Locke, John

John Locke (1632—1704)

LockeJohn Locke was among the most famous philosophers and political theorists of the 17th century.  He is often regarded as the founder of a school of thought known as British Empiricism, and he made foundational contributions to modern theories of limited, liberal government. He was also influential in the areas of theology, religious toleration, and educational theory. In his most important work, the Essay Concerning Human Understanding, Locke set out to offer an analysis of the human mind and its acquisition of knowledge. He offered an empiricist theory according to which we acquire ideas through our experience of the world. The mind is then able to examine, compare, and combine these ideas in numerous different ways. Knowledge consists of a special kind of relationship between different ideas. Locke’s emphasis on the philosophical examination of the human mind as a preliminary to the philosophical investigation of the world and its contents represented a new approach to philosophy, one which quickly gained a number of converts, especially in Great Britain. In addition to this broader project, the Essay contains a series of more focused discussions on important, and widely divergent, philosophical themes. In politics, Locke is best known as a proponent of limited government. He uses a theory of natural rights to argue that governments have obligations to their citizens, have only limited powers over their citizens, and can ultimately be overthrown by citizens under certain circumstances. He also provided powerful arguments in favor of religious toleration. This article attempts to give a broad overview of all key areas of Locke’s thought.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Works
  2. The Main Project of the Essay
    1. Ideas
    2. The Critique of Nativism
    3. Idea Acquisition
    4. Language
    5. The Account of Knowledge
  3. Special Topics in the Essay
    1. Primary and Secondary Qualities
    2. Mechanism
    3. Volition and Agency
    4. Personhood and Personal Identity
    5. Real and Nominal Essences
    6. Religious Epistemology
  4. Political Philosophy
    1. The Two Treatises
    2. Property
    3. Toleration
  5. Theology
  6. Education
  7. Locke’s Influence
  8. References and Further Reading
    1. Locke’s Works
    2. Recommended Reading

1. Life and Works

John Locke was born in 1632 in Wrington, a small village in southwestern England. His father, also named John, was a legal clerk and served with the Parliamentary forces in the English Civil War. His family was well-to-do, but not of particularly high social or economic standing. Locke spent his childhood in the West Country and as a teenager was sent to Westminster School in London.

Locke was successful at Westminster and earned a place at Christ Church, Oxford. He was to remain in Oxford from 1652 until 1667. Although he had little appreciation for the traditional scholastic philosophy he learned there, Locke was successful as a student and after completing his undergraduate degree he held a series of administrative and academic posts in the college. Some of Locke’s duties included instruction of undergraduates. One of his earliest substantive works, the Essays on the Law of Nature, was developed in the course of his teaching duties. Much of Locke’s intellectual effort and energy during his time at Oxford, especially during his later years there, was devoted to the study of medicine and natural philosophy (what we would now call science). Locke read widely in these fields, participated in various experiments, and became acquainted with Robert Boyle and many other notable natural philosophers. He also undertook the normal course of education and training to become a physician.

Locke left Oxford for London in 1667 where he became attached to the family of Anthony Ashley Cooper (then Lord Ashley, later the Earl of Shaftesbury). Locke may have played a number of roles in the household, mostly likely serving as tutor to Ashley’s son. In London, Locke continued to pursue his interests in medicine and natural philosophy. He formed a close working relationship with Thomas Sydenham, who later became one the most famous physicians of the age. He made a number of contacts within the newly formed Royal Society and became a member in 1668. He also acted as the personal physician to Lord Ashley. Indeed, on one occasion Locke participated in a very delicate surgical operation which Ashley credited with saving his life. Ashley was one of the most prominent English politicians at the time. Through his patronage Locke was able to hold a series of governmental posts. Most of his work related to policies in England’s American and Caribbean colonies. Most importantly, this was the period in Locke’s life when he began the project which would culminate in his most famous work, the Essay Concerning Human Understanding. The two earliest drafts of that work date from 1671. He was to continue work on this project intermittentlyfor nearly twenty years.

Locke travelled in France for several years starting in 1675. When he returned to England it was only to be for a few years. The political scene had changed greatly while Locke was away. Shaftesbury (as Ashley was now known) was out of favor and Locke’s association with him had become a liability. It was around this time that Locke composed his most famous political work, the Two Treatises Concerning Government. Although the Two Treatises would not be published until 1689 they show that he had already solidified his views on the nature and proper form of government. Following Shaftesbury’s death Locke fled to the Netherlands to escape political persecution. While there Locke travelled a great deal (sometimes for his own safety) and worked on two projects. First, he continued work on the Essay. Second, he wrote a work entitled Epistola de Tolerantia, which was published anonymously in 1689. Locke’s experiences in England, France, and the Netherlands convinced him that governments should be much more tolerant of religious diversity than was common at the time.

Following the Glorious Revolution of 1688-1689 Locke was able to return to England. He published both the Essay and the Two Treatises (the second anonymously) shortly after his return. He initially stayed in London but soon moved to the home of Francis and Damaris Masham in the small village of Oates, Essex. Damaris Masham, who was the daughter of a notable philosopher named Ralph Cudworth, had become acquainted with Locke several years before. The two formed a very close friendship which lasted until Locke’s death. During this period Locke kept busy working on politics, toleration, philosophy, economics, and educational theory.

Locke engaged in a number of controversies during his life, including a notable one with Jonas Proast over toleration. But Locke’s most famous and philosophically important controversy was with Edward Stillingfleet, the Bishop of Worcester. Stillingfleet, in addition to being a powerful political and theological figure, was an astute and forceful critic. The two men debated a number of the positions in the Essay in a series of published letters.

In his later years Locke devoted much of his attention to theology. His major work in this field was The Reasonableness of Christianity, published (again anonymously) in 1695. This work was controversial because Locke argued that many beliefs traditionally believed to be mandatory for Christians were unnecessary. Locke argued for a highly ecumenical form of Christianity. Closer to the time of his death Locke wrote a work on the Pauline Epistles. The work was unfinished, but published posthumously. A short work on miracles also dates from this time and was published posthumously.

Locke suffered from health problems for most of his adult life. In particular, he had respiratory ailments which were exacerbated by his visits to London where the air quality was very poor. His health took a turn for the worse in 1704 and he became increasingly debilitated. He died on 28 October 1704 while Damaris Masham was reading him the Psalms. He was buried at High Laver, near Oates. He wrote his own epitaph which was both humble and forthright.

2. The Main Project of the Essay

According to Locke’s own account the motivation for writing the Essay came to him while debating an unrelated topic with friends. He reports that they were able to make little headway on this topic and that they very quickly met with a number of confusions and difficulties. Locke realized that to make progress on this topic it was first necessary to examine something more fundamental: the human understanding. It was “necessary to examine our own Abilities, and see, what Objects our Understandings were, or were not fitted to deal with.” (Epistle, 7).

Locke’s insight was that before we can analyze the world and our access to it we have to know something about ourselves. We need to know how we acquire knowledge. We also need to know which areas of inquiry we are well suited to and which are epistemically closed to us, that is, which areas are such that we could not know them even in principle. We further need to know what knowledge consists in.  In keeping with these questions, at the very outset of the Essay Locke writes that it is his “Purpose enquire into the Original, Certainty, and Extent of humane Knowledge; together, with the Grounds and Degrees of Belief, Opinion, and Assent.” (1.1.2, 42). Locke thinks that it is only once we understand our cognitive capabilities that we can suitably direct our researches into the world. This may have been what Locke had in mind when he claimed that part of his ambition in the Essay was to be an “Under-Laborer” who cleared the ground and laid the foundations for the work of famous scientists like Robert Boyle and Isaac Newton.

The Essay is divided into four books with each book contributing to Locke’s overall goal of examining the human mind with respect to its contents and operations. In Book I Locke rules out one possible origin of our knowledge. He argues that our knowledge cannot have been innate. This sets up Book II in which Locke argues that all of our ideas come from experience. In this book he seeks to give an account of how even ideas like God, infinity, and space could have been acquired through our perceptual access to the world and our mental operations. Book III is something of a digression as Locke turns his attention to language and the role it plays in our theorizing. Locke’s main goal here is cautionary, he thinks language is often an obstacle to understanding and he offers some recommendations to avoid confusion. Finally, Book IV discusses knowledge, belief, and opinion. Locke argues that knowledge consists of special kinds of relations between ideas and that we should regulate our beliefs accordingly.

a. Ideas

The first chapter of the Essay contains an apology for the frequent use of the word “idea” in the book. According to Locke, ideas are the fundamental units of mental content and so play an integral role in his explanation of the human mind and his account of our knowledge. Locke was not the first philosopher to give ideas a central role; Descartes, for example, had relied heavily on them in explaining the human mind. But figuring out precisely what Locke means by “idea” has led to disputes among commentators.

One place to begin is with Locke’s own definition. He claims that by “idea” he means “whatsoever is the Object of the Understanding when a Man thinks…whatever is meant by Phantasm, Notion, Species, or whatever it is, which the Mind can be employ’d about in thinking.” (1.1.8, 47). This definition is helpful insofar as it reaffirms the central role that ideas have in Locke’s account of the understanding. Ideas are the sole entities upon which our minds work. Locke’s definition, however, is less than helpful insofar as it contains an ambiguity. On one reading, ideas are mental objects. The thought is that when an agent perceives an external world object like an apple there is some thing in her mind which represents that apple. So when an agent considers an apple what she is really doing is thinking about the idea of that apple. On a different reading, ideas are mental actions. The thought here is that when an agent perceives an apple she is really perceiving the apple in a direct, unmediated way. The idea is the mental act of making perceptual contact with the external world object. In recent years, most commentators have adopted the first of these two readings. But this debate will be important in the discussion of knowledge below.

b. The Critique of Nativism

The first of the Essay’s four books is devoted to a critique of nativism, the doctrine that some ideas are innate in the human mind, rather than received in experience. It is unclear precisely who Locke’s targets in this book are, though Locke does cite Herbert of Cherbury and other likely candidates include René Descartes, the Cambridge Platonists, and a number of lesser known Anglican theologians. Finding specific targets, however, might not be that important given that much of what Locke seeks to do in Book I is motivate and make plausible the alternative account of idea acquisition that he offers in Book II.

The nativist view which Locke attacks in Book I holds that human beings have mental content which is innate in the mind. This means that there are certain ideas (units of mental content) which were neither acquired via experience nor constructed by the mind out of ideas received in experience. The most popular version of this position holds that there are certain ideas which God planted in all minds at the moment of their creation.

Locke attacks both the view that we have any innate principles (for example, the whole is greater than the part, do unto others as you would have done unto you, etc.) as well as the view that there are any innate singular ideas (for example, God, identity, substance,  and so forth). The main thrust of Locke’s argument lies in pointing out that none of the mental content alleged to be innate is universally shared by all humans. He notes that children and the mentally disabled, for example, do not have in their minds an allegedly innate complex thought like “equals taken from equals leave equals”. He also uses evidence from travel literature to point out that many non-Europeans deny what were taken to be innate moral maxims and that some groups even lack the idea of a God. Locke takes the fact that not all humans have these ideas as evidence that they were not implanted by God in humans minds, and that they are therefore acquired rather than innate.

There is one misunderstanding which it is important to avoid when considering Locke’s anti-nativism. The misunderstanding is, in part, suggested by Locke’s claim that the mind is like a tabula rasa (a blank slate) prior to sense experience. This makes it sound as though the mind is nothing prior to the advent of ideas. In fact, Locke’s position is much more nuanced. He makes it clear that the mind has any number of inherent capacities, predispositions, and inclinations prior to receiving any ideas from sensation. His anti-nativist point is just that none of these is triggered or exercised until the mind receives ideas from sensation. 

c. Idea Acquisition

In Book II Locke offers his alternative theory of how the human mind comes to be furnished with the ideas it has. Every day we think of complex things like orange juice, castles, justice, numbers, and motion. Locke’s claim is that the ultimate origin of all of these ideas lies in experience: “Experience: In that, all our Knowledge is founded; and from that it ultimately derives itself. Our Observation employ’d either about external, sensible Objects; or about the internal Operations of our Minds, perceived and reflected on by ourselves, is that, which supplies our Understandings with all the material of thinking. These two are the Fountains of Knowledge, from whence all the Ideas we have, or can naturally have, do spring.” (2.1.2, 104).

In the above passage Locke allows for two distinct types of experience. Outer experience, or sensation, provides us with ideas from the traditional five senses. Sight gives us ideas of colors, hearing gives us ideas of sounds, and so on. Thus, my idea of a particular shade of green is a product of seeing a fern. And my idea of a particular tone is the product of my being in the vicinity of a piano while it was being played. Inner experience, or reflection, is slightly more complicated. Locke thinks that the human mind is incredibly active; it is constantly performing what he calls operations. For example, I often remember past birthday parties, imagine that I was on vacation, desire a slice of pizza, or doubt that England will win the World Cup. Locke believes that we are able to notice or experience our mind performing these actions and when we do we receive ideas of reflection. These are ideas such as memory, imagination, desire, doubt, judgment, and choice.

Locke’s view is that experience (sensation and reflection) issues us with simple ideas. These are the minimal units of mental content; each simple idea is “in itself uncompounded, [and] contains in it nothing but one uniform Appearance, or Conception in the mind, and is not distinguishable into different Ideas.” (2.2.1, 119). But many of my ideas are not simple ideas. My idea of a glass of orange juice or my idea of the New York subway system, for example, could not be classed a simple ideas. Locke calls ideas like these complex ideas. His view is that complex ideas are the product of combining our simple ideas together in various ways. For example, my complex idea of a glass of orange juice consists of various simple ideas (the color orange, the feeling of coolness, a certain sweet taste, a certain acidic taste, and so forth) combined together into one object. Thus, Locke believes our ideas are compositional. Simple ideas combine to form complex ideas. And these complex ideas can be combined to form even more complex ideas.

We are now in a position to understand the character of Locke’s empiricism. He is committed to the view that all of our ideas, everything we can possibly think of, can be broken down into simple ideas received in experience. The bulk of Book II is devoted to making this empiricism plausible. Locke does this both by undertaking an examination of the various abilities that the human mind has (memory, abstraction, volition, and so forth) and by offering an account of how even abstruse ideas like space, infinity, God, and causation could be constructed using only the simple ideas received in experience.

Our complex ideas are classified into three different groups: substances, modes, and relations. Ideas of substances are ideas of things which are thought to exist independently. Ordinary objects like desks, sheep, and mountains fall into this group. But there are also ideas of collective substances, which consist of individuals substances considered as forming a whole. A group of individual buildings might be considered a town. And a group of individual men and women might be considered together as an army. In addition to describing the way we think about individual substances, Locke also has an interesting discussion of substance-in-general. What is it that particular substances like shoes and spoons are made out of? We could suggest that they are made out of leather and metal. But the question could be repeated, what are leather and metal made of? We might respond that they are made of matter. But even here, Locke thinks we can ask what matter is made of. What gives rise to the properties of matter? Locke claims that we don’t have a very clear idea here. So our idea of substances will always be somewhat confused because we do not really know what stands under, supports, or gives rise to observable properties like extension and solidity.

Ideas of modes are ideas of things which are dependent on substances in some way. In general, this taxonomic category can be somewhat tricky. It does not seem to have a clear parallel in contemporary metaphysics, and it is sometimes thought to be a mere catch-all category for things which are neither substances nor relations. But it is helpful to think of modes as being like features of substances; modes are “such complex Ideas, which however compounded, contain not in them the supposition of subsisting by themselves, but are considered as Dependences on, or Affections of Substances.” (2.12.4, 165). Modes come in two types: simple and mixed. Simple modes are constructed by combining a large number of a single type of simple ideas together. For example, Locke believes there is a simple idea of unity. Our complex idea of the number seven, for example, is a simple mode and is constructed by concatenating seven simple ideas of unity together. Locke uses this category to explain how we think about a number of topics relating to number, space, time, pleasure and pain, and cognition. Mixed modes, on the other hand, involve combining together simple ideas of more than one kind. A great many ideas fall into this category. But the most important ones are moral ideas. Our ideas of theft, murder, promising, duty, and the like all count as mixed modes.

Ideas of relations are ideas that involve more than one substance. My idea of a husband, for example, is more than the idea of an individual man. It also must include the idea of another substance, namely the idea of that man’s spouse. Locke is keen to point out that much more of our thought involves relations than we might previously have thought. For example, when I think about Elizabeth II as the Queen of England my thinking actually involves relations, because I cannot truly think of Elizabeth as a queen without conceiving of her as having a certain relationship of sovereignty to some subjects (individual substances like David Beckham and J.K. Rowling). Locke then goes on to explore the role that relations have in our thinking about causation, space, time, morality, and (very famously) identity.

Throughout his discussion of the different kinds of complex ideas Locke is keen to emphasize that all of our ideas can ultimately be broken down into simple ideas received in sensation and reflection. Put differently, Locke is keenly aware that the success of his empiricist theory of mind depends on its ability to account for all the contents of our minds. Whether or not Locke is successful is a matter of dispute. On some occasions the analysis he gives of how a very complex idea could be constructed using only simple ideas is vague and requires the reader to fill in some gaps. And commentators have also suggested that some of the simple ideas Locke invokes, for example the simple ideas of power and unity, do not seem to be obvious components of our phenomenological experience.

Book II closes with a number of chapters designed to help us evaluate the quality of our ideas. Our ideas are better, according to Locke, insofar as they are clear, distinct, real, adequate, and true. Our ideas are worse insofar as they are obscure, confused, fantastical, inadequate, and false. Clarity and obscurity are explained via an analogy to vision. Clear ideas, like clear images, are crisp and fresh, not faded or diminished in the way that obscure ideas (or images) are. Distinction and confusion have to do with the individuation of ideas. Ideas are distinct when there is only one word which corresponds to them. Confused ideas are ones to which more than one word can correctly apply or ones that lack a clear and consistent correlation to one particular word. To use one of Locke’s examples, an idea of a leopard as a beast with spots would be confused. It is not distinct because the word “lynx” could apply to that idea just as easily as the word “leopard.” Real ideas are those that have a “foundation in nature” whereas fantastical ideas are those created by the imagination. For example, our idea of a horse would be a real idea and our idea of a unicorn would be fantastical. Adequacy and inadequacy have to do with how well ideas match the patterns according to which they were made. Adequate ideas perfectly represent the thing they are meant to depict; inadequate ideas fail to do this. Ideas are true when the mind understands them in a way that is correct according to linguistic practices and the way the world is structured. They are false when the mind misunderstands them along these lines.

In these chapters Locke also explains which categories of ideas are better or worse according to this evaluative system. Simple ideas do very well. Because objects directly produce them in the mind they tend to be clear, distinct, and so forth. Ideas of modes and relations also tend to do very well, but for a different reason. Locke thinks that the archetypes of these ideas are in the mind rather than in the world. As such, it is easy for these ideas to be good because the mind has a clear sense of what the ideas should be like as it constructs them. By contrast, ideas of substances tend to fare very poorly. The archetypes for these ideas are external world objects. Because our perceptual access to these objects is limited in a number of ways and because these objects are so intricate, ideas of substances tend to be confused, inadequate, false, and so forth.

d. Language

Book III of the Essay is concerned with language. Locke admits that this topic is something of a digression. He did not originally plan for language to take up an entire book of the Essay. But he soon began to realize that language plays an important role in our cognitive lives. Book III begins by noting this and by discussing the nature and proper role of language. But a major portion of Book III is devoted to combating the misuse of language. Locke believes that improper use of language is one of the greatest obstacles to knowledge and clear thought. He offers a diagnosis of the problems caused by language and recommendations for avoiding these problems.

Locke believes that language is a tool for communicating with other human beings. Specifically, Locke thinks that we want to communicate about our ideas, the contents of our minds. From here it is a short step to the view that: “Words in their primary or immediate Signification, stand for nothing, but the Ideas in the Mind of him that uses them.” (3.2.2, 405). When an agent utters the word “gold” she is referring to her idea of a shiny, yellowish, malleable substance of great value. When she utters the word “carrot” she is referring to her idea of a long, skinny, orange vegetable which grows underground. Locke is, of course, aware that the names we choose for these ideas are arbitrary and merely a matter of social convention.

Although the primary use of words is to refer to ideas in the mind of the speaker, Locke also allows that words make what he calls “secret reference” to two other things. First, humans also want their words to refer to the corresponding ideas in the minds of other humans. When Smith says “carrot” within earshot of Jones her hope is that Jones also has an idea of the long, skinny vegetable and that saying “carrot” will bring that idea into Jones’ mind. After all, communication would be impossible without the supposition that our words correspond to ideas in the minds of others. Second, humans suppose that their words stand for objects in the world. When Smith says “carrot” she wants to refer to more than just her idea, she also wants to refer to the long skinny objects themselves. But Locke is suspicious of these two other ways of understanding signification. He thinks the latter one, in particular, is illegitimate.

After discussing these basic features of language and reference Locke goes on to discuss specific cases of the relationship between ideas and words: words used for simple ideas, words used for modes, words used for substances, the way in which a single word can refer to a multiplicity of ideas, and so forth. There is also an interesting chapter on “particles.” These are words which do not refer to an idea but instead refer to a certain connection which holds between ideas. For example, if I say “Secretariat is brown” the word “Secretariat” refers to my idea of a certain racehorse, and “brown” refers to my idea of a certain color, but the word “is” does something different. That word is a particle and indicates that I am expressing something about the relationship between my ideas of Secretariat and brown and suggesting that they are connected in a certain way. Other particles includes words like “and”, “but”, “hence”, and so forth.

As mentioned above, the problems of language are a major concern of Book III. Locke thinks that language can lead to confusion and misunderstanding for a number of reasons. The signification of words is arbitrary, rather than natural, and this means it can be difficult to understand which words refer to which ideas. Many of our words stand for ideas which are complex, hard to acquire, or both. So many people will struggle to use those words appropriately. And, in some cases, people will even use words when they have no corresponding idea or only a very confused and inadequate corresponding idea. Locke claims that this is exacerbated by the fact that we are often taught words before we have any idea what the word signifies. A child, for example, might be taught the word “government” at a young age, but it will take her years to form a clear idea of what governments are and how they operate. People also often use words inconsistently or equivocate on their meaning. Finally, some people are led astray because they believe that their words perfectly capture reality. Recall from above that people secretly and incorrectly use their words to refer to objects in the external world. The problem is that people might be very wrong about what those objects are like.

Locke thinks that a result of all this is that people are seriously misusing language and that many debates and discussions in important fields like science, politics, and philosophy are confused or consist of merely verbal disputes. Locke provides a number of examples of language causing problems: Cartesians using “body” and “extension” interchangeably, even though the two ideas are distinct; physiologists who agree on all the facts yet have a long dispute because they have different understandings of the word “liquor”; Scholastic philosophers using the term “prime matter” when they are unable to actually frame an idea of such a thing, and so forth.

The remedies that Locke recommends for fixing these problems created by language are somewhat predictable. But Locke is quick to point out that while they sound like easy fixes they are actually quite difficult to implement. The first and most important step is to only use words when we have clear ideas attached to them. (Again, this sounds easy, but many of us might actually struggle to come up with a clear idea corresponding to even everyday terms like “glory” or “fascist”.) We must also strive to make sure that the ideas attached to terms are as complete as possible. We must strive to ensure that we use words consistently and do not equivocate; every time we utter a word we should use it to signify one and the same idea. Finally, we should communicate our definitions of words to others.

e. The Account of Knowledge

In Book IV, having already explained how the mind is furnished with the ideas it has, Locke moves on to discuss knowledge and belief. A good place to start is with a quote from the beginning of Book IV: “Knowledge then seems to me to be nothing but the perception of the connexion and agreement, or disagreement and repugnancy of any of our Ideas. Where this Perception is, there is Knowledge, and where it is not, there, though we may fancy, guess, or believe, yet we always come short of Knowledge.” (4.2.2, 525). Locke spends the first part of Book IV clarifying and exploring this conception of knowledge. The second part focuses on how we should apportion belief in cases where we lack knowledge.

What does Locke mean by the “connection and agreement” and the “disagreement and repugnancy” of our ideas? Some examples might help. Bring to mind your idea of white and your idea of black. Locke thinks that upon doing this you will immediately perceive that they are different, they “disagree”. It is when you perceive this disagreement that you know the fact that white is not black. Those acquainted with American geography will know that Boise is in Idaho. On Locke’s account of knowledge, this means that they are able to perceive a certain connection that obtains between their idea of Idaho and their idea of Boise. Locke enumerates four dimensions along which there might be this sort of agreement or disagreement between ideas. First, we can perceive when two ideas are identical or non-identical. For example, knowing that sweetness is not bitterness consists in perceiving that the idea of sweetness is not identical to the idea of bitterness. Second, we can perceive relations that obtain between ideas. For example, knowing that 7 is greater than 3 consists in perceiving that there is a size relation of bigger and smaller between the two ideas. Third, we can perceive when our idea of a certain feature accompanies our idea of a certain thing. If I know that ice is cold this is because I perceive that my idea of cold always accompanies my idea of ice. Fourthly, we can perceive when existence agrees with any idea. I can have knowledge of this fourth kind when, for example, I perform the cogito and recognize the special relation between my idea of myself and my idea of existence. Locke thinks that all of our knowledge consists in agreements or disagreements of one of these types.

After detailing the types of relations between ideas which constitute knowledge Locke continues on to discuss three “degrees” of knowledge in 4.2. These degrees seem to consist in different ways of knowing something. The first degree Locke calls intuitive knowledge. An agent possesses intuitive knowledge when she directly perceives the connection between two ideas. This is the best kind of knowledge, as Locke says “Such kind of Truths, the Mind perceives at the first sight of the Ideas together, by bare Intuition, without the intervention of any other Idea; and this kind of knowledge is the clearest, and most certain, that humane Frailty is capable of.” (4.2.1, 531). The second degree of knowledge is called demonstrative. Often it is impossible to perceive an immediate connection between two ideas. For example, most of us are unable to tell that the three interior angles of a triangle are equal to two right angles simply by looking at them. But most of us, with the assistance of a mathematics teacher, can be made to see that they are equal by means of a geometric proof or demonstration. This is the model for demonstrative knowledge. Even if one is unable to directly perceive a relation between idea-X and idea-Y one might perceive a relation indirectly by means of idea-A and idea-B. This will be possible if the agent has intuitive knowledge of a connection between X and A, between A and B, and then between B and Y. Demonstrative knowledge consists, therefore, in a string of relations each of which is known intuitively.

The third degree of knowledge is called sensitive knowledge and has been the source of considerable debate and confusion among Locke commentators. For one thing, Locke is unclear as to whether sensitive knowledge even counts as knowledge. He writes that intuitive and demonstrative knowledge are, properly speaking, the only forms of knowledge, but that “There is, indeed, another Perception of the Mind…which going beyond bare probability, and yet not reaching perfectly to either of the foregoing degrees of certainty, passes under the name of Knowledge.” (4.2.14, 537). Sensitive knowledge has to do with the relationship between our ideas and the objects in the external world that produce them. Locke claims that we can be certain that when we perceive something, an orange, for example, there is an object in the external world which is responsible for these sensations. Part of Locke’s claim is that there is a serious qualitative difference between biting into an orange and remembering biting into an orange. There is something in the phenomenological experience of the former which assures us of a corresponding object in the external world.

Locke spends a fair amount of time in Book IV responding to worries that he is a skeptic or that his account of knowledge, with its emphasis on ideas, fails to be responsive to the external world. The general worry for Locke is fairly simple. By claiming that ideas are the only things humans have epistemic access to, and by claiming that knowledge relates only to our ideas, Locke seems to rule out the claim that we can ever know about the external world. Lockean agents are trapped behind a “veil of ideas.” Thus we cannot have any assurance that our ideas provide us with reliable information about the external world. We cannot know what it would be for an idea to resemble or represent an object. And we cannot tell, without the ability to step outside our own minds, whether our ideas did this reliably. This criticism has historically been thought to endanger Locke’s entire project. Gilbert Ryle’s memorable assessment is that “nearly every youthful student of philosophy both can and does in his second essay refute Locke’s entire Theory of Knowledge.” Recent scholarship has been much more charitable to Locke. But the central problem is still a pressing one.

Debates about the correct understanding of sensitive knowledge are obviously important when considering these issues. At first blush, the relation involved in sensitive knowledge seems to be a relation between an idea and a physical object in the world. But, if this reading is correct, then it becomes difficult to understand the many passages in which Locke insists that knowledge is a relation that holds only between ideas. Also relevant are debates about how to correctly understand Lockean ideas. Recall from above that although many understand ideas as mental objects, some understand them as mental acts. While most of the text seems to favor the first interpretation, it seems that the second interpretation has a significant advantage when responding to these skeptical worries. The reason is that the connection between ideas and external world objects is built right into the definition of an idea. An idea just is a perception of an external world object.

However the debates discussed in the previous paragraph are resolved, there is a consensus among commentators that Locke believes the scope of human understanding is very narrow. Humans are not capable of very much knowledge. Locke discusses this is 4.3, a chapter entitled “Extent of Humane Knowledge.” The fact that our knowledge is so limited should come as no surprise. We have already discussed the ways in which our ideas of substances are problematic. And we have just seen that we have no real understanding of the connection between our ideas and the objects that produce them.

The good news, however, is that while our knowledge might not be very extensive, it is sufficient for our needs. Locke’s memorable nautical metaphor holds that: “’Tis of great use to the Sailor to know the length of his Line, though he cannot with it fathom all the depths of the Ocean. ‘Tis well he knows, that it is long enough to reach the bottom, at such Places, as are necessary to direct his Voyage, and caution him against running upon Shoales, that may ruin him. Our Business here is not to know all things, but those which concern our Conduct.” (1.1.6, 46). Locke thinks we have enough knowledge to live comfortable lives on Earth, to realize that there is a God, to understand morality and behave appropriately, and to gain salvation. Our knowledge of morality, in particular, is very good. Locke even suggests that we might develop a demonstrable system of morality similar to Euclid’s demonstrable system of geometry. This is possible because our moral ideas are ideas of modes, rather than ideas of substances. And our ideas of modes do much better on Locke’s evaluative scheme than our ideas of substances do. Finally, while the limits to our knowledge might be disappointing, Locke notes that recognizing these limits is important and useful insofar as it will help us to better organize our intellectual inquiry. We will be saved from investigating questions which we could never know the answers to and can focus our efforts on areas where progress is possible.

One benefit of Locke’s somewhat bleak assessment of the scope of our knowledge was that it caused him to focus on an area which was underappreciated by many of his contemporaries. This was the arena of judgment or opinion, belief states which fall short of knowledge. Given that we have so little knowledge (that we can be certain of so little) the realm of probability becomes very important. Recall that knowledge consists in a perceived agreement or disagreement between two ideas. Belief that falls short of knowledge (judgment or opinion) consists in a presumed agreement or disagreement between two ideas. Consider an example: I am not entirely sure who the Prime Minister of Canada is, but I am somewhat confident it is Stephen Harper. Locke’s claim is that in judging that the Canadian PM is Stephen Harper I am acting as though a relation holds between the two ideas. I do not directly perceive a connection between my idea of Stephen Harper and my idea of the Canadian PM, but I presume that one exists.

After offering this account of what judgment is, Locke offers an analysis of how and why we form the opinions we do and offers some recommendations for forming our opinions responsibly. This includes a diagnosis of the errors people make in judging, a discussion of the different degrees of assent, and an interesting discussion of the epistemic value of testimony.

3. Special Topics in the Essay

As discussed above, the main project of the Essay is an examination of the human understanding and an analysis of knowledge. But the Essay is a rather expansive work and contains discussion of many other topics of philosophical interest. Some of these will be discussed below. A word of warning, however, is required before proceeding. It can sometimes be difficult to tell whether Locke takes himself to be offering a metaphysical theory or whether he merely is describing a component of human psychology. For example, we might question whether his account of personal identity is meant to give necessary and sufficient conditions for a metaphysical account of personhood or whether it is merely designed to tell us what sorts of identity attributions we do and should make and why. We may further question whether, when discussing primary and secondary qualities, Locke is offering a theory about how perception really works or whether this discussion is a mere digression used to illustrate a point about the nature of our ideas. So while many of these topics have received a great deal of attention, their precise relationship to the main project of the Essay can be difficult to locate.

a. Primary and Secondary Qualities

Book 2, Chapter 8 of the Essay contains an extended discussion of the distinction between primary and secondary qualities. Locke was hardly original in making this distinction. By the time the Essay was published, it had been made by many others and was even somewhat commonplace. That said, Locke’s formulation of the distinction and his analysis of the related issues has been tremendously influential and has provided the framework for much of the subsequent discussion on the topic.

Locke defines a quality as a power that a body has to produce ideas in us. So a simple object like a baked potato which can produce ideas of brownness, heat, ovular shape, solidity, and determinate size must have a series of corresponding qualities. There must be something in the potato which gives us the idea of brown, something in the potato which gives us the idea of ovular shape, and so on. The primary/secondary quality distinction claims that some of these qualities are very different from others.

Locke motivates the distinction between two types of qualities by discussing how a body could produce an idea in us. The theory of perception endorsed by Locke is highly mechanical. All perception occurs as a result of motion and collision. If I smell the baked potato, there must be small material particles which are flying off of the potato and bumping into nerves in my nose, the motion in the nose-nerves causes a chain reaction along my nervous system until eventually there is some motion in my brain and I experience the idea of a certain smell. If I see the baked potato, there must be small material particles flying off the potato and bumping into my retina. That bumping causes a similar chain reaction which ends in my experience of a certain roundish shape.

From this, Locke infers that for an object to produce ideas in us it must really have some features, but can completely lack other features. This mechanical theory of perception requires that objects producing ideas in us have shape, extension, mobility, and solidity. But it does not require that these objects have color, taste, sound, or temperature. So the primary qualities are qualities actually possessed by bodies. These are features that a body cannot be without. The secondary qualities, by contrast, are not really had by bodies. They are just ways of talking about the ideas that can be produced in us by bodies in virtue of their primary qualities. So when we claim that the baked potato is solid, this means that solidity is one of its fundamental features. But when I claim that it smells a certain earthy kind of way, this just means that its fundamental features are capable of producing the idea of the earthy smell in my mind.

These claims lead to Locke’s claims about resemblance: “From whence I think it is easie to draw this Observation, That the Ideas of primary Qualities of Bodies, are Resemblances of them, and their Patterns do really exist in the Bodies themselves; but the Ideas, produced in us by these Secondary Qualities, have no resemblance of them at all.” (2.8.14, 137). Insofar as my idea of the potato is of something solid, extended, mobile, and possessing a certain shape my idea accurately captures something about the real nature of the potato. But insofar as my idea of the potato is of something with a particular smell, temperature, and taste my ideas do not accurately capture mind-independent facts about the potato.

b. Mechanism

Around the time of the Essay the mechanical philosophy was emerging as the predominant theory about the physical world. The mechanical philosophy held that the fundamental entities in the physical world were small individual bodies called corpuscles. Each corpuscle was solid, extended, and had a certain shape. These corpuscles could combine together to form ordinary objects like rocks, tables, and plants. The mechanical philosophy argued that all features of bodies and all natural phenomena could be explained by appeal to these corpuscles and their basic properties (in particular, size, shape, and motion).

Locke was exposed to the mechanical philosophy while at Oxford and became acquainted with the writings of its most prominent advocates. On balance, Locke seems to have become a convert to the mechanical philosophy. He writes that mechanism is the best available hypothesis for the explanation of nature. We have already seen some of the explanatory work done by mechanism in the Essay. The distinction between primary and secondary qualities was a hallmark of the mechanical philosophy and neatly dovetailed with mechanist accounts of perception. Locke reaffirms his commitment to this account of perception at a number of other points in the Essay. And when discussing material objects Locke is very often happy to allow that they are composed of material corpuscles. What is peculiar, however, is that while the Essay does seem to have a number of passages in which Locke supports mechanical explanations and speaks highly of mechanism, it also contains some highly critical remarks about mechanism and discussions of the limits of the mechanical philosophy.

Locke’s critiques of mechanism can be divided into two strands. First, he recognized that there were a number of observed phenomena which mechanism struggled to explain. Mechanism did offer neat explanations of some observed phenomena. For example, the fact that objects could be seen but not smelled through glass could be explained by positing that the corpuscles which interacted with our retinas were smaller than the ones which interacted with our nostrils. So the sight corpuscles could pass through the spaces between the glass corpuscles, but the smell corpuscles would be turned away. But other phenomena were harder to explain. Magnetism and various chemical and biological processes (like fermentation) were less susceptible to these sorts of explanations. And universal gravitation, which Locke took Newton to have proved the existence of in the Principia, was particularly hard to explain. Locke suggests that God may have “superadded” various non-mechanical powers to material bodies and that this could account for gravitation. (Indeed, at several points he even suggests that God may have superadded the power of thought to matter and that humans might be purely material beings.)

Locke’s second set of critiques pertain to theoretical problems in the mechanical philosophy. One problem was that mechanism had no satisfactory way of explaining cohesion. Why do corpuscles sometimes stick together? If things like tables and chairs are just collections of small corpuscles then they should be very easy to break apart, the same way I can easily separate one group of marbles from another. Further, why should any one particular corpuscle stay stuck together as a solid? What accounts for its cohesion? Again, mechanism seems hard-pressed to offer an answer. Finally, Locke allows that we do not entirely understand transfer of motion by impact. When one corpuscle collides with another we actually do not have a very satisfying explanation for why the second moves away under the force of the impact.

Locke presses these critiques with some skill and in a serious manner. Still, ultimately he is guardedly optimistic about mechanism. This somewhat mixed attitude on Locke’s part has led commentators to debate questions about his exact attitude toward the mechanical philosophy and his motivations for discussing it.

c. Volition and Agency

In Book 2, Chapter 21 of the Essay Locke explores the topic of the will. One of the things which separates people from rocks and billiard balls is our ability to make decisions and control our actions. We feel that we are free in certain respects and that we have the power to choose certain thoughts and actions. Locke calls this power the will. But there are tricky questions about what this power consists in and about what it takes to freely (or voluntarily) choose something. 2.21 contains a delicate and sustained discussion of these tricky questions.

Locke first begins with questions of freedom and then proceeds to a discussion of the will. On Locke’s analysis, we are free to do those things which we both will to do and are physically capable of doing. For example, if I wish to jump into a lake and have no physical maladies which prevent it, then I am free to jump into the lake. By contrast, if I do not wish to jump into the lake, but a friend pushes me in, I did not act freely when I entered the water. Or, if I wish to jump into the lake, but have a spinal injury and cannot move my body, then I do not act freely when I stay on the shore. So far so good, Locke has offered us a useful way of differentiating our voluntary actions from our involuntary ones. But there is still a pressing question about freedom and the will: that of whether the will is itself free. When I am deciding whether or not to jump into the water, is the will determined by outside factors to choose one or the other? Or can it, so to speak, make up its own mind and choose either option?

Locke’s initial position in the chapter is that the will is determined. But in later sections he offers a qualification of sorts. In normal circumstances, the will is determined by what Locke calls uneasiness: “What is it that determines the Will in regard to our Actions? … some (and for the most part the most pressing) uneasiness a Man is at present under. That is that which successively determines the Will, and sets us upon those Actions, we perform.” (2.21.31, 250-1). The uneasiness is caused by the absence of something that is perceived as good. The perception of the thing as good gives rise to a desire for that thing. Suppose I choose to eat a slice of pizza. Locke would say I must have made this choice because the absence of the pizza was troubling me somehow (I was feeling hunger pains, or longing for something savory) and this discomfort gave rise to a desire for food. That desire in turn determined my will to choose to eat pizza.

Locke’s qualification to this account of the will being determined by uneasiness has to do with what he calls suspension. Beginning with the second edition of the Essay, Locke began to argue that the most pressing desire for the most part determines the will, but not always: “For the mind having in most cases, as is evident in Experience, a power to suspend the execution and satisfaction of any of its desires, and so all, one after another, is at liberty to consider the objects of them; examine them on all sides, and weigh them with others.” (2.21.47, 263). So even if, at this moment, my desire for pizza is the strongest desire, Locke thinks I can pause before I decide to eat the pizza and consider the decision. I can consider other items in my desire set: my desire to lose weight, or to leave the pizza for my friend, or to keep a vegan diet. Careful consideration of these other possibilities might have the effect of changing my desire set. If I really focus on how important it is to stay fit and healthy by eating nutritious foods then my desire to leave the pizza might become stronger than my desire to eat it and my will may be determined to choose to not eat the pizza. But of course we can always ask whether a person has a choice whether or not to suspend judgment or whether the suspension of judgment is itself determined by the mind’s strongest desire. On this point Locke is somewhat vague. While most interpreters think our desires determine when judgment is suspended, some others disagree and argue that suspension of judgment offers Lockean agents a robust form of free will.

d. Personhood and Personal Identity

Locke was one of the first philosophers to give serious attention to the question of personal identity. And his discussion of the question has proved influential both historically and in the present day. The discussion occurs in the midst of Locke’ larger discussion of the identity conditions for various entities in Book II, Chapter 27. At heart, the question is simple, what makes me the same person as the person who did certain things in the past and that will do certain things in the future? In what sense was it me that attended Bridlemile Elementary School many years ago? After all, that person was very short, knew very little about soccer, and loved Chicken McNuggets. I, on the other hand, am average height, know tons of soccer trivia, and get rather queasy at the thought of eating chicken, especially in nugget form. Nevertheless, it is true that I am identical to the boy who attended Bridlemile.

In Locke’s time, the topic of personal identity was important for religious reasons. Christian doctrine held that there was an afterlife in which virtuous people would be rewarded in heaven and sinful people would be punished in hell. This scheme provided motivation for individuals to behave morally. But, for this to work, it was important that the person who is rewarded or punished is the same person as the one who lived virtuously or lived sinfully. And this had to be true even though the person being rewarded or punished had died, had somehow continued to exist in an afterlife, and had somehow managed to be reunited with a body. So it was important to get the issue of personal identity right.

Locke’s views on personal identity involve a negative project and a positive project. The negative project involves arguing against the view that personal identity consists in or requires the continued existence of a particular substance. And the positive project involves defending the view that personal identity consists in continuity of consciousness. We can begin with this positive view. Locke defines a person as “a thinking intelligent Being, that has reason and reflection, and can consider itself as itself, the same thinking thing in different times and places; which it does only by that consciousness, which is inseparable from thinking, and as it seems to me essential to it.” (2.27.9, 335).  Locke suggests here that part of what makes a person the same through time is their ability to recognize past experiences as belonging to them. For me, part of what differentiates one little boy who attended Bridlemile Elementary from all the other children who went there is my realization that I share in his consciousness. Put differently, my access to his lived experience at Bridlemile is very different from my access to the lived experiences of others there: it is first-personal and immediate. I recognize his experiences there as part of a string of experiences that make up my life and join up to my current self and current experiences in a unified way. That is what makes him the same person as me.

Locke believes that this account of personal identity as continuity of consciousness obviates the need for an account of personal identity given in terms of substances. A traditional view held that there was a metaphysical entity, the soul, which guaranteed personal identity through time; wherever there was the same soul, the same person would be there as well. Locke offers a number of thought experiments to cast doubt on this belief and show that his account is superior. For example, if a soul was wiped clean of all its previous experiences and given new ones (as might be the case if reincarnation were true), the same soul would not justify the claim that all of those who had had it were the same person. Or, we could imagine two souls who had their conscious experiences completely swapped. In this case, we would want to say that the person went with the conscious experiences and did not remain with the soul.

Locke’s account of personal identity seems to be a deliberate attempt to move away from some of the metaphysical alternatives and to offer an account which would be acceptable to individuals from a number of different theological backgrounds. Of course, a number of serious challenges have been raised for Locke’s account.. Most of these focus on the crucial role seemingly played by memory. And the precise details of Locke’s positive proposal in 2.27 have been hard to pin down. Nevertheless, many contemporary philosophers believe that there is an important kernel of truth in Locke’s analysis.

e. Real and Nominal Essences

Locke’s distinction between the real essence of a substance and the nominal essence of a substance is one of the most fascinating components of the Essay. Scholastic philosophers had held that the main goal of metaphysics and science was to learn about the essences of things: the key metaphysical components of things which explained all of their interesting features. Locke thought this project was misguided. That sort of knowledge, knowledge of the real essences of beings, was unavailable to human beings. This led Locke to suggest an alternative way to understand and investigate nature; he recommends focusing on the nominal essences of things.

When Locke introduces the term real essence he uses it to refer to the “real constitution of any Thing, which is the foundation of all those Properties, that are combined in, and are constantly found to co-exist with [an object]” (3.6.6, 442). For the Scholastics this real essence would be an object’s substantial form. For proponents of the mechanical philosophy it would be the number and arrangement of the material corpuscles which composed the body. Locke sometimes endorses this latter understanding of real essence. But he insists that these real essences are entirely unknown and undiscoverable by us. The nominal essences, by contrast, are known and are the best way we have to understand individual substances. Nominal essences are just collections of all the observed features an individual thing has. So the nominal essence of a piece of gold would include the ideas of yellowness, a certain weight, malleability, dissolvability in certain chemicals, and so on.

Locke offers us a helpful analogy to illustrate the difference between real and nominal essences. He suggests that our position with respect to ordinary objects is like the position of someone looking at a very complicated clock. The gears, wheels, weights, and pendulum that produce the motions of the hands on the clock face (the clock’s real essence) are unknown to the person. They are hidden behind the casing. He or she can only know about the observable features like the clock’s shape, the movement of the hands, and the chiming of the hours (the clock’s nominal essence). Similarly, when I look at an object like a dandelion, I am only able to observe its nominal essence (the yellow color, the bitter smell, and so forth). I have no clear idea what produces these features of the dandelion or how they are produced.

Locke’s views on real and nominal essences have important consequences for his views about the division of objects into groups and sorts. Why do we consider some things to be zebras and other things to be rabbits? Locke’s view is that we group according to nominal essence, not according to (unknown) real essence. But this has the consequence that our groupings might fail to adequately reflect whatever real distinctions there might be in nature. So Locke is not a realist about species or types. Instead, he is a conventionalist. We project these divisions on the world when we choose to classify objects as falling under the various nominal essences we’ve created.

f. Religious Epistemology

The epistemology of religion (claims about our understanding of God and our duties with respect to him) were tremendously contentious during Locke’s lifetime. The English Civil War, fought during Locke’s youth, was in large part a disagreement over the right way to understand the Christian religion and the requirements of religious faith. Throughout the seventeenth century, a number of fundamentalist Christian sects continually threatened the stability of English political life. And the status of Catholic and Jewish people in England was a vexed one.

So the stakes were very high when, in 4.18, Locke discussed the nature of faith and reason and their respective domains. He defines reason as an attempt to discover certainty or probability through the use of our natural faculties in the investigation of the world. Faith, by contrast, is certainty or probability attained through a communication believed to have come, originally, from God. So when Smith eats a potato chip and comes to believe it is salty, she believes this according to reason. But when Smith believes that Joshua made the sun stand still in the sky because she read it in the Bible (which she takes to be divine revelation), she believes according to faith.

Although it initially sounds as though Locke has carved out quite separate roles for faith and reason, it must be noted that these definitions make faith subordinate to reason in a subtle way. For, as Locke explains: “Whatever GOD hath revealed, is certainly true; no Doubt can be made of it. This is the proper Object of Faith: But whether it be a divine Revelation, or no, Reason must judge; which can never permit the Mind to reject a greater Evidence to embrace what is less evident, nor allow it to entertain Probability in opposition to Knowledge and Certainty.” (4.18.10, 695). First, Locke thinks that if any proposition, even one which purports to be divinely revealed, clashes with the clear evidence of reason then it should not be believed. So, even if it seems like God is telling us that 1+1=3, Locke claims we should go on believing that 1+1=2 and we should deny that the 1+1=3 revelation was genuine. Second, Locke thinks that to determine whether or not something is divinely revealed we have to exercise our reason. How can we tell whether the Bible contains God’s direct revelation conveyed through the inspired Biblical authors or whether it is instead the work of mere humans? Only reason can help us settle that question. Locke thinks that those who ignore the importance of reason in determining what is and is not a matter of faith are guilty of “enthusiasm.” And in a chapter added to later editions of the Essay Locke sternly warns his readers against the serious dangers posed by this intellectual vice.

In all of this Locke emerges as a strong moderate. He himself was deeply religious and took religious faith to be important. But he also felt that there were serious limits to what could be justified through appeals to faith. The issues discussed in this section will be very important below where Locke’s views on the importance of religious toleration are discussed.

4. Political Philosophy

Locke lived during a very eventful time in English politics. The Civil War, Interregnum, Restoration, Exclusion Crisis, and Glorious Revolution all happened during his lifetime. For much of his life Locke held administrative positions in government and paid very careful attention to contemporary debates in political theory. So it is perhaps unsurprising that he wrote a number of works on political issues. In this field, Locke is best known for his arguments in favor of religious toleration and limited government. Today these ideas are commonplace and widely accepted. But in Locke’s time they were highly innovative, even radical.

a. The Two Treatises

Locke’s Two Treatises of Government were published in 1689. It was originally thought that they were intended to defend the Glorious Revolution and William’s seizure of the throne. We now know, however, that they were in fact composed much earlier. Nonetheless, they do lay out a view of government amenable to many of William’s supporters.

The First Treatise is now of primarily historical interest. It takes the form of a detailed critique of a work called Patriacha by Robert Filmer. Filmer had argued, in a rather unsophisticated way, in favor of divine right monarchy. On his view, the power of kings ultimately originated in the dominion which God gave to Adam and which had passed down in an unbroken chain through the ages. Locke disputes this picture on a number of historical grounds. Perhaps more importantly, Locke also distinguishes between a number of different types of dominion or governing power which Filmer had run together.

After clearing some ground in the First Treatise, Locke offers a positive view of the nature of government in the much better known Second Treatise. Part of Locke’s strategy in this work was to offer a different account of the origins of government. While Filmer had suggested that humans had always been subject to political power, Locke argues for the opposite. According to him, humans were initially in a state of nature. The state of nature was apolitical in the sense that there were no governments and each individual retained all of his or her natural rights. People possessed these natural rights (including the right to attempt to preserve one’s life, to seize unclaimed valuables, and so forth) because they were given by God to all of his people.

The state of nature was inherently unstable. Individuals would be under contrast threat of physical harm. And they would be unable to pursue any goals that required stability and widespread cooperation with other humans. Locke’s claim is that government arose in this context. Individuals, seeing the benefits which could be gained, decided to relinquish some of their rights to a central authority while retaining other rights. This took the form of a contract. In agreement for relinquishing certain rights, individuals would receive protection from physical harm, security for their possessions, and the ability to interact and cooperate with other humans in a stable environment.

So, according to this view, governments were instituted by the citizens of those governments. This has a number of very important consequences. On this view, rulers have an obligation to be responsive to the needs and desires of these citizens. Further, in establishing a government the citizens had relinquished some, but not all of their original rights. So no ruler could claim absolute power over all elements of a citizen’s life. This carved out important room for certain individual rights or liberties. Finally, and perhaps most importantly, a government which failed to adequately protect the rights and interests of its citizens or a government which attempted to overstep its authority would be failing to perform the task for which it was created. As such, the citizens would be entitled to revolt and replace the existing government with one which would suitably carry out the duties of ensuring peace and civil order while respecting individual rights.

So Locke was able to use the account of natural rights and a government created through contract to accomplish a number of important tasks. He could use it to show why individuals retain certain rights even when they are subject to a government. He could use it to show why despotic governments which attempted to unduly infringe on the rights of their citizens were bad. And he could use it to show that citizens had a right to revolt in instances where governments failed in certain ways. These are powerful ideas which remain important even today.

For more. see the article Political Philosophy.

b. Property

Locke’s Second Treatise on government contains an influential account of the nature of private property. According to Locke, God gave humans the world and its contents to have in common. The world was to provide humans with what was necessary for the continuation and enjoyment of life. But Locke also believed it was possible for individuals to appropriate individual parts of the world and justly hold them for their own exclusive use. Put differently, Locke believed that we have a right to acquire private property.

Locke’s claim is that we acquire property by mixing our labor with some natural resource. For example, if I discover some grapes growing on a vine, through my labor in picking and collecting these grapes I acquire an ownership right over them. If I find an empty field and then use my labor to plow the field then plant and raise crops, I will be the proper owner of those crops. If I chop down trees in an unclaimed forest and use the wood to fashion a table, then that table will be mine. Locke places two important limitations on the way in which property can be acquired by mixing one’s labor with natural resources. First, there is what has come to be known as the Waste Proviso. One must not take so much property that some of it goes to waste. I should not appropriate gallons and gallons of grapes if I am only able to eat a few and the rest end up rotting. If the goods of the Earth were given to us by God, it would be inappropriate to allow some of this gift to go to waste. Second, there is the Enough-And-As-Good Proviso. This says that in appropriating resources I am required to leave enough and as good for others to appropriate. If the world was left to us in common by God, it would be wrong of me to appropriate more than my fair share and fail to leave sufficient resources for others.

After currency is introduced and after governments are established the nature of property obviously changes a great deal. Using metal, which can be made into coins and which does not perish the way foodstuffs and other goods do, individuals are able to accumulate much more wealth than would be possible otherwise. So the proviso concerning waste seems to drop away. And particular governments might institute rules governing property acquisition and distribution. Locke was aware of this and devoted a great deal of thought to the nature of property and the proper distribution of property within a commonwealth. His writings on economics, monetary policy, charity, and social welfare systems are evidence of this. But Locke’s views on property inside of a commonwealth have received far less attention than his views on the original acquisition of property in the state of nature.

c. Toleration

Locke had been systematically thinking about issues relating to religious toleration since his early years in London and even though he only published his Epistola de Tolerantia (A Letter Concerning Toleration) in 1689 he had finished writing it several years before. The question of whether or not a state should attempt to prescribe one particular religion within the state, what means states might use to do so, and what the correct attitude should be toward those who resist conversion to the official state religion had been central to European politics ever since the Protestant Reformation. Locke’s time in England, France, and the Netherlands had given him experiences of three very different approaches to these questions. These experiences had convinced him that, for the most part, individuals should be allowed to practice their religion without interference from the state. Indeed, part of the impetus for the publication of Locke’s Letter Concerning Toleration came from Louis XIV’s revocation of the Edict of Nantes, which took away the already limited rights of Protestants in France and exposed them to state persecution.

It is possible to see Locke’s arguments in favor of toleration as relating both to the epistemological views of the Essay and the political views of the Two Treatises. Relating to Locke’s epistemological views, recall from above that Locke thought the scope of human knowledge was extremely restricted. We might not be particularly good at determining what the correct religion is. There is no reason to think that those holding political power will be any better at discovering the true religion than anyone else, so they should not attempt to enforce their views on others. Instead, each individual should be allowed to pursue true beliefs as best as they are able. Little harm results from allowing others to have their own religious beliefs.  Indeed, it might be beneficial to allow a plurality of beliefs because one group might end up with the correct beliefs and win others over to their side.

Relating to Locke’s political views, as expressed in the Two Treatises, Locke endorses toleration on the grounds that the enforcement of religious conformity is outside the proper scope of government. People consent to governments for the purpose of establishing social order and the rule of law. Governments should refrain from enforcing religious conformity because doing so is unnecessary and irrelevant for these ends. Indeed, attempting to enforce conformity may positively harm these ends as it will likely lead to resistance from members of prohibited religions. Locke also suggests that governments should tolerate the religious beliefs of individual citizens because enforcing religious belief is actually impossible. Acceptance of a certain religion is an inward act, a function of one’s beliefs. But governments are designed to control people’s actions. So governments are, in many ways, ill-equipped to enforce the adoption of a particular religion because individual people have an almost perfect control of their own thoughts.

While Locke’s views on toleration were very progressive for the time and while his views do have an affinity with our contemporary consensus on the value of religious toleration it is important to recognize that Locke did place some severe limits on toleration. He did not think that we should tolerate the intolerant, those who would seek to forcibly impose their religious views on others. Similarly, any religious group who posed a threat to political stability or public safety should not be tolerated. Importantly, Locke included Roman Catholics in this group. On his view, Catholics had a fundamental allegiance to the Pope, a foreign prince who did not recognize the sovereignty of English law. This made Catholics a threat to civil government and peace. Finally, Locke also believed that atheists should not be tolerated. Because they did not believe they would be rewarded or punished for their actions in an afterlife, Locke did not think they could be trusted to behave morally or maintain their contractual obligations.

5. Theology

We have already seen that in the Essay Locke developed an account of belief according to faith and belief according to reason. Recall that an agent believes according to reason when she discovers something through the use of her natural faculties and she believes according to faith when she takes something as truth because she understands it to be a message from God. Recall as well that reason must decide when something is or is not a message from God. The goal of Locke’s The Reasonableness of Christianity is to show that it is reasonable to be a Christian. Locke argues that we do have sufficient reason to think that the central truths of Christianity were communicated to us by God through his messenger, Jesus of Nazareth.

For Locke’s project to succeed he needed to show that Jesus provided his original followers with sufficient evidence that he was a legitimate messenger from God. Given that numerous individuals in history had purported to be the recipients of divine revelation, there must be something special which set Jesus apart. Locke offers two considerations in this regard. The first is that Jesus fulfilled a number of historical predictions concerning the coming of a Messiah. The second is that Jesus performed a number of miracles which attest that he had a special relationship to God. Locke also claims that we have sufficient reason to believe that these miracles actually occurred on the basis of testimony from those who witnessed them first-hand and a reliable chain of reporting from Jesus’ time into our own. This argument leads Locke into a discussion of the types and value of testimony which many philosophers have found to be interesting in its own right.

One striking feature of The Reasonableness of Christianity is the requirement for salvation that Locke endorses. Disputes about which precise beliefs were necessary for salvation and eternal life in Heaven were at the core of much religious disagreement in Locke’s time. Different denominations and sects claimed that they, and often only they, had the correct beliefs. Locke, by contrast, argued that to be a true Christian and worthy of salvation an individual only need to believe one simple truth: that Jesus is the Messiah. Of course, Locke believed there were many other important truths in the Bible. But he thought these other truths, especially those contained in the Epistles rather than the Gospels, could be difficult to interpret and could lead to disputes and disagreement. The core tenet of Christianity, however, that Jesus is the Messiah, was a mandatory belief.

In making the requirements for Christian faith and salvation so minimal Locke was part of a growing faction in the Church of England. These individuals, often known as latitudinarians, were deliberately attempting to construct a more irenic Christianity with the goal of avoiding the conflict and controversy that previous internecine fights had produced. So Locke was hardly alone in attempting to find a set of core Christian commitments which were free of sectarian theological baggage. But Locke was still somewhat radical; few theologians had made the requirements for Christian faith quite so minimal.

6. Education

Locke was regarded by many in his time as an expert on educational matters. He taught many students at Oxford and also served as a private tutor. Locke’s correspondence shows that he was constantly asked to recommend tutors and offer pedagogical advice. Locke’s expertise led to his most important work on the subject: Some Thoughts Concerning Education. The work had its origins in a series of letters Locke wrote to Edward Clarke offering advice on the education of Clarke’s children and was first published in 1693.

Locke’s views on education were, for the time, quite forward-looking. Classical languages, usually learned through tedious exercises involving rote memorization, and corporeal punishment were two predominant features of the seventeenth century English educational system. Locke saw little use for either. Instead, he emphasized the importance of teaching practical knowledge. He recognized that children learn best when they are engaged with the subject matter. Locke also foreshadowed some contemporary pedagogical views by suggesting that children should be allowed some self-direction in their course of study and should have the ability to pursue their interests.

Locke believed it was important to take great care in educating the young. He recognized that habits and prejudices formed in youth could be very hard to break in later life. Thus, much of Some Thoughts Concerning Education focuses on morality and the best ways to inculcate virtue and industry. Locke rejected authoritarian approaches. Instead, he favored methods that would help children to understand the difference between right and wrong and to cultivate a moral sense of their own.

7. Locke’s Influence

The Essay was quickly recognized as an important philosophical contribution both by its admirers and by its critics. Before long it had been incorporated into the curriculum at Oxford and Cambridge and its translation into both Latin and French garnered it an audience on the Continent as well. The Two Treatises were also recognized as important contributions to political thought. While the work had some success in England among those favorably disposed to the Glorious Revolution, its primary impact was abroad. During the American Revolution (and to a lesser extent, during the French Revolution) Locke’s views were often appealed to by those seeking to establish more representative forms of government.

Related to this last point, Locke came to be seen, alongside his friend Newton, as an embodiment of Enlightenment values and ideals. Newtonian science would lay bare the workings of nature and lead to important technological advances. Lockean philosophy would lay bare the workings of men’s minds and lead to important reforms in law and government. Voltaire played an instrumental role in shaping this legacy for Locke and worked hard to publicize Locke’s views on reason, toleration, and limited government. Locke also came to be seen as an inspiration for the Deist movement. Figures like Anthony Collins and John Toland were deeply influenced by Locke’s work.

Locke is often recognized as the founder of British Empiricism and it is true that Locke laid the foundation for much of English-language philosophy in the 18th and early 19th centuries. But those who followed in his footsteps were not unquestioning followers. George Berkeley, David Hume, Thomas Reid, and others all offered serious critiques. In recent decades, readers have attempted to offer more charitable reconstructions of Locke’s philosophy. Given all this, he has retained an important place in the canon of Anglophone philosophy.

8. References and Further Reading

a. Locke’s Works

  • Laslett, P. [ed.] 1988. Two Treatises of Government. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Locke, J. 1823. The Works of John Locke. London: Printed for T. Tegg (10 volumes).
  • Locke, J. The Clarendon Edition of the Works of John Locke, Oxford University Press, 2015. This edition includes the following volumes:
  • Nidditch, P. [ed.] 1975. An Essay Concerning Human Understanding.
  • Nidditch, P. and G.A.J. Rogers [eds.] 1990. Drafts for the Essay Concerning Human Understanding.
  • Yolton, J.W. and J.S. Yolton. [eds.] 1989. Some Thoughts Concerning Education.
  • Higgins-Biddle, J.C. [ed.] 1999. The Reasonableness of Christianity.
  • Milton, J.R. and P. Milton. [eds.] 2006. An Essay Concerning Toleration.
  • de Beer, E.S. [ed.] 1976-1989. The Correspondence of John Locke. (8 volumes).
  • von Leyden, W. [ed.] 1954. Essays on the Law of Nature. Oxford: Clarendon Press.

b. Recommended Reading

The following are recommendations for further reading on Locke. Each work has a brief statement indicating the contents

  • Anstey, P. 2011. John Locke & Natural Philosophy. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • A thorough examination of Locke’s scientific and medical thinking.
  • Ayers, M.  1993. Locke: Epistemology and Ontology. New York: Routledge.
  • A classic in Locke studies. Explores philosophical topics in the Essay and discusses Locke’s project as a whole. One volume on epistemology and one on metaphysics.
  • Chappell, V. 1994. The Cambridge Companion to Locke. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • A series of essays focusing on all aspects of Locke’s thought.
  • LoLordo, A. 2012. Locke’s Moral Man. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • An exploration and discussion of themes at the intersection of Locke’s moral and political thought. Focuses particularly on agency, personhood, and rationality.
  • Lowe, E.J. 2005. Locke. New York: Routledge.
  • An introductory overview of Locke’s philosophical and political thought.
  • Mackie, J.L. 1976. Problems from Locke.  Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Uses Locke’s work to raise and discuss a number of philosophical issues and puzzles.
  • Newman, L. 2007. The Cambridge Companion to Locke’s Essay Concerning Human Understanding. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • A series of essays focusing on specific issues in Locke’s Essay.
  • Pyle, A.J. 2013. Locke. London: Polity.
  • An excellent and brief introduction to Locke’s thought and historical context. A very good place to start for beginners.
  • Rickless, S. 2014. Locke. Malden, MA: Blackwell.
  • An introductory overview of Locke’s philosophical and political thought.
  • Stuart, M. 2013. Locke’s Metaphysics. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • An in-depth treatment of metaphysical issues and problems in the Essay.
  • Waldron, J. 2002. God, Locke, and Equality: Christian Foundation of Locke’s Political Thought. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • An examination of some key issues in Locke’s political thought.
  • Woolhouse, R. 2009. Locke: A Biography. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • The best and most recent biography of Locke’s life.

 

Author Information

Patrick J. Connolly
Email: pconnoll@iastate.edu
Iowa State University
U. S. A.