposition. (Visitors to Edinburgh may see where they were burned in the Grass Market and visit a memorable commemorative grave in Greyfriar’s graveyard).
In 1668 Locke was elected to the Royal Society, and as his patron rose to become Chancellor for Charles II, Locke served the Lords Proprietors of Carolina (helping to draft a Constitution for the plantation), Secretary for Presentations (dealing with church livings), and Secretary to the Council of Trade and Plantations. His employment kept him busy from philosophical thought – but no doubt gave him invaluable experience of the workings of power and the court.
In 1675 Charles’ brother and heir to the throne James publicly converted to Catholicism and caused the expected crisis that left Lord Ashley – now Earl of Shaftesbury – ejected from office and in opposition. From 1675-79, an unwell Locke travelled to France, returning to London in 1679-81 with his master to enjoy the heat of the Exclusion Crisis in which Shaftesbury and his supporters sought a Parliamentary Act to exclude James from taking the throne.
In 1680 the late Sir Robert Filmer’s Patriarcha was published at the height of the Exclusion Crisis. Filmer (1588-1653) had written his work in 1648 supporting the divine right of Kings and their absolute power over the land. James I had given his support to the medieval notion that a ruler is divinely appointed (a theory designed to secure the monarch’s power in relation to the Church), but a few decades later it was given a theoretical defence by Filmer (and later by Jacques-Benigne Bossuet (1627-1704) in Louis XIV’s France) – Locke was to reply with his Two Treatises, rejecting Filmer’s theory as ‘glib nonsense’ and the evidence is that Locke began writing his Treatises not long after purchasing a copy of Patriarcha.
In 1681 however, Locke’s patron, Shaftesbury, was charged with treason following ‘the Rye House Plot’ of an alleged attempt to kill Charles and James. The jury rejected the charge against Shaftesbury, but Tory political advances prompted Shaftesbury, in the absence of any hope of a Parliament sitting to provide support to his party, to flee to Holland where he died in 1683. Two of his colleagues opposing James’s succession, Algernon Sidney and Lord William Russell, were, however, executed, while a third, the Earl of Essex, committed suicide. Sidney’s Discourses Concerning Government (published posthumously in 1698) had argued for a right to revolt and his words were used against him during his trial; Russell had withdrawn from public life, but informers inculpated him in the Plot to assassinate Charles II.
The intolerant and charged atmosphere kept Locke abroad from 1683-89 and freedom from political intrigues and duties allowed him to develop his philosophy.
In 1685 Charles II died and his brother James ascended the throne. The ripples from the Rye House Plot continued to upset the initially stable and sober new regime, and after the failed Monmouth and Argyll rebellions (1685) to oust James, the new monarch clamped down on those who sought to overthrow him. James subsequently handed out army posts to supporting and trustworthy Catholics, and he advanced Catholics to his Privy Council; in November he dismissed Parliament. Nonetheless, he tolerantly presented a Declaration of Indulgences permitting Catholic and Non-Conformist freedom – the motives for which remain unclear; but the Queen’s pregnancy and the possibility of a Catholic succession led Protestant leaders to consult with James’ daughter’s husband (and her cousin – both sharing Charles I as grandfather!), William of Orange in Holland. William had been fighting the might of Catholic France with much gusto and success. Accordingly, as James became increasingly unstable and a boy (James) was born to his wife, William was invited over to take the throne. Upon landing in South Devon and marching toward London many of James’s officers immediately switched sides and James fled to France. Soon both the English and Scots Parliaments declared the de facto abdication of James and the accession of William in what is often called the ‘Glorious Revolution’.
Locke returned to England with William’s wife, Mary, and other exiles. The ousted James had lost all his military abilities and an attempt at recovering his throne via an invasion of hope of a sympathetic uprising in Ireland led to his defeat by William at the Battle of the Boyne in 1690.
These were certainly times of political commotion. In 1689, Locke’s Essay Concerning Human Understanding was published, along with, anonymously, his Two Treatises and a Letter Concerning Toleration. Amendments to the Two Treatises present it as work defending the ‘Glorious Revolution’ and William and Mary’s accession to the throne at the consent of the English people, although modern research has dated it back to 1679-81 and the occasion of Patriarcha’s publication.
Locke returned to England and settled at the house of Sir Francis and Lady Damaris Masham. Damaris was the daughter of Ralph Cudworth (1617-88), a Cambridge platonist, whose writings Locke had enjoyed and which had influenced his shift towards Latitudinarianism. Amidst friends and in a politically more cordial environment, Locke published works on economics, the Scriptures, toleration, and education. In 1695 he advised on the ending of press censorship, and was appointed a member of the Board of Trade (1696-1700). His Essay Concerning Human Understanding gathered pace – drawing controversy and support and earning a translation into French in 1700. Locke died with Lady Damaris reading the Psalms to him. His death, she wrote, “was like his life, truly pious, yet natural, easy and unaffected.” (Aaron)
Locke was initially reluctant to compose political tracts, which he considered, very much like Thomas Hobbes does in his Behemoth, as producing more conflict than men’s swords. Nonetheless, at Christ Church, Oxford, he penned two key essays on the extent of toleration, the most disruptive and contentious issue of the time – the Two Tracts on Government and his lectures on the Law of Nature, the latter written as Censor of Moral Philosophy at Christ Church.
In a century of religious and civil wars, Locke understandably sought to explore the limits to toleration that a state should permit its citizens in their choice and manner of religious expression and worship. Toleration and how men ought to lead their lives are two central themes to Locke’s entire political philosophy, yet it is remarkable, if one approaches his works from the Two Treatises, how politically conservative and accepting he was at Oxford both of the Restoration and Charles’s later Act of Uniformity. The Two Tracts were penned on the occasion of the Restoration of the Monarchy, in which Puritans hoped for continued toleration for their practices and beliefs as they had enjoyed under Cromwell.
Locke’s Two Tracts on Government (1660 and 1662), not published until the 20th Century, form a reply to his fellow student at Christ Church, Edward Bagshaw, who had published and argued for religious authenticity and a rejection of the state’s attempt at religious uniformity, and whose friends and pupils had stolen priests’ surplices in reaction to what they (rightly) perceived as a political shift towards religious uniformity. Bagshaw was a Presbyterian who was in general agreement with Locke’s thesis but who vehemently disagreed with the Anglicanisation of religion that the Act required.
Locke begins with how disruptive the religious “scribblings” of the age have been to his country, pens causing “as much guilt as their swords.” While acknowledging his respect for both authority and liberty, Locke prefers to steer a middle path observing that liberty may “turn loose to the tyranny of a religious rage,” unless its outward form is subjected to the state’s jurisdiction – that is, religious dissent should be subservient to the need to secure the peace, and thus the people ought to accept the religious policy of the presiding regimes.
In forming a Commonwealth, Locke argues, in strong Hobbesian echoes, a man should give up his liberty to the magistrate, “and [entrust] the magistrate with as full a power over all his actions as he himself hath.” Avoiding any discussion of the divine right to rule (which he later takes up in the Two Treatises), Locke claims that the magistrate ought to be the sole judge, even if elected by the people, of ‘matters indifferent’ – i.e., the form and manner in which a people worship. Not only should such matters be given up to the wisdom of the magistrate but the people are also obliged to obey. Christ commanded obedience, he notes, and after all, the magistrate looks to the public welfare, while the individual citizen seeks only his own interest. Implicatively, self-interested pursuit in resolving ‘matters indifferent’ would lead to clashes were they not put in the hands of the magistrate – the ruler.
Yet the ruler’s ability to mould the citizenry is limited to what can be seen, Locke adds. This is an important caveat that develops with an increasing emphasis over his life: a man’s conscience is private, so the magistrate can only influence the obedience of the “outward man.” Immersed in the classics as he was at Oxford, we can note that this is a particularly Roman, prudential consideration of religion which initially caused much harm for Christians: so long as conquered peoples outwardly worshipped the current Roman gods, native religious dispositions and consciences were tolerated – the Christians, however, refused to acquiesce in such ‘matters indifferent’ and many martyrs were created (something the Scottish Covenanters were keen to mimic). Of this and of the recent religious turmoil in his land, Locke is keenly aware – the ruler “cannot cast men’s minds and manners into one mould,” but he is optimistic that the magistrate will use only those powers that are in sympathy with the people and the time in easing them into the same Church. After all, Locke surmises from monastic Oxford, the ruler is supposed to be wise.
In what does more danger lie, Locke rhetorically asks – in the hands of a single, wise man, or an ignorant mob? “From an orderly council or a confused multitude?” The dilemma echoes the Platonic vision of politics and indeed, Locke deploys the perennially popular analogy used by all statists from Plato onwards of the need for a capable captain of the ship (cf. Plato’s Republic, Book VI), which assumes that the citizens are on a single ship and not a flotilla all seeking their own purposes; this collectivist position of assuming we are mariners in desperate need of a swarthy captain, Locke was to alter (but never completely drop) in his Shaftesbury years. But at Oxford, he was quite taken with the metaphor: indeed he notes that such great captains who steer their nations wisely are those “whom the Scriptures calls gods” compared to the multitudinous “beasts”.
The academician Locke highlights his distrust of the masses and prefers to put political control in the hands of a few rather than the many. The multitude is “always craving, never satisfied” and if they are given liberty in religion “where will they stop, where will they themselves bound it …?” It was “a liberty for tender consciences” (using Charles II’s description) that “was the first inlet to all those confusions and unheard of and destructive opinions that overspread this nation” in the Civil Wars. No, mankind is not to be trusted with liberty of religion, Locke urges: “there had been no design so wicked which hath not worn the vizor of religion, nor rebellion not been so kind to itself as to assume the specious name of reformation” that have drawn men into war with promises of liberty and glory. “Hence the cunning and malice of men taken occasion to pervert the doctrine of peace and charity into a perpetual foundation of war and contention.”
Whilst upholding the innate pacifism of Christianity and the horror of wars waged in its name, Locke is of the opinion that permitting men the choice and freedom to worship will create havoc and violence as each sect will take arms to fight those they judge to be offensive “and so in the actions of the greatest cruelty applaud themselves as good Christians.” Hence the magistrate ought to look for the good of society and secure the peace between men.
In the Second Tract, Locke stresses the Christian duty of obedience to the magistrate – invoking implicitly Christ’s ambiguous answer to the Pharisees: “render to Caesar the things that are Caesar’s, and to God the things that are God’s.” But what does a magistrate do? For the early Locke, the ruler’s job is to be responsible for the care of the community – to preserve the public good and keep the people in peace. What the particular policies a magistrate ought to follow depends, Locke admits, on contemporary conventions and expectations, but the magistrate is in the best position to judge in light of the times what ought to be the best policy and what ought to be orderly and decent.
The magistrate symbolises the apex of natural power and order in the world – at least from Locke’s Protestant Oxford perspective. Whether “some are born to rule others” as Aristotle argued, or that men are all born into equality, or monarchs are divinely appointed, Locke, at this point in his intellectual development, offers no conclusion and thereby avoids the foray bubbling all around him. Nonetheless, the Lockean magistrate ought to act without private interest in securing the nation’s peace, and the citizens ought to passively obey him – even if he steps over his constitutional boundaries, for “God wished there to be order, society, and government among men” so “in every commonwealth there must be supreme power.” To that power “God in his great wisdom and beneficence has relinquished [religious rites] to the discretion of the magistrate.” Deferring to the Almighty, “God in his great mercy appointed that Christian doctrine should be embraced by the soul and faith alone and that true worship should be fulfilled in public gatherings and outward actions.”
A more conservative philosopher, accepting of the newly Restored monarchy, one could not imagine from the perspective of the later writer of the Treatises. Yet are there glimmerings of the path Locke eventually takes? Certainly in the realm of private conscience, which Locke emphatically declares cannot be forced. A man has perfect liberty over his conscience (the “liberty of judgement”). If the magistrate commands what has already been divinely commanded, then the citizen is obliged to obey and such laws can not be unjust for they do not bind a man’s conscience or his action. Similarly, legislation passed by a magistrate, “in so far as he is provided with legislative power”, may impose upon the liberty of the will in requiring outward assent and behaviour, but that leaves the conscience free to judge differently. However, if a magistrate seeks to constrain the liberty of judgement, then he sins – but, Locke quickly adds (just before the Act of Uniformity was passed), ecclesiastical rules are not likely to infringe upon people’s right to judge for they deal with ceremonial practice.
Against those who would fear the potential for magisterial abuse and who would allow religious liberty, Locke firstly describes them as the conjuring of “empty heads of these foolish men” and that if religious legislation were taken from the magistrate so too would be other legislation, and those who do not agree with Locke’s conservativism and thereby “take arms” against him will find himself in the “ranks set out above.” In doing so, the Oxford lecturer committed two fallacies – ad hominem (decrying an argument as false because of the person who utters it) and the slippery-slope fallacy (that if one thing were taken from the powers of the state, the state would lose all of its powers).
Yet the blatant contradiction in Locke’s attempt at resolving the political question of his time will fester and become increasingly apparent – if men have to go against their consciences to obey the magistrate, then they turn away from their God; if they disobey the magistrate in pursuit of their consciences, then they revolt against their monarch and the secular system of securing peace in the country. Locke cannot have it both ways and the realm and freedom of men’s consciences eventually win over political allegiance.
Also written at this time were some comments on Infallibility in which Locke outlines an orthodox Protestant attack on Catholicism. Catholic, “sharp-sighted priests have violated both these powers [making and interpreting laws] in their efforts to establish in every way that control over the conduct and consciences of men which they so strongly claim.” Yet such theory constituted the essence of Western political philosophy stretching back to the early centuries after the fall of Rome and the awkward relationship between the powers of the Church and the State. The Puritans of several sects logically rejected governmental or institutional interference in belief and their beliefs eventually forged the principle of absolute toleration in religious matters to which Locke was later to give his agreement and philosophical defence; but even in this very conservative phase, Locke’s non-conformist Protestant and Puritan upbringing is evident: interpretation should be left to the individual’s reading of the infallible Scriptures, not the alleged infallible interpretations of the priests. This would of course imply a rejection of any Act of Uniformity – of the imposition of Anglicanism and its Book of Common Prayer on the people. Nonetheless, Locke recoils, obedience is always the “safe and secure” path for the Christian congregation, for “the shepherds of the church can perhaps err while they are leading, but the sheep certainly cannot err while they are following.”
In his Essays or lectures to students as Censor, teacher of Moral Philosophy at Christ Church, Locke argues that there is a Law of Nature – a basic system of morals – which is given to every man to know. The Essays were unpublished but circulated and had an influence on writers such as James Tyrell (1642-1718). His argument begins with an acceptance of God’s existence (“there will be no one to deny the existence of God” – and certainly not at Oxford, when subscribing to the Christian faith and the eventual taking of Holy Orders for tutors was a necessary condition of being admitted). The law, he adds, is something which is the decree of a superior will (God), and lays down what is to be done and not to be done, and which is binding on all men.
The moral law for Locke demands that some things are completely forbidden (theft, murder), others depend on certain sentiments, periodic duties, or conditional attitudes. These are binding on all equally, and despite the apparent relativism of morality, “no nation or human being is so removed from all humanity, so savage and so beyond the law, that it is not held by these bonds of law.” The moral law is a fixed and permanent set of morals, for “what is proper now for the rational nature [of man] … must needs be proper for ever, and the same reason will pronounce everywhere the same moral rules.” It is man’s nature that binds him to a universally binding moral law, which he cannot alter, despite his laziness and disposition to be led by others and follow the multitude or give into his passions.
Against the objection that the Law of Nature cannot be found, because not all people who possess reason have knowledge of it or that they will disagree over its content, Locke counters that possessing the faculty of reason does not necessitate its use. Some prefer living in ignorance, while others may be too dull, or are slaves to their passions to raise their intellect to what is required of them to understand the Natural Law, and others still are brought up amidst such evil that they become accustomed to it. Secondly, disagreement – what we now term moral relativism – does not indicate a lack of a law, but rather its existence.
In another glimmering of the development of Locke’s political and general philosophical thought, he examines the methods by which a man can know moral laws. (The theory of how we know things becomes a life-long quest for Locke, culminating in his Essay Concerning Human Understanding). It is obvious that the nature of the world is governed by laws and so too is man’s conduct, and that without moral laws, men would not have society; without moral law, trust between men would collapse. We can know moral laws through four different methods: inscription, tradition, sense experience, or divine revelation. Ignoring the last, Locke also rejects both inscription and tradition (which were both connected to Roman Catholic theology) in favour of learning morality with our senses and reason.
Following René Descartes’s methodology, which had turned him onto philosophy, Locke argues that sense experience proclaims the existence of a supreme law maker, a wise creator or the world, which has made man for a purpose. Man thus has purposes – to contemplate and to procure and preserve his life. Yet the moral law cannot be garnered from consent – from mass or democratic agreement, for the voice of the people is as likely to lead to fallacies and evil. Men’s actual morality may be highly relative, but differences do not undermine the existence of commonalties in the law, hence we should not obey (or follow) others blindly. Nonetheless, the conservative Locke continues to argue that we ought to obey our lawmakers as possessing rightful power over creation, but our obedience should not just be out of fear for the lawmaker’s power, but conscientiously too: we ought to obey it because the magistrate should request morally right action.
Yet there is detectable in Locke’s essay a growing suspicion of government. In conjecturing that a good policy is one that can be obey both without fear or without conscientious qualms, Locke is possibly indicating that the magistrate also has the responsibility not to provoke a rebellion of conscience in the people, words that may reflect the growing sense of concern that the Act of Uniformity engendered. There also creeps into his theorising a growing realisation of the limits to power’s use and the good it putatively brings about: the lawmaker possesses the right to impose his will on dissidents, but Locke advises that that power should be used only as a last resort.
In an interesting passage, wherein we can detect Locke’s philosophical abilities maturing, he discusses whether the Law of Nature can be said to be based on man’s self-interest. He rejects the Ancient Greek Carneades’ theory that all men act in the own interest, while he accepts the role that self-interest plays in the Law of Nature, “for the strongest protection of each man’s private property is the Law of Nature, without the observance of which it is impossible for anybody to be master of his own property and to pursue his own advantage.” Yet this is not quite anticipating Adam Smith’s theory of private profit leading to public advantage (Wealth of Nations, 1776), for Locke later accepts Montesquieu’s mercantilist (and ultimately Aristotelian) theory that one man’s gain is another’s loss; but what is of importance here is something we read of later in Hume’s criticism of self-interested pursuits. Some actions we deem moral, Locke remarks, can be personally costly – such as generosity and friendship, and while private profit may enrich some at the expense of others, “justice in one does not take equity away in another.” Similarly, if all were to pursue their own interest, that would imply that the individual would judge his own affairs and that can only lead to chaos, fraud, violence, and hatred.
After rejecting self-interest as a justification of natural law, Locke proceeds to reject the argument that utility forms the basis of the moral law. (It is always useful to know that what are often portrayed as 20th Century debates on, say, utilitarianism versus deontology, have a long philosophical pedigree). For Locke, it is not seeking to do good that produces morality, for whatever good does occur arises from the moral law: “utility is not the basis of the law or the ground of obligation, but the consequence of obedience to it.” (This is the position that Immanuel Kant (1724-1804) later espouses in his strict application of duty ethics.)
Interestingly, Locke adds that the moral law “neither supposes nor allows men to be inflamed with hatred for one another and to be divided into hostile states.” On the one hand, this belief may be considered as a theoretical attack on Hobbes’s description of the state of nature – that it is characterised by a war of all against all, yet that would be rather misplaced, for even in the state of nature, Hobbes’s musings are in agreement with Locke that natural laws (common ethical codes) apply to human interaction. On the other hand, it may be a philosopher’s warning to his government and the fanatics of the various religions and sects who were seeking to impose their vision and will on others.
The Two Tracts and the Essay are not political classics in the sense that political theorists, whose speciality is not the 17th Century, readily turn to them. But they contain philosophical elements and beliefs that Locke was to work on and develop – especially the role and limits to government, conscientious objection to the misuse of power, and religious freedom; although he was to dramatically alter his
On leaving the cloistered walls of Oxford to employment in Lord Ashley’s household, we detect a shift in Locke’s political thinking, away from the acceptance of the magistrate’s philosopher-king status towards Locke supposing him a man capable of erring like any other man. Indeed, Locke’s thought increasingly moves over the next few years from upholding passive obedience – and thus one’s station in life – to justifying rebellion when the magistrate oversteps certain boundaries, and in his Essay on Toleration we mark that change.
Locke is now concerned about the extremes of absolute obedience and absolute liberty in matters of conscience, a change in Locke’s priorities towards outlining the conditions under which a man ought to possess religious freedom and the limits – moral and prudential – of the magistrate’s powers. The Essay gives a better indication of the direction that Locke’s arguments take in the Two Treatises.
What is the purpose of government? It is to be used for the good, preservation, and the peace of men. If men could live peacefully, there would be no need for a magistrate, but patently the Seventeenth Century was strewn with war and its effects, and the thought of permitting a generally peaceful, anarchic state of nature was still too absurd for Locke to contemplate, so he dismisses it out of hand. He then deals strongly with those who would argue for a monarchy based on a divine right to rule, presaging the critique of the Two Treatises. Supporters of the divine right “have forgotten what country they are born in”, he writes.
In marked contrast to his Oxford phase, Locke now argues that in forming a government, “it cannot be supposed the people should give any one or more of their fellow men an authority over them for any other purpose than their own preservation, or extend the limits of their jurisdiction beyond the limits of this life.” This is indeed a shift from his Platonic vision of the goodly rational captain steering the ship! The magistrate ought to meddle with nothing but securing the peace. (In Scotland at this time, recall that the Covenanters were being put down for their rejection of Uniformity.) Yet we are still far from a libertarian thesis on a restricted government, for in outlining his principles of toleration, strict rules apply as to whom may be admitted into the tolerant club – Catholics and atheists need not apply. Within a broadly, pluralist Protestant nation though, toleration on ‘matters indifferent’ ought now to be practised by the magistrate on a scale relating to their epistemological status.
In matters speculative and divine worship a man ought to possess absolute liberty, for these are based on his subjective understanding of the nature of the universe and of God. In such areas of thought, no man may force his opinion on others – excepting atheists, for the are like ‘wild beasts’. In so arguing, Locke again adheres to a very Protestant (Puritan) theory of conscience and the individual’s relationship to God. Whereas the Catholic Church emphasises the role of priests and the theological hierarchy in reaching up to God, the Protestant reformers of the Church proclaimed the individual’s right to seek God by his own path, and Locke, following the Cambridge Platonists, emphasised the role of reason in understanding the relationship between man qua individual and God.
Toleration of others’ religious and speculative thinking is also politically prudential – so much misery had been generated by the state or various sects seeking to impose their will on others, and such antagonists are rarely motivated by religion than “depraved, ambitious human nature.” Thus, with regards to “matters indifferent”, Locke still insists that the government must look at their application to the nation’s peace and security, and may prohibit publications that tend to “the disturbance of government.” Toleration does not imply freedom of expression. Yet even here, since no man may be forced to alter his opinion, the citizens should obey the magistrate’s prescriptions and accept the state’s legislation as their consciences see fit “as far without violence they can.” In other words, if the state imposes forms of behaviour that a sect finds particularly offensive, it ought, for the peace and security of the nation as a whole, accept the laws (and not disrupt the peace in an “obstinate pursuit or flight”) leaving people’s consciences free to speculate as they see fit – in other words, they must give God and Caesar both their due. Some opinions must not be tolerated, if their natural tendency is absolutely destructive to society – so “faith may be broken with heretics.”
The third area that the magistrate may be concerned in involves the general moral virtues and vices of society. Interestingly, although these barely relate to acts of conscience, the state should not interfere here, for the magistrate has “nothing to do with the good of men’s souls.” This is a powerful departure from his previous stance as Censor and perhaps may be read as reflecting the licentiousness of Charles’s Court (which he surely must have known about from Ashley) and Locke’s acceptance of a distinction between tolerating private vices but not public ones. Nonetheless, the state may intervene in men’s affairs when their opinions are likely to be destructive of the society that harbours them – hence, for Locke, Catholicism is not to be tolerated. In other words, those who argue for theocracy ought to be restricted in their speech. The reason for this – and a mature political one – is that most men use power for their own advancement and those who are intolerant of others should in turn not be tolerated – such groups are not to be trusted with any path that may lead them to power and the overthrow of the liberties of others. Catholics in particular, when in power tend to “think themselves bound to deny it to others.” They ought to be handled “severely” Locke proposes.
Similarly, factions ought not to be tolerated if their numbers grow to threaten the state. Nevertheless, Locke is adamant that any attempt to use force to get others to change their opinions should be fully rejected as “the worst, the last to be used, and with the greatest caution.” Indeed, caution and prudence should be the watchwords of Locke’s theoretical government at this point in his thinking. Toleration of the various Protestant sects is the “readiest way to secure the safety and peace, and promote [public] welfare” and Protestant fanatics ought to be tolerated to be made useful and of assistance to the government rather than driving them into secrecy and unity through persecution. Again, Locke emphasises that “there is scarce an instance to be found of any opinion driven out of the world by persecution” which can be taken as a word of warning to the present government persecuting Covenanters and others. The option is to accept and tolerate such diverse Protestant fanatics – or kill them all; but the latter is not very Christian, Locke reminds his readers.
In 1669-70 Locke commented on Samuel Parker’s Discourse of Ecclesiastical Party (1669), which attacked Nonconformists or Dissenters. Shaftesbury sought a policy of toleration against the Anglican policy to unify the Kingdom under its brand of Protestantism. (The Anglican Church or Church of England was created by Henry VIII’s split from Rome – he became both head of state and head of the church, and the ruling monarch remains head of both state and church in England today. The Church of England, as its name suggests is a particular nationalist brand of Protestantism in which Bishops sit with Lords in the Upper Chamber of Parliament). Locke’s comments are worth noting for evidence of a further swing away from political conservativism adhering to establishment structures to a radicalism that seeks their containment in favour of inalienable individual rights. He now insists that government’s purpose is to secure the peace and not to get involved with the outward appearances of different interpretations of religion – he questions whether the policy of uniformity is conducive of peace (OSP); and here Locke presents a theory that he was to embellish on over the next decade in his denial that government can be said to stem from Adam’s descendants. This the theory Locke criticises of Sir Robert Filmer in the Two Treatises: if Adam was the first king, it is not the case that his descendants automatically gain the same right – “all government, monarchical or other, is only from the consent of the people.” (OSP)
Locke repeats the purpose of government of securing the peace and tranquillity of the commonwealth and stresses the separation of the Church and State in what can be seen as the glimmerings of his minimal state theory. “The end of civil society is civil peace and prosperity … but beyond the concernments of this life [i.e., religion], this society hath nothing to do at all.” (CEP) Since religion deals with the hereafter and the state the present, and the two jurisdictions should not mix.
Thus prior to the change of wind in the Two Treatises, Locke’s conservative, moral authoritarian philosophy is highly apparent in various comments throughout the 1670s and 80s. In Obligation of Penal Laws, for example, Locke scepticism of the government’s misuse of power is growing, but he still insists that the subject’s duty is to preserve a peaceful society and not to disturb or endanger his government and that, so long as a man’s conscience is free from political interference, he ought to obey the rules of his country. This, incidentally, is symptomatic of a mind-body dualism (as it affects the political realm), in which a philosopher asserts the primacy and hence freedom of the mind while accepting the subjugation of the body, a dichotomy that Locke only gradually moves away from.
By 1676, for instance, we again see evidence of a change in his thinking towards Protestant dissenters (Catholics standing outwith the Lockean picture). In his second essay on Toleration (Tb) in the year he expands on his critique of uniformity. He demands what a policy ought to be if all dissenters are in error – should they be all hanged? But if there is a fear of them is it because of the manner in which they are treated by the authorities, or if there is a fear that they may influence other people, then why not let others choose by their own consent to follow or not, or if it is feared that supporters of dissenting doctrines shall multiply, then either dissenters are attracting others because of the truth or orthodox teachers have become slack in propagating the truth. Since Christians are likely to fight over their sectarian differences, “to settle the peace of places where there are different opinions in religion, two things are to be perfectly distinguished: religion and government … and their provinces [ought] to be kept well distinct.” That is, the Church and the State should be kept thoroughly separate.
Yet Locke’s political rationalism – his disposition to impose a particular, ideal moral order on his nation – remains strong. In notes for his Atlantis (1676-79), he proposes stringent laws to deal with vagrants, demands that everyone work at their handicraft at least six hours a week, that limits be put on migration across parishes, and that tithingmen be put in control of assuring the moral purity of their jurisdiction (one tithingman to twenty homes). Each month the tithingman even ought to visit the houses of his tithing “to see what lives they lead.” (At). Public almshouses ought to be erected for those incapable of working, otherwise “all beggars shall ipso facto be taken and sent to the public workhouse and there remain for the rest of their lives.” (At).
Between 1677 and 1678 Locke scribbled thoughts on the springs of human action. “Happiness and misery are the two great springs,” he notes, but happiness in misery are both resoluble into pleasure and pain. Accordingly, Locke argues for a hedonistic, utilitarian basis for morality – a different direction from his earlier Oxford essays, but tempers the thrust of hedonism noting the importance that reputation plays in a man’s life, also calling reputation “the principle spring from which the actions of men take their rise …” (R) and were there no human laws – no positive legislation – “there’d still be such species of actions as justice, temperance and fortitude…” (R) for the laws of morality come from God and from nature.
Thus prior to the penning of the Two Treatises, we find a John Locke who is becoming increasingly concerned with the direction of Restoration policy with regards to religious toleration, and although he remains very conservative in his moral outlook, the formulation of a new approach is evidently developing. The government, he declares with a stronger and more influential voice, ought to remove itself from the religious matters of the nation. The separation of the state and religion is now paramount in his philosophy, all it needed was a structure within which such a minimal, non-interfering government could be justified. That was prompted by the publication of the late Sir Robert Filmer’s Patriarcha – a defence of divinely appointed and justified monarchy and absolutism.
In the 1670s under Shaftesbury’s patronage, Locke expounded a mercantilist philosophy of trade and a hard-money policy.
The mercantilist Locke argues that the end of trade is “riches and power” – and trade increases a nation’s wealth and its people, producing a virtuous circle of economic improvement; yet, like most mercantilists, he condemns activity that are not conducive to economic growth – a theory that has seeped into present day tax codes and economic policy, although the characters targeted tend to change. For Locke anyone involved in the service industry hinders trade: retailers to some degree, lawyers, “but above all soldiers in pay.” The economic theory is suspicious, as is Locke’s assertion that one man’s gain is another man’s loss – an Aristotelian view of trade that has yet to be shaken from present day conceptions and which mercantilists support.
However, Locke also favoured a hard money policy to secure the value of a nation’s currency. It would be wrong to debase the coinage to match the number of notes that the Bank of England printed.
Some detect in Locke a ‘labour theory of value’ – the proposition that all economic values can be resolved into the amount and quality of labour imbued in them. Marxists, for example, assume Locke to have proposed a labour theory of value, whereas the libertarian economist, Murray Rothbard, argues that what Locke propounded was a labour theory of property, not of value. The sections to read are in Chapter V, and a close reading of the text suggests that Locke’s emphasis on the ability of labour to create value qua production, rather than value qua price. For elsewhere, Locke observes that the fair price (a term that has wended down through the ages from Aristotle) is that which is generated in a market on a particular occasion, tempered by notions of Christian charity to avoid gaining excess profits (leaving enough for others, as Locke advises for the enclosure of land). Labour – active productive labour, based on rationality and productivity – increases the wealth of the nation, it does not generate a system of fair prices.
There is a scholarly debate on when the Two Treatises were written. They were first published in 1689, but when they were penned is of critical importance; originally the Two Treatises were deemed an apology – a defence – for the Glorious Revolution, but Peter Laslett claims its origins back to 1679, while Richard Ashcroft disagrees and places it in 1680-82, allowing Locke to make amendments to the manuscript to give the impression it acts as an apology for rather than a prescription of revolt; for readers interested in knowing more, I refer them to Laslett’s 1988 Cambridge Edition of the Two Treatises.
In opening the Two Treatises, diligence and perseverance pay off for the reader – and on a pedagogical note, I would recommend (following Laslett) beginning with the Second before the First Treatise. The reader ought to work through each chapter carefully, noting the main point or points in each section (denoted §) to follow Locke’s relatively convoluted sentences in pursuit of the main clause like Sherlock Holmes on a case, and revising what notes have been reaped before pressing on. Locke’s system is brilliant, and so we must read him, for hidden in the well-crafted arguments, we also find gems of thoughts and insights.
The First Treatise is a logical rebuttal of the works of Sir Robert Filmer whose Patriarcha and other writings supported the theory of the divine rights of kings – that is, monarchy is a divine established institution and that kings rule as God’s regents on earth. The First Treatise paves the way, as Locke advertises in his Preface, to justify government by the consent of the people. In this summary, I am not concerned with a scholastic checking of the validity of Locke’s examination of Filmer’s work (or of Locke’s own selective reading of the Bible – see Cox) but with summarising the essential points he presents.
Locke summarises Filmer’s theory that all government is [or ought to be] an absolute monarchy: since Adam was an absolute monarch, all princes since his time should also be absolute monarchs. Secondly, since Filmer believes that no man is born free, men cannot [or should not be able to] choose their governors, thus government by consent is to be rejected on the epistemological grounds that the masses do not possess the intellectual wherewithal to elect their leaders.
“Slavery is so vile and miserable an Estate of Man,” begins the overture of Locke’s critique of Filmer’s system (§1). But a description of affairs under absolute monarchy does not in itself provide a justification of establishing government on popular consent, nor does the presumption that men would live in a miserable condition rebut the claim for absolutism. Accordingly, Locke proceeds to examine carefully Filmer’s assumptions and the logical cohesion of his arguments to refute the theory of divine rule before outlining, in the Second Treatise, his justification of consensual government (see below). Locke’s analysis of Filmer proceeds by drawing upon the essential assumptions or premises which Filmer presents.
Filmer firstly (as we read Locke’s critique) claims that man is not born into freedom, because he is born to parents – and the right that the father naturally possesses is unlimited over the child’s life. However, Locke replies, Filmer does not give an account of this fatherly power – that is, Filmer assumes the father ought to possess unlimited power without providing a justification of that power, and since, according to Locke, Filmer’s assertion implies that humanity should be enslaved to a single ruler, it behoves his opponent to offer a justification. Nonetheless, as the First Treatise continues, Filmer is seen to have provided a justification, for Locke has to provide several arguments against Filmer’s attempts to provide a secure theoretical basis for patriarchy.
Filmer secondly proposes that to assert man’s freedom is equivalent to denying the Biblical story of man’s assertion, a claim that Locke swiftly shows to be logically fallacious. Questioning the validity of the former does not imply a concurrent questioning of the latter.
Moreover, Locke demands why the fact of Adam’s creation should give him sovereignty over anything – that has to be established and not presumed. Locke thus queries Filmer’s conception of sovereignty: as first man and possessing no subjects, he could hardly be called a monarch. He is “a governor in habit rather than in act,” Filmer contends, to which Locke humorously replies: “A very pretty way of being a Governor without Government, a Father without Children, and a King without Subjects. And thus Sir Robert was an Author before he writ his Book …” (§18). In other words, potentiality does not imply actuality.
Locke presses the point – whence does Adam receive his power over others? By becoming a father, Filmer (thirdly) argues (and thereby provides a justification for his patriarchy). Locke reminds his readers that Filmer passes over the role of the mother in producing children and that in quoting from the Bible, Filmer drops any references to the mother: ‘honour thy father and thy mother’ becomes just ‘honour thy father’. Nonetheless, if Adam’s power comes from begetting children and becoming a father, then without children he was surely powerless, Locke concludes.
Perhaps Adam’s title, as understood by Filmer, was over the resources of the earth, that is, Adam was a proprietor rather than a monarch. No, Locke writes, quoting from the Scriptures, for God gave the earth to ‘them’, in other words to mankind as a whole and not to one particular individual. Nevertheless, Locke asks, even if Adam were given title over the earth’s resources, how does that give him political power over others’ lives?
Filmer fourthly attempts to justify patriarchy by claiming that Eve was created to be subject to her husband, and thus forms the ‘Original Grant of Government’ whereas Locke retorts that a distinction must be made between her role as a wife and that of Adam’s power over her life, or that of any other. Firstly, Locke replies, since Adam sinned with Eve in the Garden of Eden, this hardly gives him a moral standing to rule others, and secondly, how does Eve’s matrimonial subjection to Adam entitle him to head a monarchical government? The two are separable issues, and Filmer, Locke notes, often deploys linguistic ambiguities in his terms to assert his theory without actually justifying it. Thirdly, if a man gains monarchical power by possessing a wife, then surely, Locke concludes, according to Filmer’s position there should be as many monarchs as there are husbands.
Filmer’s fifth attempt to claim Adam’s royal authority is based on the subjection of his children and this power should be supreme. This time, Filmer presents a justification: since the father gives life and being to a child he therefore possesses absolute power over him. Yet, Locke counters, firstly: if you give something to another, that does not mean that you have a right to take it back; secondly, Filmer ignores that life is given to us all by God, and adds that we know so little as to what produces a soul or breathes life into an entity that assuming it to be wholly the father is presumptuous; indeed and thirdly, what role in begetting a child does a man have except “the satisfying his present Appetite”? (§54) Fourthly, Locke notes the obvious and greater role a woman plays in producing a child. All these counterarguments undermine Filmer’s emphasis on male dominion and take Locke into very liberal territory (contemporarily speaking) of raising woman’s status, a view more consistent with the Puritans than Anglicans.
Filmer’s defence of his fifth point, as Locke reads him, is that the Ancients had absolute rights over their children, and Locke rightly rejoins that that does not mean present generations ought to – after all, the Ancients also practised incest, adultery, and sodomy, (§59), and presumably Filmer would not wish those to be re-established.
A parent may, arguably, alienate his rights over a child, Locke notes, but a child cannot alienate the honour due to his parent, an argument Filmer ignores. More pointedly, if a father possesses absolute rights over his children and that gives him political dominion too, then surely, echoing the logic of Chapter V, Locke complains that Filmer’s theory would all as many monarchs as there are fathers. Such political plurality would destroy all lawful governments in the world, which would contradict Filmer’s attempt to justify a stable political regime.
Switching to discuss the role of property in Filmer’s theory; if we allow Adam’s entitlement to the earth’s resources and that he wills it upon his eldest son, this does not necessarily mean that Adam’s power is also willed to the eldest son. The eldest son, Locke reasons, did not beget his brethren, and accordingly cannot be said to inherit his father’s power over them. Accordingly, power over resources and political power are distinguishable and should be treated as separate issues.
Locke discovers that Filmer accepts that governmental power may be passed on by succession, grant, usurpation, and election, and that Filmer accepts that “it matters not by what Means [a king] came by it.” Filmer’s theory is thus full of contradiction, Locke contends. Although he would apparently discard Filmer’s theory at this point, Locke continues his logical critique of patriarchy.
If we are to have one ruler, we should know who that person is otherwise there would be no distinction between pirates and princes. How successful is Filmer in describing this? Filmer claims that Adam’s power did not end in him but was passed onto succeeding generations and that secondly, present princes and rulers are direct descendants of that power. If Filmer’s first argument fails, that is not too problematic, Locke notes, for another theory of government may be expounded; but if the second fails, that would “destroy the Authority of the present Governors, and absolve the People from Subjection to them.” (§83). It must therefore be shown how Adam’s power is passed on, otherwise we must assume his power died with him and was passed back to God: in other words, we must look to the origins of government (Locke thus sets the reader up for the Second Treatise) – if the formation of government was consensual, then that must also direct its descent [although why that must be the case is not established], or it was by divine donation then God must also give it to the successor, rather than presuming it passes to the eldest male. But certainly, power cannot be derived from the act of begetting, for the eldest did not beget his younger siblings nor could he inherit his father’s rights over his mother. Paternal power can not therefore be inherited and the power that is now in the world is not Adam’s. (§103).
Although power cannot be passed onto children, Locke also rejects the passing of property solely to the eldest – it must pass equally to all of his children as God gave the earth in common to all, but once a man has formed a property right over something, it is a law of nature that his property be passed on to his children: children have a title to share in the property of their parents, and for Locke, that entitlement is equal (§93). Locke’s rejection of primogeniture is also of interest here and reminds the reader of his unorthodox stance on several issues.
Incidentally, in this Chapter Locke outlines his own theory to act as a foil to Filmer’s attempted justification of patriarchy and primogeniture. God planted in man the drive to preserve himself; He made the earth’s resources available to him and directed man to use his reason and senses to exploit the earth and its creatures for his benefit, and government is established to preserve a man’s property from the violence of others.
Filmer claims that wherever there is a multitude of people, there will be one who is the heir to Adam’s monarchical power. This implies, counters Locke, that there will be one king who presently rules over all the kings in power, which means that either this right of being Adam’s political descendant is not necessary to justify the power presently held by rulers, or that they are all unlawfully in power, and accordingly, the multitude has no need to conscientiously obey their governments – a conclusion that Filmer would surely wish to avoid, as well as one that Locke implies is unacceptable to his own theory of government.
So who should be the heir, Locke asks, if we continue with Filmer’s exposition and accept that Adam’s power descended from him? After all, we are not questioning whether there ought to be government (Power) but who should be in power (§106). Filmer claims sovereignty to pass through Adam’s lineage – but who is not of that lineage, Locke asks. If it is the eldest son, Scriptural evidence contradicts Filmer’s theory, and what happens if there is not a son, or that son is a fool? With such a convoluted theory, surely God would have given us indications as to his meaning, after all, Locke adds, Scripture tells us whom we can and cannot marry.
Filmer offers several descriptions of Biblical characters possessing power, but Locke disallows them all. Firstly, Filmer says evidence of patriarchy is that the ruler possessed the power of death over people – to which Locke replies, anyone may have that power. Secondly, the ruler possessed the power to raise and army and to make war – to which Locke replies, as can any commonwealth, or indeed, any individual can also possess that power, implying that the power to wage war is independent of sovereignty and is merely attached to the ability to raise an army. And if power can be gained by attacking and conquering others, then Filmer’s attempt at securing sovereignty through the line of Adam fails. Nonetheless, Locke argues that contrary to patriarchal forms of government, God’s chosen people were often leaderless and lived in commonwealths – and what, he asks, happened to their form of government when they suffered centuries of bondage? Where was the rightful heir to Adam’s power during that period? Looking over the judges that were raised to power, whom Locke sees as being consensually appointed, he finds childless men and one woman – continuing evidence against Filmer’s assertion that power descended linearly through Adam’s descendants.
The rejection of the divine right theory of monarchy and of absolutism now complete, Locke turns his attention to outlining and justifying his own conception of government and the rights of citizens. It is one of the greatest texts in political philosophy and deserves a close reading.
Locke now sets out his own theory of political power in which he will look at the power of the magistrate as distinct from the power a parent wields over children or employers over employees (“a Master over his Servant”) or conjugal power (“a Husband over his Wife”). He defines political power as the power of making laws and executing penalties, the preservation of property, and of employing the force of the community in executing the laws and defending the commonwealth from foreign attack. Power, he stresses, must only be used for the public good.
Locke outlines his theoretical construction of the state of nature. Given God gave the earth to all of mankind, Locke envisages the state of nature as a state of perfect equality in which each person has the freedom to do as he sees fit without asking leave or depending on the will of any other man. Reason teaches man not to harm his neighbour or his liberty or possessions, but also that he is right to punish those who transgress against him. “The State of Nature has a Law of Nature to govern it, which obliges everyone”, and “there cannot be supposed any such Subordination among us, that may Authorize us to destroy one another.” (§6). Indeed, aggressors – those who violate the freedom of others – live life by another (implicatively unnatural) standard, one that is irrational and thus dangerous. If a man is attacked by another, he is fully justified in punishing the offender and being the “Executioner of the Law of Nature” (§8) to kill murderers and seek reparation from thieves. It is better for a man to judge his own case than to have “one Man commanding a multitude, has the Liberty to be Judge in his own Case, and may do to al his Subjects whatever he pleases” (§13). So far has Locke moved away from his conservative Oxford days of erring on the side of magistrates.
The state of nature is not just a theoretical conception, for wherever there is a lack of government or arbitrating institutions between men or nations, the state of nature presides. “For ’tis not every Compact that puts an end to the State of Nature between men.” (§14).
Whenever a man “declaring by Word or Action, not a passionate and hasty, but a sedate settled Design upon another Mans life, [he puts] him a State of War.” That is, the breach of peace is the declaration of war, and accordingly a man has the natural right to defend himself against aggressors who renounce reason and who live like predators. Where there is no common power, any use of force takes man back to the state of nature and this continues until a common magistrate is set up; but where proper government is lacking, a man’s actions are to be judged by his conscience alone. But the state of nature is distinguishable from the state of war, a dissimilarity Locke criticises followers of Thomas Hobbes for not making. The state of nature is governed by peace, goodwill, preservation, and mutual assistance, whereas the state of war is a condition of enmity, malice, violence, and mutual destruction.
To avoid the costs (the “inconveniences”) associated with the state of nature – of being without a common power to ensure the rule of law and order – men are disposed to join a society.
Locke presents his rejection of slavery: man’s liberty in society is to be under no other legislative power but that established by consent and under no other will or power but what the legislative enacts according to the trust put in it. Slavery is defined as being under absolute, arbitrary, and despotic power, and, we may recall from Chapter I of the First Treatise, it is the most miserable condition of man – yet it is not wholly unjustifiable in Locke’s system; if a man aggresses against another, he loses all rights in the just war fought against his aggression, and thus may he be rightly enslaved. (Incidentally, Locke deemed the West Africans enslaved by the Royal Africa Company to have been taken prisoners in a just war against them, thus defending, if somewhat naively, colonial slavery).
Locke rebuffs the argument that a man can enslave himself to another, because, ultimately, he may take his own life and by so regaining his freedom thus deprives the slave master of his power. This puts a terminal limit on a master’s power over his charges. Freedom, Locke notes in passing, is not something to do as one pleases, as Sir Robert Filmer [and many since] would describe it in order to reject it (that is, a straw man fallacy).
With regards to property, Locke recalls his earlier argument that the earth is initially given to all in common, but most importantly for Lockean political theory he argues that “every man has a Property in his own Person.” (§27). Therefore, when he moves away from the state of nature, whatever he mixes his labour with becomes his property, with the proviso that “at least where there is enough, and as good left in common for others.” (§27). Although God gave the earth in common, He did not mean it to remain in common and uncultivated, for “He gave it to the use of the Industrious and Rational.” (§34). The expansion of private property also increases the net yield to the commonwealth (that is, causes economic growth – something Adam Smith was to later develop). Private property also clarifies resource ownership and thus removes areas of contention.
When a man mixes his labour with anything and by drawing it into his private ownership, he makes it more valuable. The benefits of private ownership can be readily compared to those nations in which few people reside upon commonly owned tracts. Ownership gives a man an entitlement to do with his resources as he pleases, although in this chapter, Locke is ready to remind his readers of the duty they bear to others, for those who waste their (non-durable) resources “rob others” of the benefits they could have produced for the community; but apart from that, a man may acquire wealth justly.
In discussing paternal power, Locke proclaims that children are under their parents’ rule until maturity, but, in comparison with Filmer, who claimed that no men can be free because of the subjection to their parents, Locke asserts that the development of a man’s reason frees him from their protection. To turn children out of the home before their reason has developed sufficiently is to throw them out amongst the beasts and into a wretched state. Once they are mature enough, children have the ability and hence the right to choose what society they wish to belong to; accordingly, Locke emphasises that parental power should not be confused with political power.
God drives men into society, Locke notes, deploying the traditional Aristotelian thesis that society stems from sexual desire, reproduction, and then employment (that is, man and woman come together, they reproduce, and employ servants – and gain slaves captured in just wars), a thesis that was repeated throughout the ages but more recently, in Locke’s time, being advanced by, for example, by Hugo Grotius and Pufendorf. Incidentally, Locke notes that a wife has a right to leave her husband (§82).
The society that develops from conjugal and kinship origins tends to posses commonly established laws and a judicature, as well as an adjudicating authority. All men are equal before the law, including those passing legislation. The created commonwealth then possesses the power, a power delegated to it by the citizens, to punish transgressors and external aggressors and to protect the property of its members. In removing themselves from the state of nature, men hand over the power to punish to the executive; but where the process of appeal is lacking, men remain – or at least their social relations remain – in the state of nature. When their property is not safe, then people cannot think themselves as being in a civil society.
The move towards a civil, law-abiding society, also shows why absolute monarchy is inconsistent with that society: “to think that Men are so foolish that they take care to avoid what mischiefs may be done them by Pole-Cats, or Foxes, but are content, nay think it Safety, to be devoured by Lions.” (The lion being the traditional symbol of kingship).
This chapter continues with the origins of political society. Community begins with consent, Locke argues, and this consent can only be majority consent, as universal consent is impossible to gain. Consent of the governed is the only justifiable form of government, but of course critics are going to ask for evidence for consensual government. Locke replies that the lack of evidence does not imply that early governments were not formed consensually, but because people were initially equal in the state of nature, it can be deduced that they consented to put rulers over and above them.
Indeed, Locke accepts that people historically converged onto monarchical forms of government, for he agrees that it would make sense to put political power into the hands of those they trusted or who were capable of ensuring the rule of peace; certainly such a government would reflect the natural disposition to look up to a male patriarch, but Locke is not bowing down to Filmer’s theoretical proposition that all government should be monarchical. Any power given to the government was given to secure the public good and safety and the defence of immature societies from external aggression, but once the legislators or executors of the law sought to use power for their own interests then it becomes vital for men to understand the origins of government and the limitations to its power, so that they may find methods to prevent such abuses of power.
A people are free to remove themselves from their government – that is, they are free to secede and to establish a new commonwealth if they see fit, for only an explicit promise or contract can put man into a society and, just as children upon reaching maturity are free to leave their parents, so too are men free to leave their society.
Locke raises the question as to why a man may give up his freedom that he enjoys in the state of nature. He answers because that state is full of uncertainty and it is also exposed to aggression. The state of nature lacks established, known and settled laws, a known and indifferent judge, and the power to give a judge execution of the law. In the state of nature man has two powers – to preserve himself according to the Law of Nature and the power to punish criminals. In such a free state, all men are of one community making up a society distinct from the animals. “And were it not for the corruption, and vitiousness of degenerate Men, there would be no need of any other; no necessity that Men should separate from this great and natural Community, and by positive agreements combine into smaller and divided associations.” (§128) In other words, the few who seek to predate and to live by force, prompt people to form polities.
In joining a society, man gives up his power to protect himself to the laws of his society; he also gives up the power of punishing aggressors, and they do this “only with an intention in every one the better to preserve himself his Liberty and Property.” (§131). It could not be supposed that we would join a society to be made worse off.
What form a government takes depends on where the supreme (legislative) power is located.
Legislative power is supreme but it ought not to be absolute or arbitrary. What power it should wield is limited to the powers that man possessed in the state of nature which should also be limited to serving the public good. It “can never have a right to destroy, enslave, or designedly impoverish the subjects.” (§135) Its laws must thus conform to the laws of nature and any use of arbitrary or absolute power, or indeed, operating without settled law, creates a situation worse than the state of nature. “For then Mankind will be in a far worse condition, than in the State of Nature, if they shall have armed one or a few Men with the joynt power of a Multitude. (§137).
The government cannot take a man’s property without his consent, and since governments need to raise taxes to finance themselves, they can only do so with the consent of the governed. “Hence it is a mistake to think, that the Supream or Legislative Power of any Commonwealth, can do what it will, and dispose of the Estates of the Subject arbitrarily, or take any part of them at pleasure.” (§137) The tendency of politicians is to think “themselves to have a distinct interest, from the rest of the Community; and so will apt to increase their own Riches and Power, by taking, what they think fit, from the People.” (§137) This last is a powerful statement, both of Locke’s cynical conception of power and the legitimate boundaries based on natural law that he envisages for governments.
There is no need for the legislative to stand all the time (and in the following chapter Locke observes that if it meets frequently it can become dangerous or at least burdensome), but the executive power ought to be permanently in office to ensure that the laws are enforced.
The people have the right to alter the legislative; similarly, if the executive stops the legislative from sitting, it effectively declares war on the people (§155). Executive power is held wholly on trust and representation in the legislative should be equal (§157).
The executive may use powers of prerogative to ensure the smooth process of legislation, but it ought never to overstep its bounds. Locke observes that while good princes stay within their limitations, “the reigns of good princes have always been most dangerous to the liberties of their people” for developing a trust in their prerogative which is soon abused by the next generation.
Since nature does not give one man power over another, as all men are equal, that power can only be gained over those who wage unjust war upon the peaceful commonwealth. The aggressor forfeits his rights, for he acts like the beasts that society is formed to protect people from and therefore “renders himself liable to be destroied by the injur’d person and the rest of mankind, that will joyn with him in the execution of Justice.” (§172)
Human history is certainly of war and conquest, however “many have mistaken the force of Arms, for the consent of the People … But Conquest is as far from setting up any Government as demolishing an House is from building a new one in the place … but, without the Consent of the people, can never erect a new one.” (§176) Aggressors in an unjust war cannot have rights over the conquered people; on the other hand, in fighting a just war, power can only be justifiably held over those who fought and not the innocents who did not partake in the fighting. Locke thus establishes strict just war code, strictly demarcating non-combatants from combatants, and also the property of conquered combatants and their dependents. “Conquerors, ’tis true, seldom trouble themselves to make the distinction, but they willingly permit the confusion of War to sweep altogether; but yet this alters not the Right.” (§179).
In a note on usurpation, Locke apparently accepts the usurpation of power by another personality; it only becomes problematic when the usurper adds to his power.
Accordingly, tyranny is the exercise of power beyond normal rights; no one can have a right to that power and an unjust regime may thusly be opposed. “Tyranny is the exercise of Power beyond Right, which no Body can have a Right to.” (§199) If the laws do not protect me, I have a right to defend myself. “May the Commands then of a Prince be opposed?” Yes, when the Prince deploys unjust force (§204).
A government is thus dissolved if it falls to a foreign power or if there is a civil war, when the government acts illegally or refuses the legislative to sit, or acts contrary to the trust put in it by the people. A people should not wait until the chains are put on them before they rebel.
In this section, the reader’s attention is drawn to several issues that the Two Treatises raises. It is by no means exhaustive, indeed it is extremely fractional in comparison with the debates and problems the Two Treatises have provoked. Lockean scholarship has attracted and continues to generate hundreds of articles on the various aspects of his philosophy – property, rights, rebellion, women, trust, social contract theory, anarchy, toleration, etc., and here I can only touch on a few. References are to sections (§) within the Second Treatise unless noted.
Locke’s state of nature is often contrasted with that of Thomas Hobbes’s, with which he would have had some familiarity either through reading Hobbes’s Leviathan or Pufendorf’s critique of Hobbes. Hobbes’s vision of a world without government is one of a war of all against in all, in which each will seek to aggress opportunistically against his neighbour – violence and resulting fear are endemic to life in a world without political power. At §19, Locke compares his own vision with Hobbes’s, arguing that Hobbes has not distinguished between the state of nature and the state war. Nonetheless, Locke’s vision remains tainted with the fear of neighbourly mistrust and Hobbesian elements: rather than the majority being so disposed to violence or fraud, in Locke it is the “inconveniences” brought about by a minority that the majority seek to defend themselves against.
On the whole, Locke’s anarchic state of nature is a benevolent condition of anarchic individualism, rather than Hobbesian brutality and mutual suspicion, in which conscience guides actions and reason (reflecting the law of nature) highlights the wrongness and counter-productivity of aggressing against one’s neighbour. Those who do aggress thereby renounce their humanity and act worse than beasts and may justly be harshly dealt with.
So why leave this idyllic state? Locke falls back on the fears of his time – the absence of power produces “inconveniences” and the fear of civil tumult, and where there is no common set of laws and impartial adjudicators, the advantages of “perfect freedom and equality” are offset by the worries of aggression. Three inconveniences arise: a lack of knowledge of known laws, which creates informational costs involved in action if agents do not know, or disagree on, the particularities of the laws of nature that legislation seeks to reflect; secondly, the absence of power to execute laws, and hence the vulnerability of small groups or individuals being violated by aggressive, more numerous groups; thirdly, in the state of nature, the agent judges his own case and for Locke, people can not be trusted to judge impartially and hence require a government to adjudicate.
There are problems with each of these. Firstly, the lack of known laws does not stop agents from working together to produce a common framework without the state. The Law Merchant is a good example and could have been known to Locke – merchants trading across different governmental jurisdictions often find national laws highly awkward or inconsistent, so they seek their own forms of international law – independent of any political power. Secondly, a lack of executive power in the state of nature does not warrant a monopolisation of power, just as, on Lockean reasoning, the lack of property ownership does not warrant a government monopoly in property – an argument Locke rejected in Filmer’s Patriarcha. As private ownership develops, so too does the breadth of the services offered, and just as one family does not have to produce all of the goods they desire (bread, shelter, clothing), so it does not need to produce security services. Thirdly, while individuals may disagree on what may be the particularities of the law in a case of conflict of interests, it does not imply that all individuals will agree to accept the same arbitrator, i.e., put all adjudication services into the same hands or institution. In fact, by handing over arbitration to a single institution logically invalidates the reason for seeking arbitration – if the state possesses a monopoly on adjudication services, then to whom should individuals turn for arbitrating between the state and themselves? Locke is aware of the failure of governmental adjudication, for in §20, he recognises that “where an appeal to the Law … lies open, but the remedy is deny’d by a manifest perverting of Justice, … there it is hard to imagine any thing but a State of War. For wherever violence is used, and injury done, though by hands appointed to administer Justice, it is still violence and injury, however colour’d with the Name, Pretences, or Forms of Law…” But rather than counselling rebellion and a rejection of the only system of appeals a state offers, Locke shrugs and reminds his readers that “the only remedy in such Cases [is] an appeal to Heaven.”
What Locke does not consider is a world without political power – just as Filmer assumed that Adam’s creation gave him monarchical power and proprietorship over the world, so too Locke makes the same logical leap into accepting the need for power, and his reasons for justifying it – the three inconveniences – are as subject to criticism as Filmer’s justification of Adam’s power in the fact of his begetting children. Similarly, the free and equal society of the state of nature is arguably not rendered more efficient by consenting to be ruled by a single, albeit limited, power. Locke’s comment on the reign of good princes shows good perception – if the state appears to work efficiently, then it is more disposed to expanding its goodly services and thereby weakening or even destroying the very reason for its formation.
Reason teaches the maturing individual to respect others’ rights to their freedom and the extent to which an aggressor ought to be punished – “so far as reason and conscience dictate” (§8). Just as we have seen in his other writings, Locke’s moral absolutism and even Old Testament ethic resurface – murderers (§12) and thieves (§18) deserve death, for a man has a right to destroy that which threatens his life.
However, in §16, Locke’s definition of war, that it arises when declared by word or action and not a “hasty” or a “passionate” action – suggests that a crime de passion may be forgivable, yet it also raises the possibility that a declared act of war could be a very reasonable option for an aggressor; yet Locke insists that aggressors have, by the fact of initiating force, renounced reason, despite the implication of a cold and calculating, “sedate settled Design.” It is an apparent inconsistency which requires deeper consideration, for aggressors cannot be both lower than beasts, who are motivated by their appetite say, and be simultaneously of such a calculating mentality. At some point, a man’s reason could be said to bifurcate, with one branch producing rationalisations – excuses for initiating violence – and the other branch reflecting the laws of nature that man is free and must logically accept his neighbour’s right to be free and to live without interference.
An aggressor seeks to gain absolute control over the individual – over his life and his property, that is, he seeks to enslave him. Nothing, for Locke, can justify such a motive for that would “take away the Freedom, that belongs to any one in that State [of Nature].” (§17). Locke’s logical development of the framework is excellent – individuals possess the right of retaliation and defence against aggressors, who, by initiating force, thereby introduce a state of war, an unjustifiable condition of violence and inequality that leads to enslavement. But can a man be said to lose his rights if he aggresses against another? Hobbes was of the opinion that a man possessed an inalienable right to self-preservation, such that if he were to be executed (justly for murder say) he would still possess the right to flee. Locke’s asymmetrical conception of moral status presents problems that begin with the termination of an inalienable right to life.
This leads to Locke’s exposition of the nature of a just war.
Lockean war is judged primarily on the objective distinction between aggressor and defender: aggressors act without justice and defenders act with justice. But it should be noted that it is a necessary, but not sufficient, condition of Lockean just war that a party has been attacked. For although the initiation of force provides the objective criterion that distinguishes just from unjust acts, it is not a sufficient condition that may sustain a protracted defence of a country once it has fallen. Locke counsels patience (and prayer) for a defending side that has lost a just war.
But when the violence is over, both sides may subject themselves to “the fair determination of the Law” and agree to the appropriate conditions of reparation and penalty and deterrence from further aggression, but where no adjudicating body exists, then the state of war continues (§20). This may be read as a very Hobbesian view of international affairs, which is a popular conception (cf. Political Realism) that sees the lack of, or ineffectiveness of international bodies, as evidence of a presiding anarchy between nations – even in the absence of actual war, such a situation is still, on Lockean and Hobbesian reasoning characteristic of the state of nature.
The aggressor forfeits his own life and rights when he initiates force (§172) and sets up the rule of force as his standard. The defenders – the prosecutors of a just war – thus gain arbitrary and despotic power over soldiers captured in a just war. How long should such a right last for? Locke’s presumption of guilt suggests that a war crime (participating in an unjust war being sufficient) lasts for the lifetime of the soldier, which raises the question of forgiveness and amnesties and their applicability in Locke’s system. If we look at it from the position of victorious aggressors in an unjust war, Locke is adamant that they can “never come to have a right over the Conquered.” This surely implies that the guilty can never lose their guilt.
Whether a government or a villain commits aggression does not make any difference, Locke echoes the words of the philosophers reaching back through Aquinas, Augustine, and to Cicero. Yet what ought the unjustly defeated do? Remain patient, Locke counsels. Without proper redress against either a petty villain or an aggressive government, the citizen ought to persevere, for justice remains with God and aggressors will ultimately be judged there. Nonetheless, in the meantime, the conquerors in an unjust war have no title to the subjection and obedience of the conquered. Apparently, Locke again retreats to a Hobbesian position here – that the security of peace is to be preferred to the violence, uncertainty, and fears of war. Yet the defeated are entitled to survive – outward obedience to the regime may certainly be coupled with an inward conscientious disobedience. Anything extorted or taken from an individual by force, including promises and consent to obey, do not mean anything (§186). The shaking off an unjust force or rebellion against such masters “is no Offence before God” (§196).
On the other hand, the conquerors in a just war gain absolute power over those who raised arms against them in the first place – but there is no collective retribution permitted in Locke’s system. Those who did not fight – innocents, or in today’s parlance, non-combatants – do not lose any rights to the just conquerors. There must, accordingly, be a strict distinction between combatants and non-combatants, which reflects the just war conventions, but, as Locke admits, rarely in the history of war, conquerors “willingly permit[ting] the confusion of War to sweep altogether.” (§178-9) The right over the aggressors is perfectly despotic – that is, they may justly be put to death or enslaved, but that right does not extend to their property, for that property must also support the lives of those who did not bear arms. The conqueror has a right to reparation payments to “repair the damages he has sustained by the War”, but not beyond the aggressor’s estates, for that it would be robbery on the defender’s side to take more than that which covers his cost of war or to impose on the property of those who did not fight, such as his wife and children.
Self-defence against individuals or against states that infringe upon the fundament right to life, liberty, and property justifies defence. So to what extent can the Lockean state expand its jurisdiction? While its remit is ostensibly minimal or libertarian, other elements in Locke’s thinking suggest there are loopholes that may deemed utilitarian.
The Lockean state is commissioned by a people to serve their interests in securing their rights to live peacefully. It opposes the organic Aristotelian conception of the state that perceives the state as the natural result of social growth – a development Locke agrees with but rejects the non-consensual characteristic of the Aristotelian state. The organic conception of the state collectivises the citizenry into a single body (a family ruled by the fatherly head as Filmer would perceive it), and thereby permits wielding the masses into directions the rulers see fit – ensuring that the collective as a whole survives and flourishes. We have seen that Locke’s conception of the state moves away from that of the ship and captain analogy to conceiving the state as an instrument whose sole purpose is to provide a secure framework for the life, property, and liberty of the people.
The organic conception is antithetical to the Lockean order. For Locke, government is no more than a tool that continuously depends on the consent of the people and must not violate the maximum conditions of securing peace and property – to do so is to violate the trust that is afforded the institution. It possesses no mystical nature of either a divine or a supernatural order, it is a mere prudential institution that can efficiently and effectively provide a better security service (though that is highly debatable – see above) than individuals working along in the natural state of freedom.
Political power is the power that every man in the state of nature possesses but which is given over to the society that they form: i.e., to the government set up to create an established and known set of laws, to arbitrate in disputes, and to preserve the life and property of its members. Locke’s vision is thusly of a minimal state whose justification can only be that of consent (§176). The state must not possess arbitrary, absolute powers over the lives and property of the civilians, yet its mandate must seek the public good and be democratic (that is, majority rule). This opens up issues.
First, historically, as Locke notes, “this Consent is little taken notice of: And therefore many have mistaken the force of Arms, for the consent of the people,” (§175). This does not undermine the theoretical justification of government – that it ought to be consensual, for earlier Locke stresses that adults have the right to secede from their present society to form a new one, therefore present occupation or de facto rule does not validate a government’s status. However, it does raise wonderfully intricate problems for any incumbent regime that oversteps its boundaries and initiates force against the people it is supposedly seeking to protect. It also tends to undermine the legitimacy of any regime not founded on consensual origins, as well as raises the question of how continual that consensus ought to be: should each generation renew its contract with its government body, and if it didn’t would that not undermine any legitimacy the government possessed? Or should implied consensus be an acceptable criterion of continual legitimisation of government – namely, the fact that a people do not seek to secede to migrate should be held as evidence of continued trust in their state?
Secondly, once government is justified, Locke’s particular political ethics demand that some people should not be part of the Commonwealth at all – Roman Catholics, atheists, and extreme religious sects should not be tolerated. Vagabonds and beggars are to be outlawed and pressed into government service (army or navy), and accordingly Locke argued for severe measures that would curtail a man’s freedom of movement, but what would the status of say, Roman Catholics, be in a Lockean state? If we take John Locke’s view – which was typical of many Protestant thinkers at the time (and indeed for the next hundred years) Catholics would be barred from enfranchisement – prohibited from attending political meetings or taking part in the political process; but if, on the other hand, we take the Lockean theory of the state and remove what can arguably considered as the incidental prejudices of the man and his time, then it is much more difficult to sustain a strong denial of freedom to those who would be intolerant of freedom. If a man’s conscience is to be free from interference, then so too must his freedom to express himself on his own land, say. The argument develops accordingly: may I possess the right to espouse treason in my own home, but not as a member of a public body? Or is it more the case that I can express what theories I care to, as long as the consequences of those speeches do not undermine the peaceful and Commonwealth? Locke remained intolerant of those who would overthrow a peaceful settlement, but that demands we look closer at the nature of peaceful settlements. The Glorious Revolution was bloodless in England, but not in Scotland or Ireland, and the inhabitants there saw the accession of William III through different eyes to their English contemporaries. Nevertheless, Lockean theory implies that we seek out objective distinctions rather than subjectively held differences – does the new regime uphold peace, property, and liberty, or does it strain to abuse power for its own ends. That remains the deciding argument for the Lockean, even though the details may be difficult to ascertain in practice.
Much of Locke’s thesis depends on the status of property – that a man initially owns himself and then owns that with which he mixes his labour. It is a powerful theory and one that goes a long way in justifying private property both on utilitarian grounds that it creates wealth and on moral grounds. The Lockean conception of the state, as we have seen above, depends greatly on the role of property – the relationship between the two topics being difficult to disentangle. But let’s look more closely at what Locke says about property and some of the issues that arise.
In the state of nature, everything is commonly owned; but as God gave man senses and reason to use for his preservation and reproduction, that which he removes out of the state of nature with his own hands becomes his property – and this is natural and just. The fact that a man labours to pick fruit or till the soil presents the distinguishing characteristic of private versus commonly held property. There is no need for any consent to be given by his comrades living in the state of nature, indeed awaiting that consent may mean he starves! (§28). “The labour that was mine, removing them out of that common state they were in, hath fixed my Property in them.”
But take a river from which a man draws water. The water in his pitcher is necessarily his – by virtue of his labouring to retrieve it; however, the water remains in common ownership. Any game in the wild is owned by all, until the hunter marks it for the chase, upon which the hare or the deer begins to become his property (§30). Locke deals with the first objection that if a man, with his labour, manages to secure vast resources, but there are brakes on such an engrossment.
Firstly, Christian morality demands that a man take from nature that which is for his enjoyment, “as much as any one can make use of to any advantage of life before it spoils … whatever is beyond this, is more than his share, and belongs to others. Nothing was made by God for Man to spoil or destroy.” (§31). While human population was small, there was of course enough resources to go around, but with the increase in numbers, pressures are put on Locke’s proviso (ably examined in Robert Nozick’s Anarchy, State, and Utopia) that enough be left for others. While in England further enclosures would require the “consent of Fellow-Commoners”; nevertheless, enough vacant land was available to permit a doubling of the population and still permit enough to left over for others if every man sought to make use. Arguably, against present (21stC) misconceptions of man’s imprint on the globe, most of the earth is relatively under-populated by humans, yet governments have created severe barriers to the free migration of peoples to under-populated (and high wage) lands, something the Lockean would reject as abrogating the common land into the government’s hands yet not dispersing it to those who would (or actually do) mix their labour with it. Indeed, Locke favoured free migration as the quickest means to increase a nation’s wealth through the ensuing expansion of trade and markets. “You may therefore safely open your doors, and a freedom to them to settle here being secure of this advantage that you have the profit of all their labour …” (FGN).
As men settle down, Locke continues, they needed to delineate their titles to the land, a pressure that gathers as a population increases. Nonetheless, in the early state of ownership, a man’s title to the land depends on his continual cultivation of it (§38). If he lets his grass rot, or his fruit perish, then his enclosure reverts back to wasteland – i.e., common ownership, and hence to be available for another to cultivate. But once land is taken under private ownership, its productivity increases and a man can sell its surplus; in turn, economic growth causes a population to grow, and thereby the value of cultivated land increases. The introduction of money also permits a man to hold his profit in the form of coin, which does not waste, and thereby enables him (justly) to increase his wealth. The advance of private property, tempered with Christian charitable considerations, is inherently virtuous. But should the advancement resulting from enclosure be encouraged or even forced?
Some, for example, may read in Locke the right to take commonly held, uncultivated lands off the peoples that reside on them and who yet do not exploit them well, and certainly there is evidence that Locke would support such an enterprise (§45: “there are still great tracts of Land to be found which (the Inhabitants thereof not having joyned with the rest of Mankind, in the consent of the Use of their common Money) lie waste, and are more than the People, who dwell on it, do, or can make use of, and so still lie in common.” As an applied example of this Lockean problem, we may refer to an enterprise that forged the westward expansion of the United States. The fact that much of Indian territory was uncultivated could, on Lockean, grounds justify Abraham Lincoln’s Homestead Act of 1862 promoting the mixing of “Industrious and Rational” labour with the land to promote settlement, the expansion of the commonwealth and economic growth, for the “taking of this or that part, does not depend on the express consent of all the Commoners” (§28); alternatively, it could equally support the 1763 Proclamation of King George III accepting the land rights of the native Indians and prohibiting further European settlement of their land.
The initial Northwest Ordinance (1787) stipulated in very Lockean language, “The utmost good faith shall always be observed toward the Indians, their lands and property shall never be taken from them without their consent; and in their property, rights, and liberty, they shall never be invaded or disturbed, unless in just and lawful wars authorized by congress; but laws founded in justice and humanity shall from time to time be made, for preventing wrongs being done to them, and for preserving peace and friendship with them.” However, between 1830 and 1870 the US Government pushed for a policy of annexation and enforced migration that is far removed from anything John Locke would have condoned, but which has left Lockean scholars debating the nature and extent of the injustice perpetrated and the potential reparations due, a debate that gained momentum in the 1960s and which, in academic circles, now extends to other parts of the world in which unjust aggression has caused a population displacement or violation of a people.
From a standard reading of Locke, his theory supports the right of the original inhabitants’ entitlement of their land. “the Inhabitants of any Countrey [sic], who are descended, and derive a Title to their Estates from those, who are subdued, and had a Government forced upon them against their free consents, retain a Right to the Possession of their Ancestors, though they consent not freely to the Government, whose hard Conditions were by force imposed on the Possessors of that Country.” Since much of human history involves conquest, the extent of lands held unjustly are vast and the application of Lockean theory to explore potential solutions becomes consequently cumbersome. To what period of time can the original settlers of a land refer back to in establishing their primary proprietorship?
In the immediate aftermath of Locke’s publication of the Two Treatises his friend and Member of the Irish Parliament, William Molyneux, published The Case of Ireland, a defence of Irish nationalism in the face of British control. Locke refused to admit he had written the Two Treatises to Molyneux, who came to stay with Locke. Nothing is known of their conversation, but Molyneux’s work echoed the principles of the Two Treatises, but the House of Lords took umbrage and had the book burned. It is unclear what Locke’s response would have been, for Molyneux’s argument logically included the native Catholic population (as well as its Protestants) in the right to run Ireland. As Dunn notes, Locke may have favoured Catholic rule for Catholic nations far from the British Isles, but he could not approve of Catholic rule within the British jurisdiction. Molyneux’s Lockean arguments seeped through to the North American colonies and to Otis and Jefferson and eventually culminated in the American Revolution.
This article touches on the main political issues that emanate from Locke’s writings. It is highly advisable for the student to return again and again to Locke’s original works, where the depth and breadth of the philosopher’s thoughts can be better appreciated. The library of secondary literature (books and journals) is immense and growing – Locke has certainly has had an effective impact on political philosophy and new readers of his works can always add something to Lockean scholarship.
At: Atlantis, in Political Writings.
CEP: Civil and Ecclesiastical Power in Political Writings
EPL: Essay on the Poor Law in Political Writings
FCC: Fundamental Constitution of Carolina (*) in Political Writings
FGN: For a General Naturalisation (1693), in Political Writings.
FT: First Tract on Government (also known as the English Tract), in Political Writings.
OSP: On Samuel Parker (1669-70), in Political Writings
R: Reputation (1678) in Political Writings
Tb: Toleration B (1676) in Political Writings
V: Verses on Cromwell and King Charles II’s Restoration, in Political Writings.
Last updated: April 4, 2005 | Originally published: