Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

John Locke (1632-1704)

lockeThe British philosopher John Locke was especially known for his liberal, anti-authoritarian theory of the state, his empirical theory of knowledge, his advocacy of religious toleration, and his theory of personal identity.

In his own time, he was  famous for arguing that the divine right of kings is supported neither by scripture nor by the use of reason. In developing his theory of our duty to obey the state, he attacked the idea that might makes right: Starting from an initial state of nature with no government, police or private property, we humans could discover by careful reasoning that there are natural laws which suggest that we have natural rights to our own persons and to our own labor. Eventually we could discover that we should create a social contract with others, and out of this contract emerges our political obligations and the institution of private property. This is how reasoning places limits on the proper use of power by government authorities.

Regarding epistemology, Locke disagreed with Descartes‘ rationalist theory that knowledge is any idea that seems clear and distinct to us. Instead, Locke claimed that knowledge is direct awareness of facts concerning the agreement or disagreement among our ideas. By “ideas,” he meant mental objects, and by assuming that some of these mental objects represent non-mental objects he inferred that this is why we can have knowledge of a world external to our minds. Although we can know little for certain and must rely on probabilities, he believed it is our God-given obligation to obtain knowledge and not always to acquire our beliefs by accepting the word of authorities or common superstition. Ideally our beliefs should be held firmly or tentatively depending on whether the evidence is strong or weak. He praised the scientific reasoning of Boyle and Newton as exemplifying this careful formation of beliefs. He said that at birth our mind has no innate ideas; it is blank, a tabula rasa. As our mind gains simple ideas from sensation, it forms complex ideas from these simple ideas by processes of combination, division, generalization and abstraction. Radical for his time, Locke asserted that in order to help children not develop bad habits of thinking, they should be trained to base their beliefs on sound evidence, to learn how to collect this evidence, and to believe less strongly when the evidence is weaker.

We all can have knowledge of God‘s existence by attending to the quality of the evidence available to us, primarily the evidence from miracles. Our moral obligations, says Locke, are divine commands. We can learn about those obligations both by God’s revealing them to us and by our natural capacities to discover natural laws. He hoped to find a deductive system of ethics in analogy to our deductive system of truths of geometry.

Regarding personal identity, Locke provided an original argument that our being the same person from one time to another consists neither in our having the same soul nor the same body, but rather the same consciousness.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Writings
    1. Plan of the Essay
      1. Ideas in General
      2. Simple and Complex Ideas
      3. Primary and Secondary Qualities
      4. Knowledge of Mathematics, Ethics, the Self, and God
      5. Sensitive Knowledge of the External World
      6. Judgment
    2. Two Treatises of Government
    3. Economic Writings
    4. Letters on Religious Toleration
    5. Theological Writings
    6. Educational Writings
  3. References and Further Reading

1. Life

John Locke was born at Wrington, a village in Somerset, on August 29, 1632. He was the son of a country solicitor and small landowner who, when the civil war broke out, served as a captain of horse in the parliamentary army. “I no sooner perceived myself in the world than I found myself in a storm,” he wrote long afterwards, during the lull in the storm which followed the king’s return. But political unrest does not seem to have seriously disturbed the course of his education. He entered Westminster school in 1646, and passed to Christ Church, Oxford, as a junior student, in 1652; and he had a home there (though absent from it for long periods) for more than thirty years — till deprived of his studentship by royal mandate in 1684. The official studies of the university were uncongenial to him; he would have preferred to have learned philosophy from Descartes instead of from Aristotle; but evidently he satisfied the authorities, for he was elected to a senior studentship in 1659, and, in the three or four years following, he took part in the tutorial work of the college. At one time he seems to have thought of the clerical profession as a possible career; but he declined an offer of preferment in 1666, and in the same year obtained a dispensation which enabled him to hold his studentship without taking orders. About the same time we hear of his interest in experimental science, and he was elected a fellow of the Royal Society in 1668. Little is known of his early medical studies. He cannot have followed the regular course, for he was unable to obtain the degree of doctor of medicine. It was not till 1674 that he graduated as bachelor of medicine. In the following January his position in Christ Church was regularized by his appointment to one of the two medical studentships of the college.

His knowledge of medicine and occasional practice of the art led, in 1666, to an acquaintance with Lord Ashley (afterwards, from 1672, Earl of Shaftesbury). The acquaintance, begun accidentally, had an immediate effect on Locke’s career. Without serving his connection with Oxford, he became a member of Shaftesbury’s household, and seems soon to have been looked upon as indispensable in all matters domestic and political. He saved the statesman’s life by a skillful operation, arranged a suitable marriage for his heir, attended the lady in her confinement, and directed the nursing and education of her son — afterwards famous as the author of Characteristics. He assisted Shaftesbury also in public business, commercial and political, and followed him into the government service. When Shaftesbury was made lord chancellor in 1672, Locke became his secretary for presentations to benefices, and, in the following year, was made secretary to the board of trade. In 1675 his official life came to an end for the time with the fall of his chief.

Locke’s health, always delicate, suffered from the London climate. When released from the cares of office, he left England in search of health. Ten years earlier he had his first experience of foreign travel and of public employment, as secretary to Sir Walter Vane, ambassador to the Elector of Brandenburg during the first Dutch war. On his return to England, early in 1666, he declined an offer of further service in Spain, and settled again in Oxford, but was soon induced by Shaftesbury to spend a great part of his time in London. On his release from office in 1675 he sought milder air in the south of France, made leisurely journeys, and settled down for many months at Montpellier. The journal which he kept at this period is full of minute descriptions of places and customs and institutions. It contains also a record of many of the reflections that afterwards took shape in the Essay concerning Human Understanding. he returned to England in 1679, when his patron had again a short spell of office. He does not seem to have been concerned in Shaftesbury’s later schemes; but suspicion naturally fell upon him, and he found it prudent to take refuge in Holland. This he did in August 1683, less than a year after the flight and death of Shaftesbury. Even in Holland for some time he was not safe from danger of arrest at the instance of the English government; he moved from town to town, lived under an assumed name, and visited his friends by stealth. His residence in Holland brought political occupations with it, among the men who were preparing the English revolution. it had at least equal value in the leisure which it gave him for literary work and in the friendships which it offered. In particular, he formed a close intimacy with Philip van Limbroch, the leader of the Remonstrant clergy, and the scholar and liberal theologian to whom Epistola de Tolerantia was dedicated. This letter was completed in 1685, though not published at the time; and, before he left for England, in February 1689, the Essay concerning Human Understanding seems to have attained its final form, and an abstract of it was published in Leclerc’sBibliotheque universelle in 1688.

The new government recognized his services to the cause of freedom by the offer of the post of ambassador either at Berlin or at Vienna. But Locke was no place hunter; he was solicitous also on account of his health; his earlier experience of Germany led him to fear the “cold air” and “warm drinking”; and the high office was declined. But he served less important offices at home. He was made commissioner of appeals in May 1689, and, from 1696 to 1700, he was a commissioner of trade and plantations at a salary of L1000 a year. Although official duties called him to town for protracted periods, he was able to fix his residence in the country. In 1691 he was persuaded to make his permanent home at Oates in Essex, in the house of Francis and Lady Masham. Lady Masham was a daughter of Cudworth, the Cambridge Platonist; Lock had manifested a growing sympathy with his type of liberal theology; intellectual affinity increased his friendship with the family at Oates; and he continued to live with them till his death on October 28, 1704.

2. Writings

With the exception of the abstract of the Essay and other less important contributions to the Bibliotheque universelle, Locke had not published anything before his return to England in 1689; and by this time he was in his fifty-seventh year. But many years of reflection and preparation made him ready at that time to publish books in rapid succession. In March 1689 his Epistola de Tolerantia was published in Holland; an English translation of the same, by William Popple, appeared later in the same year, and in a corrected edition in 1690. The controversy which followed this work led, on Locke’s part, to the publication of a Second Letter (1690), and then a Third Letter (1692). In February 1690 the book entitled Two Treatises of Government was published, and in March of the same year appeared the long expected Essay concerning Human Understanding, on which he had been at work intermittently since 1671. it met with immediate success, and led to a voluminous literature of attack and reply; young fellows of colleges tried to introduce it at the universities, and heads of houses sat in conclave to devise means for its suppression. To one of his critics Locke replied at length. This was Edward Stillingfleet, bishop of Worcester, who, in his Vindication of the Doctrine of the Trinity (1696), had attacked the new philosophy. It was the theological consequences which were drawn from the doctrines of theEssay, not so much by Locke himself as by Toland, in his Christianity not Mysterious, that the bishop had chiefly in view; in philosophy for its own sake he does not seem to have been interested. But his criticism drew attention to one of the least satisfactory (if also one of the most suggestive) doctrines of the Essay — its explanation of the idea of substance; and discredit was thrown on the “new way of ideas” in general. In January 1697 Locke replied in A Letter to the Bishop of Worcester. Stillingfleet answered this in May; and Locke was ready with a second letter in August. Stillingfleet replied in 1698, and Locke’s lengthy third letter appeared in 1699. The bishop’s death, later in the same year, put an end to the controversy. The second edition of the Essay was published in 1694, the third in 1695, and the fourth in 1700. The second and fourth editions contained important additions. An abridgement of it appeared in 1696, by John Wynne, fellow of Jesus College, Oxford; it was translated into Latin and into French soon after the appearance of the fourth edition. The later editions contain many modifications due to the author’s correspondence with William Molyneux, of Trinity College, Dublin, a devoted disciple, for whom Locke had a worm friendship. Other correspondents and visitors to Oates during these years were Isaac Newton and Anthony Collins, a young squire of the neighborhood, who afterwards made his mark in the intellectual controversies of the time.

Other interests also occupied Locke during the years following the publication of his great work. The financial difficulties of the new government led in 1691 to his publication of Some Considerations of the Consequences of Lowering of Interest, and Raising the Value of Money, and of Further Considerations on the latter question, four years later. In 1693 he published Some Thoughts concerning Education, a work founded on letters written to a friend, and in 1695 appeared The Reasonableness of Christianity, and later A Vindication of the same against certain objections; and this was followed by a second vindication two years afterwards. Locke’s religious interest had always been strongly marked, and, in he later years of his life, much of his tie was given to theology. Among the writings of his which were published after his death are commentaries on the Pauline epistles, and a Discourse on Miracles, as well as a fragment of aFourth Letter for Toleration. The posthumously published writings include further An Examination of Father Malebranche’s Opinion of Seeing all things in God, Remarks on Some of Mr Norris’s Books, and — most important of all — the small treatise on The Conduct of the Understanding which had been originally designed as a chapter of the Essay.

a. Plan of the Essay

Locke’s greatest philosophical contribution is his Essay, and we have his own account of the origin of that work. In the winter of 1670, five or six friends were conversing in his room, probably in London. The topic was the “principles of morality and revealed religion,” but difficulties arose and no progress was made. Then, he goes on to say, “it came into my thoughts that we took a wrong course, and that before we set ourselves upon inquiries of that nature, it was necessary to examine our own abilities, and see what objects our understandings were, or were not, fitted to deal with.” At the request of his friends, Locke agreed to set down his thoughts on this question at their next meeting, and he expected that a single sheet of paper would suffice for the purpose. Little did he realize the magnitude of the issue which he raised, and that it would occupy his leisure for nearly twenty years.

Locke’s interest centers on traditional philosophical topics: the nature of the self, the world, God, and the grounds of our knowledge of them. We reach these questions only in the fourth and last book of the Essay. The first three books are preliminary, though they have, and Locke saw that they had, an importance of their own. His introductory sentence makes this plain:

Since it is the understanding that sets man above the rest of sensible beings, and gives him all the advantage and dominion which he has over them; it is certainly a subject, even for its nobleness, worth our labour to inquire into. The understanding, like the eye, while it makes us see and perceive all other things, takes no notice of itself; and it requires art and pains to set it at a distance and make it its own object. But whatever be the difficulties that lie in the way of this inquiry; whatever it be that keeps us so much in the dark to ourselves; sure I am that all the light we can let in upon our minds, all the acquaintance we can make with our own understandings, will not only be very pleasant, but bring us great advantage, in directing our thoughts in the search of other things.

Locke will not “meddle with the physical consideration of the mind”; he has no theory about its essence or its relation to the body; at the same time, he has no doubt that, if due pains be taken, the understanding can be studied like anything else: we can observe its object and the ways in which it operates upon them. The Essay is divided into four books; the first is a polemic against the doctrine of innate principles and ideas. The second deals with ideas, the third with words, and the fourth with knowledge.

i. Ideas in General

All the objects of the understanding are described as ideas, and ideas are spoken of as being in the mind (Intro. 2; Bk. 2:1:5; Bk. 2:8:8). Locke’s first problem, therefore, is to trace the origin and history of ideas, and the ways in which the understanding operates upon them, in order that he may be able to see what knowledge is and how far it reaches. This wide use of the term “idea” is inherited from Descartes. The contemporary term which corresponds with it most nearly is “presentation”. But presentation is, strictly, only one variety of Locke’s idea, which includes also representation and image, perception, and concept or notion. His usage of the term thus differs so widely from the old Platonic meaning that the danger of confusion between them is not great. It suited the author’s purpose also from being a familiar word in ordinary discourse as well as in the language of philosophers. Herein, however, lays danger from which he did not escape. In common usage “idea” carries with it a suggestion of contrast with reality; this is not supposed in Locke’s use.

In the first book of the Essay, on the subject of innate ideas, Locke points to the variety of human experience, and to the difficulty of forming general and abstract ideas, and he ridicules the view that any such ideas can be antecedent to experience. All the parts of our knowledge, he insists, have the same rank and the same history regarding their origin in experience. It is in its most extreme form that the doctrine of innate ideas is attacked; but he cannot seen any middle ground between that extreme doctrine and his own view that all ideas have their origin in experience. Indeed, it is difficult to determine against whom the argument is directed. But when we note Locke’s polemical interest in the question, and remember the significance for him of the empirical origin of all the elements of human knowledge, we can be content to see in it an earnest protest against the principle of authority, a vindication of our right to examine critically all the so-called “principles” of human knowledge.

Locke wishes to avoid any presupposition about matter, or mind, or their relation. It is not difficult to see that the notions which he has expelled often re-enter. But the peculiar value of his approach consists in his attempt to keep clear of them. He begins neither with ind nor matter, but with ideas. Their existence needs no proof: “everyone is conscious of them in himself, and men’s words and actions will satisfy him that they are in others.” His first inquiry is “how they come into the mind”; has next business is to show that they constitute the whole material of our knowledge. In his answer to the former question we discover the influence of traditional philosophy, or rather of ordinary common sense views of existence, upon his views. All our ideas, he says, come from experience. The mind has no innate ideas, but it has innate faculties: it perceives, remembers, and combines the ideas that come to it from without; it also desires, deliberates, and wills; and these mental activities are themselves the source of a new class of ideas. Experience is therefore twofold. Our observation may be employed either about external sensible objects, or about the internal operations of our minds. The former is the source of most of the ideas which we have, and, as it depends “wholly upon our senses,” is called “sensation.” The latter is a source of ideas which “every man has wholly in himself,” and it might be called “internal sense”; to it he gives the name “reflection.”

ii. Simple and Complex Ideas

There are no innate ideas “stamped upon the mind” from birth; and yet impressions of sense are not the only source of knowledge: “The mind furnishes the understanding with ideas” (Bk. 2:1:5). No distinction is implied here between “mind” and “understanding”, so that the sentence might run, “the mind furnishes itself with ideas.” As to what these ideas are, we are not left in doubt: they are “ideas of its own operations.” When the mind acts, it has an idea of its action, that is, it is self-conscious, and, as such, is assumed to be an original source of our knowledge. Hume and Condilac both refused to admit reflection as an original source of ideas, and both, accordingly, found that they had to face the problem of tracing the growth of self-consciousness out of a succession of sensations. According to Locke, reflection is an original, rather than an independent, source of ideas. Without sensation mind would have nothing to operate upon, and therefore could have no ideas of its operations. It is “when he first has any sensation” that “a man begins to have any ideas” (Bk. 2:1:23). The operations of the mind are not themselves produced by sensation, but sensation is required to give the mind material for working on.

The ideas which sensation gives “enter by the senses simple and unmixed” (Bk. 2:2:1); they stand in need of the activity of mind to bind them into the complex unities required for knowledge. The complex ideas of substance, modes, and relations are all the product of the combining and abstracting activity of mind operating upon simple ideas, which have been given, without any connection, by sensation or reflection. Locke’s account of knowledge thus has two sides. On the one side, all the material of knowledge is traced to the simple idea. On the other side, the processes which transform this crude material into knowledge are activities of mind which themselves cannot be reduced to ideas. Locke’s metaphors of the tabula rasa, “white paper” (Bk. 2:2:1), and “dark room” misled his critics and suggested to some of his followers a theory very different from his own. The metaphors only illustrate what he had in hand at the moment. Without experience, no characters are written on the “tablets” of the mind; except through the “windows” of sensation and reflection, no light enters the understanding. No ideas are innate; and there is no source of new simple ideas other than those two. But knowledge involves relations, and relations are the work of the mind; it requires complex ideas, and complex ideas are mental formations. Simple ideas do not, of themselves, enter into relation and form complex ideas. Locke does not, like Hobbes before him and Hume and Condillac after him, look to some unexplained natural attraction of idea for idea as bringing about these formations. Indeed, his treatment of “the association of ideas” is an afterthought, and did not appear in the earlier editions of the Essay.

Starting from the simple ideas which we get from sensation, or from observing mental operations as they take place, Locke has two things to explain: the universal element, that is, the general conceptions with which knowledge is concerned or which it implies; and the reference to reality which it claims. With the former problem Locke deals at great length; and the general method of his exposition is clear enough. Complex ideas arise from simple ideas by the processes of combination and abstraction carried out by the mind. It would be unfair to expect completeness from his enterprise: but it cannot be denied that his intricate and subtle discussions left many problems unsolved. Indeed, this is one of his great merits. He raised questions in such a way as to provoke further enquiry. Principles such as the causal relation, apart from which knowledge of nature would be impossible, are quietly taken for granted, often without any enquiry into the grounds for assuming them. Further, the difficulty of accounting for universals is unduly simplified by describing certain products as simple ideas, although thought has obviously been at work upon them.

In this connection an important inconsistency becomes apparent in his account of the primary data of experience. It is, indeed, impossible even to name the mere particular — the “this, here, and now” of sense — without giving it a flavor of generality. But, at the outset, Locke tries to get as near it as possible. Simple ideas (of sensation) are exemplified by yellow, white, heat, cold, soft, hard, and so forth (Bk. 2:1:3). But, towards the end of the second book (Bk. 2:21:75), a very different list is given: extension, solidity, and mobility (from sensation); perceptivity and motivity (from reflection); and existence, duration, and number (from both sensation and reflection). These are said to be “our original ideas,” and the rest to be “derived” form or to “depend” on them. It is difficult to compare the two lists, instance by instance; but one example may be taken. According to the first list, hard is a simple idea; according to the second list, solidity is the original (and therefore simple) idea, and hard will be derived from it and depend on it. It is clear that, in making the former list, Lock was trying to get back to the primary data of our individual experience; whereas, in the second list, he is rather thinking of the objective reality on which our experience depends and which, he assumes, it reveals. But he does not observe the difference. He seems to forget his view that the original of all knowledge is to be found in the particular, in something “simple and unmixed.” Thus he says without hesitation, “If any one asks me, what this solidity is, I send him to the senses to inform him. Let him put a flint of a football between his hands, and then endeavour to join them, and he will know” (Bk. 2:4:4). But he will not know without going a long way beyond the simple idea. The simple ideas in the case are certain muscular and tactual sensations; and he interprets these by other means (including knowledge of external objects and his own organism) when he says that the flint or the football is solid.

His doctrine of modes is also affected by this same inattention of the fact that a simple idea must be really simple. Thus he holds that “space and extension” is a simple idea given both by sight and by touch (Bk. 2:4). One would expect, therefore, that the original and simple idea of space would be the particular patch seen at any moment or the particular “feel” of the exploring limb. But we are told that “each idea of any different distance, or space, is a simple mode” or the idea of space (Bk. 2:8:4). Here again the simple idea is generalized. He professes to begin with the mere particulars of external and internal sense, and to show how knowledge — which is necessarily general — is evolved from them. But, in doing so, he assumes a general or universal element as already given in the simple idea.

Having gone so far, he might almost have been expected to take a further step and treat the perceptions of particular things as modes of the simple idea substance. But this he does not do. Substance is an idea regarding which he was in earnest with his own fundamental theory (however, he was perplexed about the origin of the idea of “substance in general” as well as of the ideas of “particular sorts of substances; Bk. 2:23:2-3). He admits that substance is a complex idea; that is to say, it is formed by the mind’s action out of simple ideas. Now, this idea of substance marks the difference between having sensations and perceiving things. Its importance, therefore, is clear; but there is no clearness in explaining it. We are told that there is a “supposed or confused idea of substance” to which are joined, for example, “the simple idea of a dull whitish colour, with certain degrees of weight, hardness, ductility and fusibility,” and, as a result, “we have the idea of lead.”

A difficulty might have been avoided if substance could have been interpreted as simply the combination by the understanding of white, hard, etc., or some similar cluster of ideas of sensation. But it was not Locke’s way thus to ignore facts. He sees that something more is needed than these ideas of sensation. They are only joined to “the supposed or confused idea of substance,” which is there and “always the first and chief” (Bk. 2:12:6). He holds to it that the idea is a complex idea and so mad by the mind; but he is entirely at a loss to account for the materials out of which it is made. We cannot imagine how simple ideas can subsist by themselves, and so “we accustom ourselves to suppose some substratum wherein they do subsist,” and this we call substance. In one place, he even vacillates between the assertions that we have no clear idea of substance and that we have no idea of it at all ” (Bk. 1:3:19). It is “a supposition of he knows not what.” This uncertainty, as will appear presently, throws its shadow over our whole knowledge of nature.

iii. Primary and Secondary Qualities

The “new way of ideas” is thus hard put to it in accounting for the universal element in knowledge; it has even greater difficulties to face in defending the reality of knowledge. And, in the latter case, the author does not see the difficulties so clearly. His view is that the simple idea is the test and standard of reality. Whatever the mind contributes to our ideas removes them further from the reality of things; in becoming general, knowledge loses touch with things. But not all simple ideas carry with them the same significance for reality. Colours, smells, tastes, sounds, and the like are simple ideas, yet nothing resembles them in the bodies themselves; but, owing to a certain bulk, figure, and motion of their insensible parts, bodies have “a power to produce those sensations in us.” These, therefore, as called “secondary qualities of bodies.” On the other hand, “solidity, extension, figure, motion or rest, and number” are also held by Locke to be simple ideas; and these are resemblances of qualities in body; “their patterns do really exist in the bodies themselves”; accordingly, they are “primary qualities of bodies.” In this way, by implication if not expressly, Locke severs, instead of establishing, the connection between simple ideas and reality. The only ideas which can make good their claim to be regarded as simple ideas have nothing resembling them in things. Other ideas, no doubt, are said to resemble bodily qualities (an assertion for which no proof is given and none is possible); but these ideas have only a doubtful claim to rank as simple ideas. Locke’s prevailing tendency is to identify reality with the simple idea, but he sometimes comes close to the opposite view that the reference to reality is the work of thought.

iv. Knowledge of Mathematics, Ethics, the Self, and God

In the fourth book of his Essay Locke applies the results of the earlier books to determine the nature and extent of knowledge. As ideas are the sole immediate objects of the mind, knowledge can be nothing else than “the perception of the connexion of and agreement, or disagreement and repugnancy, or any of our ideas.” This agreement or disagreement is said to be of four sorts: identity or diversity; relation; co-existence or necessary connection; real existence. Each of these kinds of knowledge raises its own questions; but, broadly speaking, one distinction may be taken as fundamental. In the same paragraph in which he restricts knowledge to the agreement or disagreement of our ideas, he admits one kind of knowledge which goes beyond the ideas themselves to the significance which they have for real existence. When the reference does not go beyond the ideas “in the mind,” the problems that arise are of one order; when there is a further reference to real things, another problem arises.

Locke also distinguishes between two degrees of knowledge: intuition and demonstration. In the former case, the agreement or disagreement is immediately perceived; in the latter, it is perceived through the mediation of a third idea, but each step in the demonstration is itself an intuition, the agreement or disagreement between the two ideas compared being immediately perceived. He believes that mathematics and ethics are demonstrable. When ideas are together in the mind, we can discover their relation to one another; so long as they are not taken to represent archetypes outside the mind, there is no obstacle to certainty of knowledge. “All relation terminates in, and is ultimately founded on, those simple ideas we have got from sensation or reflection” (Bk. 2:28:18). but “general and certain truths, are only founded in the habitudes and relations of abstract ideas” (Bk. 4:12:7). In this way Locke vindicates the certainty of mathematics: although instructive, the science is merely idea, and its propositions do not hold of things outside the mind. He thinks also that “morality is capable of demonstration as well as mathematics.” But, in spite of the request of his friend Molyneux, he never set out his ethic doctrine in detail. In Book II he reduced moral good and evil to pleasure and pain which — as reward and punishment — come to us from some lawgiver; thus they point to a source outside the mind. But his ground for maintaining the demonstrative character of morality is that moral ideas are “mixed modes,” and therefore mental products, so that their “precise real essence … may be perfectly known.” He ventures upon two examples only of this demonstrative morality; and neither of them is more than verbal or gives any information about good or evil. Yet the doctrine is significant as showing the influence upon Locke of another type of demonstrative thought.

Thus, knowledge of mathematics and ethics may be firmly establish, particularly as these subjects involve relations between ideas, and thus make no claims about matters of real existence. When it comes to knowledge of real existence, though, ultimately there are only two certainties: the existence of ourselves (by intuition) and that of God (by demonstration).

Concerning the self, Locke agrees with Descartes that the existence of the self is implied in every state of consciousness. Every element of our experience, every idea of which we are conscious, is a certificate of our own existence, as the subject of that experience:

As for our own existence, we perceive it so plainly and so certainly, that it neither needs nor is capable of any proof. For nothing can be more evident to us than our own existence. I think, I reason, I feel pleasure and pain: can any of these be more evident to me than my own existence? If I doubt of all other things, that very doubt makes me perceive my own existence, and will not suffer me to doubt of that. For if I know I feel pain, it is evident I have as certain perception of my own existence, as of the pain I feel: or if I know I doubt, I have ascertain perception of the existence of the thing doubting, as of that thought which I call doubt.

However, Locke fails to point out how the self can be an idea and thus belong to the material of knowledge. An idea of the self cannot come from sensation; and the simple ideas of reflection are all of mental operations, and not of the subject or agent of these operations. On the other hand, when he had occasion to discuss personal identity, he followed his new way of idea, and made it depend on memory.

Concerning God’s existence, his proof is a cosmological-type argument. From the certainty of our own existence that of the existence of God immediately follows. A person knows intuitively that he is “something that actually exists.” Next a person knows with intuitive certainty, that “bare nothing can no more produce any real being, than it can be equal to two right angles.” it is, therefore, “an evident demonstration, that from eternity there has been something. And since all the powers of all beings must be traced to this eternal Being, it follows that it is the most powerful, as well as the most knowing, that is, God. Eternal ind alone can produce “thinking, perceiving beings, such as we find ourselves to be” (Bk. 4:10). Locke here assumes, without question, the validity of the causal principle even beyond the range of possible experience.

v. Sensitive Knowledge of the External World

Below the rank of knowledge proper (intuitive and demonstrative), Locke recognizes a third degree of knowledge, not strictly entitled to the name. This is our sensitive apprehension of external things, or of real objects other than ourselves and God:

These two, namely, intuition and demonstration, are the degrees of our knowledge; whatever comes short of one of these, with what assurance soever embraced, is but faith or opinion, but not knowledge, at least in all general truths. There is, indeed, another perception of the mind, employed about the particular existence of finite beings without us, which, going beyond bare probability, and yet not reaching perfectly to either of the foregoing degrees of certainty, passes under the name of knowledge. There can be nothing more certain than that the idea we receive from an external object is in our minds: this is intuitive knowledge. But whether there be anything more than barely that idea in our minds; whether we can thence certainly infer the existence of anything without us, which corresponds to that idea, is that whereof some men think there may be a question made; because men may have such ideas in their minds, when no such thing exists, no such object affects their senses. (Bk. 4:14)

Does not the very definition of knowledge, as the perception of the agreement or disagreement of ideas with one another, preclude the perception of the agreement of ideas with non-ideal reality?

Locke’s argument for the objective validity of sensitive knowledge consists of several considerations. First, he urges, our ideas of sensation differ from those of memory and imagination, that is from mere ideas, in being produced in us without any action of our own, and therefore “must necessarily be the product of things operating on the mind, in a natural way, and producing therein those perceptions which by the Wisdom and Will of our Maker they are ordained and adapted to.” They,

carry with them all he conformity which is intended; or which our state requires: for they represent to us things under those appearances which they are fitted to produce in us: whereby we are enabled to distinguish the sorts of particular substances, to discern the states they are in, and so to take them for our necessities, and apply them to our uses. (Bk. 4:4:4)

Secondly, pleasure or pain often accompanies the sensation, and is absent from the idea as it recurs in memory or imagination; and “this certainty is as great as our happiness or misery, beyond which we have no concernment to know or to be” (Bk. 4:2:14). Thirdly, our several senses assist one another’s testimony, and thus enable us to predict our sensational experience. On these grounds Locke concludes that,

the certainty of things existing in rerum natura when we have the testimony of our senses for it is not only as great as our frame can attain to, but as our condition needs. For, our faculties being suited no to the full extent of being, nor to a perfect, clear, comprehensive knowledge of things free from all doubt and scruple; but to the preservation of us, in whom they are; and accommodated to the use of life: they serve to our purpose well enough, if they will but give us certain notice of those things, which are convenient or inconvenient to us. (Bk. 4:2:14)

The certainty which Locke attributes to sensitive knowledge is thus seen to be practical, rather than theoretical; and it is impossible to distinguish this degree of knowledge from the belief or opinion which results from a balance of probabilities rather than from certain perception.

But even granting that our sensitive apprehensions of external reality possesses the certainty which is the characteristic of knowledge, as distinguished from mere opinion, we must observe within how very narrow limits it is confined:

When our senses do actually convey into our understandings any idea, we cannot but be satisfied that there doth something at that time really exist without us, which doth affect our senses, and by them give notice of itself to our apprehensive faculties, and actually produce that idea which we then perceive: and we cannot so far distrust their testimony, as to doubt that such collections of simple ideas as we have observed by our senses to be united together, do really exist together. But this knowledge extends as far as the present testimony of our senses, employed about particular objects that do then effect them, and no further. (Bk. 4:11:9)

We cannot demonstrate the necessity of the co-existence of those ideas which constitute the modes or qualities of substances; we cannot perceive their “necessary connexion or repugnancy.” The connection between the secondary and the primary qualities remains inexplicable. “And therefore there are very few general propositions to be made concerning substances, which carry with them undoubted certainty” (Bk. 4:6:76). “Our knowledge in all these inquires reaches very little further than our experience” (Bk. 4:3:13-14). Beyond the strict warrant of experience, or the testimony of our senses, we may venture upon “opinion” or “judgment” as to the co-existence of the qualities of substances, but we cannot strictly “know”. “Possibly inquisitive and observing men may, by strength of judgment, penetrate further, and, on probabilities taken from wary observation, and hints well laid together, often guess right at what experience has not yet discovered to them. But this is but guessing still; it amounts only to opinion, and had not that certainty which is requisite to knowledge” (Bk. 4:6:13)

Locke finds himself compelled, therefore, to conclude that the so-called “science” of which Bacon had talked so proudly, and of whose achievements he had himself spoken so respectfully in the opening pages of the Essay, is not, in the strict sense, science at all; that, in his own words, there can be “no science of bodies.” It is vain to search for the “forms” of the various material substances, or to seek to verify “the corpuscularian hypothesis” as to the connection of the primary and the secondary qualities of things. “I am apt to doubt that, how far soever human industry may advance useful and experimental philosophy in physical things, scientifical will still be out of our reach…. Certainty and demonstration are things we must not, in these matters, pretend to” (Bk. 4:3:26).

If we cannot attain to a science of bodies, still less can we expect “scientifical” understanding of spirits. Spiritual substance is, as we have seen, as unknown as material substance; and Locke finds additional reasons for limiting our knowledge in this sphere.

If we are at a loss in respect of the powers and operations of bodies, I think it is easy to conclude we are much more in the dark in reference to spirits; whereof we naturally have no ideas but what we draw from that of our own, by reflecting on the operations of our own souls within us, as far as they come within our observation. But how inconsiderable rank the spirits that inhabit our bodies hold amongst those various and possibly innumerable kinds of nobler beings; and how far short they come of the endowments and perfections of cherubim and seraphim, and infinite sorts of spirits above us, is what by a transient hint in another place I have offered to my reader’s consideration.

vi. Judgment

The closing chapters of Book IV of the Essay are devoted to a consideration of that kind of apprehension of reality which Locke calls “judgment,” as distinguished from “knowledge.” “The faculty which God has given man to supply the want of clear and certain knowledge, in cases where that cannot be hand, is judgment: whereby the mind takes its ideas to agree or disagree; or, which is the same, any proposition to be true or false, without perceiving a demonstrative evidence in the proofs” (Bk 4:19:1-2). So-called “scientific” truths being generally of this kind, one would have expected Locke to give here some account of the procedure of inductive science, some directions for the careful and methodical study of the facts, and cautions against the temptations to hasty and unwarranted generalization, such as we find in Bacon’s Novum Organum. But instead of this, he contents himself with general observations on the degrees of assent, on reason (and syllogism), on faith and reason, on “enthusiasm,” and on wrong assent, or error. The treatment of, that is to say, is limited to general considerations regarding the function of faith and the relations of faith and reason as guides of the human mind.

What is especially significant here is Locke’s refusal to oppose faith and reason in the fashion of Bacon and Hobbes, and his refusal to accept any authority which cannot vindicate itself through reason. Even in his insistence upon the necessity of supplementing our knowledge by faith, Locke emphasized the use of reason:

Faith is nothing but a firm assent of the mind: which, if it be regulated, as is our duty, cannot be afforded to anything but upon good reason; and so cannot be opposite to it. He that believes without having any reason for believing, may be in love with his own fancies; but neither seeks truth as he ought, nor pays the obedience due to his maker…. (Bk. 4:27:24)

Locke is at one with the rationalist theologians of his century in their antagonism to an “enthusiasm” which would substitute for the insight of reason and of rational faith, the so called “revelation” of private experience. Against such a view, he insists upon the necessity of judging revelation by reason: “God when he makes the prophet does not unmake the man. He leaves all his faculties in the natural state, to enable him to judge of his inspirations, whether they be of divine original or no…. Reason must be our last judge and guide in everything” (Bk. 4:19:14).

Yet reason clearly limits the field of its own insight; it is only reasonable to believe where we cannot know and yet must act. However, as morality and religion cannot be compassed by reason, such knowledge must be supplemented by faith if we are to fulfill our divine destiny. This is the point of view, not only of the closing chapters of the Essay, but of his Resonableness of Christianity (1695). The aim of this treatise is to recall men from the contentions of the theological schools to the simplicity of the gospel as the rule of human life.:

The writers and wranglers in religion fill it with niceties, and dress it up with notions, which they make necessary and fundamental parts of it; as if there were no way into the church, but through the academy or lyceum. The greatest part of mankind have not leisure for learning and logic, and superfine distinctions of the schools.

What people need is not intellectual insight or theological dogma, but practical guidance. Locke seems less confident than he was in the Essay of the possibility of a rational science of morals. “It should seem, by the little that has hitherto been done in it, that it is too hard a task for unassisted reason to establish morality, in all its parts, upon its true foundation, with a clear and convincing light…. It is plain, in fact, that human reason unassisted failed men in its great and proper business of morality.”

b. Two Treatises of Government

In Two Treatises of Government he has two purposes in view: to refute the doctrine of the divine and absolute right of the Monarch, as it had been put forward by Robert Filmer’s Patriarcha, and to establish a theory which would reconcile the liberty of the citizen with political order. The criticism of Filmer in the first Treatise is complete. His theory of the absolute sovereignty of Adam, and so of kings as Adam’s heirs, has lost all interest; and Locke’s argument has been only too effective: his exhaustive reply to so absurd a thesis becomes itself wearisome. Although there is little direct reference to Hobbes, Locke seems to have had Hobbes in mind when he argued that the doctrine of absolute monarchy leaves sovereign and subjects in the state of nature towards one another. The constructive doctrines which are elaborated in the second treatise became the basis of social and political philosophy for generations. Labor is the origin and justification of property; contract or consent is the ground of government and fixes its limits. Behind both doctrines lies the idea of the independence of the individual person. The state of nature knows no government; but in it, as in political society, men are subject to the moral law, which is the law of God. Men are born free and equal in rights. Whatever a man “mixes his labour with” is his to use. Or, at least, this was so in the primitive condition of human life in which there was enough for all and “the whole earth was America.” Locke sees that, when men have multiplied and land has become scarce, rules are needed beyond those which the moral law or law of nature supplies. But the origin of government is traced not to this economic necessity, but to another cause. The moral law is always valid, but it is not always kept. In the state of nature all men equally have the right to punish transgressors: civil society originates when, for the better administration of the law, men agree to delegate this function to certain officers. Thus government is instituted by a “social contract”; its powers are limited, and they involve reciprocal obligations; moreover, they can be modified or rescinded by the authority which conferred them. Locke’s theory is thus no more historical than Hobbes’s. It is a rendering of the facts of constitutional government in terms of thought, and it served its purpose as a justification of the Revolution settlement in accordance with the ideas of the time.

c. Economic Writings

Locke’s writings on economic subjects do not rank in importance with his treatises on government. They deal with particular questions raised by the necessities of the political situation. No attempt had yet been made to isolate the fact of wealth and make it the subject of a special science. The direction of industry and commerce was held to be part of the statesman’s duty; but, in the seventeenth century, it began to be carried out with less thoroughness than before; and at the same time new problems were opened up by the growth of the national life. The American colonies, the enterprise of the East India Company, the planting of Ireland, the commercial rivalry with Holland and withy France, as well as questions regarding the rate of interest and the currency, occupied the attention of a crowd of writers in the second half of the century. Locke’s own contributions were occasioned be the financial problems which faced the new government after the revolution. His reflections on the rate of interest show the growing disfavor with which appeals for state interference were beginning to be met. He points out the obstacles to trade that are caused when the rate of interest is fixed by law, and he argues in favor of freedom for what he calls, in words which suggest Adam Smith, “the natural interest of money.” Money “turns the wheels of trade”; therefore its course should not be stopped. At the same time, he holds no general brief against the interference of the state in matters of commerce; nor is the language of the mercantilist foreign to him. Riches consist in plenty of gold and silver, for these command all the conveniences of life. Now, “in a country not furnished with mines, there are but two ways of growing rich, either conquest or commerce.” For us commerce is the only way; and Locke condemns “the amazing politics of some late reigns” which had “let in other competitors with us for the sea.” In the concluding portion of Some Considerations of the Consequences of the Lowering of Interest and Raising the Value of Money (1691), Locke laid stress on the importance of a uniform and stable measure of values; four years later, in hisFurther Considerations he defended his view against the proposals involving a depreciation of the standard, which William Lowndes, secretary of the treasury, had set forth in An Essay for the amendment of the silver coins (1695).

d. Letters on Religious Toleration

Locke’s plea for toleration in matters of belief has become classical. His Common-Place Book shows that his mind was clear on the subject more than twenty years before the publication of his first Letter. The topic, indeed, was in the air all through his life, and affected him nearly. When he was a scholar at Westminster, the powers of the civil magistrate in religious matters were the subject of heated discussion between Presbyterians and independents in the assembly of divines that held its sessions within a stone’s throw of his dormitory; and, when he entered Christ Church, John Owen, a leader of the independents, had been recently appointed to the deanery. There had been many arguments for toleration before this time, but they had come from the weaker party in the state. Thus Jeremy Taylor’s Liberty of Prophesying appeared in 1646, when the fortunes of his side had suffered a decline. For Owen the credit has been claimed that he was the first who argued for toleration “when his party was uppermost.” He was called upon to preach before the House of Commons on January 31, 1649, and performed the task without making any reference to the tragic event of the previous day; but to the published sermon he appended a remarkable discussion on toleration. Owen did not take such high ground as Milton did, ten years later, in his Treatise of Civil Power in Ecclesiastical Causes — affirming that “it is not lawful for any power on earth to compel in matters of religion.” He abounds in distinctions, and indeed his position calls for some subtlety. He holds that the civil magistrate has duties to the church, and that he ought to give facilities and protection to its ministers, not merely as citizens but as preachers of “the truth”; on the other hand he argues that civil or corporeal penalties are inappropriate as punishments for offences which are purely spiritual.

The position ultimately adopted by Locke is not altogether the same as this. He was never an ardent puritan; he had as little taste for elaborate theologies as he had for scholastic systems of philosophy; and his earliest attempt at a theory of toleration was connected with the view that in religion, “articles in speculative opinions [should] be few and large, and ceremonies in worship few and easy.” The doctrines which he held to be necessary for salvation would have seemed to John Owen a meager and pitiful creed. And he had a narrower view also of the functions of the state. “The business of laws,” he says,

is not to provide for the truth of opinions, but for the safety and security of the commonwealth, and of every particular man’s goods and person. And so it ought to be. For truth certainly would do well enough, if she were once left to shift for herself. She seldom has received, and I fear never will receive, much assistance from the power of great men, to whom she is but rarely known, and more rarely welcome. She is not taught by laws, nor has she any need of force, to procure her entrance into the minds of men. Errors, indeed, prevail by the assistance of foreign and borrowed succors. But if truth makes not her way into the understanding by her own light, she will be but the weaker for any borrowed force violence can add to her.

A church, according to Locke, is “a free and voluntary society”; its purpose is the public worship of God; the value of worship depends on the faith that inspires it: “all the life and power of true religion consists in the inward and full persuasion of the mind;” and these matters are entirely outside the jurisdiction of the civil magistrate. Locke therefore (to use later language) was a voluntary in religion, as he was an individualist on questions of state interference. There is an exception, however, to his doctrine of the freedom of the individual in religious matters. The toleration extended to all others is denied to papists and to atheists; and his inconsistency in this respect has been often and severely criticized. But it is clear that Locke made the exception not for religious reasons but on grounds of state policy. He looked upon the Roman Catholic as dangerous to the public peace because he professed allegiance to a foreign prince; and the atheist was excluded because, on Locke’s view, the existence of the state depends upon a contract, and the obligation of the contract, as of all moral law, depends upon the divine will.

e. Theological Writings

Locke’s theological writings exhibit the characteristic qualities which his other works have rendered familiar. The traditions of theologians are set aside in them much as philosophical tradition was discarded in the Essay. He will search the Scriptures for religious doctrine just as he turned to experience for his philosophy, and he follows a method equally straightforward. Locke does not raise questions of Biblical criticism, such as Hobbes had already suggested and some of his own followers put forward soon afterwards; and the conclusions at which he arrives are in harmony with the Christian faith, if without the fulness of current doctrine. At the same time, his work belongs to the history of liberal theology and is intimately connected with the deism which followed; it treats religion like any other subject, and interprets the Bible like any other book; and, in his view of the nature of religion, he tends to describe it as if it consisted almost entirely in an attitude of intellectual belief — a tendency which became more prominent in the course of the eighteenth century.

f. Educational Writings

Locke’s Thoughts concerning Education and his Conduct of the Understanding occupy an important place in the history of educational theory, though only a scanty reference can be made to them here. The subject had a right to prominence in his thought. The stress he laid n experience in the growth of mind led him to magnify, perhaps overmuch, the power of education. He held that “the minds of children [are] as easily turned, this way or that, as water itself.” He underrated innate differences: “we are born with faculties and powers, capable almost of anything;” and, “as it is in the body, so it is in the mind, practice makes it what it is.” Along with this view went a profound conviction of the importance of education, and of the breadth of its aim. It has to fit men for life — for the world, rather than for the university. Instruction in knowledge does not exhaust it; it is essentially a training of character.

3. References and Further Reading

  • Letter on Toleration (1689)
  • Second Letter on Toleration (1690)
  • Two Treatises of Government (1690)
  • Essay concerning Human Understanding (1690)
  • Some Considerations of the Consequences of Lowering of Interest, and Raising the Value of Money (1691)
  • Third Letter on Toleration (1692)
  • Some Thoughts concerning Education (1693)
  • Further Considerations concerning Raising the Value of Money (1693)
  • The Reasonableness of Christianity (1695)
  • A Vindication of the Reasonableness of Christianity (1695)
  • A Second Vindication of the Reasonableness of Christianity (1695)
  • A Letter to the Bishop of Worcester (1697)
  • Discourse on Miracles (posthumous)
  • Fourth Letter for Toleration (posthumous)
  • An Examination of Father Malebranche’s Opinion of Seeing all things in God (posthumous)
  • Remarks on Some of Mr Norris’s Books (posthumous)
  • Conduct of the Understanding (posthumous)

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