Model-Theoretic Conceptions of
Logical Consequence

One sentence X is said to be a logical consequence of a set K of sentences, if and only if, in virtue of logic alone, it is impossible for all the sentences in the set to be true without X being true as well. One well-known specification of this informal characterization is the model-theoretic conception of logical consequence: a sentence X is a logical consequence of a set K of sentences if and only if all models of K are models of X. The model-theoretic characterization is a theoretical definition of logical consequence. It has been argued that this conception of logical consequence is more basic than the characterization in terms of deducibility in a deductive system. The correctness of the model-theoretic characterization of logical consequence, and the adequacy of the notion of a logical constant it utilizes are matters of contemporary debate.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. Linguistic Preliminaries: the Language M
    1. Syntax of M
    2. Semantics for M
  3. What is a Logic?
  4. Model-Theoretic Consequence
    1. Truth in a structure
    2. Satisfaction revisited
    3. A formalized definition of truth for Language M
    4. Model-theoretic consequence defined
  5. The Status of the Model-Theoretic Characterization of Logical Consequence
    1. The model-theoretic characterization is a theoretical definition of logical consequence
    2. The common concept of logical consequence
    3. What is a logical constant?
  6. Conclusion
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

One sentence X is said to be a logical consequence of a set of sentences, if and only if, in virtue of logic alone, it is impossible for all the sentences in K to be true without X being true as well. One well-known specification of this informal characterization, due to Tarski (1936), is: X is a logical consequence of K if and only if there is no possible interpretation of the non-logical terminology of the language L according to which all the sentences in K are true and X is false. A possible interpretation of the non-logical terminology of L according to which sentences are true or false is a reading of the non-logical terms according to which the sentences receive a truth-value (that is, are either true or false) in a situation that is not ruled out by the semantic properties of the logical constants. The philosophical locus of the technical development of 'possible interpretation' in terms of models is Tarski (1936). A model for a language L is the theoretical development of a possible interpretation of non-logical terminology of L according to which the sentences of L receive a truth-value. The characterization of logical consequence in terms of models is called the Tarskian or model-theoretic characterization of logical consequence. It may be stated as follows.

X is a logical consequence of K if and only if all models of K are models of X.

See the entry, Logical Consequence, Philosophical Considerations, for discussion of Tarski's development of the model-theoretic characterization of logical consequence in light of the ordinary conception.

We begin by giving an interpreted language M. Next, logical consequence is defined model-theoretically. Finally, the status of this characterization is discussed, and criticisms of it are entertained.

2. Linguistic Preliminaries: the Language M

Here we define a simple language M, a language about the McKeon family, by first sketching what strings qualify as well-formed formulas (wffs) in M. Next we define sentences from formulas, and then give an account of truth in M, that is we describe the conditions in which M-sentences are true.

a. Syntax of M

Building blocks of formulas

Terms

Individual names—'beth', 'kelly', 'matt', 'paige', 'shannon', 'evan', and 'w1', 'w2', 'w3 ', etc.

Variables—'x', 'y', 'z', 'x1', 'y1 ', 'z1', 'x2', 'y2', 'z2', etc.

Predicates

1-place predicates—'Female', 'Male'

2-place predicates—'Parent', 'Brother', 'Sister', 'Married', 'OlderThan', 'Admires', '='.

Blueprints of well-formed formulas (wffs)

Atomic formulas: An atomic wff is any of the above n-place predicates followed by n terms which are enclosed in parentheses and separated by commas.

Formulas: The general notion of a well-formed formula (wff) is defined recursively as follows:

(1) All atomic wffs are wffs.
(2) If α is a wff, so is ''.
(3) If α and β are wffs, so is '(α & β)'.
(4) If α and β are wffs, so is 'v β)'.
(5) If α and β are wffs, so is '(α → β)'.
(6) If Ψ is a wff and v is a variable, then 'vΨ' is a wff.
(7) If Ψ is a wff and v is a variable, then 'vΨ' is a wff.
Finally, no string of symbols is a well-formed formula of M unless the string can be derived from (1)-(7).

The signs '~', '&', 'v', and '→', are called sentential connectives. The signs '∀' and '∃' are called quantifiers.

It will prove convenient to have available in M an infinite number of individual names as well as variables. The strings 'Parent(beth, paige)' and 'Male(x)' are examples of atomic wffs. We allow the identity symbol in an atomic formula to occur in between two terms, e.g., instead of '=(evan, evan)' we allow '(evan = evan)'. The symbols '~', '&', 'v', and '→' correspond to the English words 'not', 'and', 'or' and 'if...then', respectively. '∃' is our symbol for an existential quantifier and '∀' represents the universal quantifier. 'vΨ' and 'vΨ' correspond to for some v, Ψ, and for all v, Ψ, respectively. For every quantifier, its scope is the smallest part of the wff in which it is contained that is itself a wff. An occurrence of a variable v is a bound occurrence iff it is in the scope of some quantifier of the form 'v' or the form 'v', and is free otherwise. For example, the occurrence of 'x' is free in 'Male(x)' and in '∃y Married(y, x)'. The occurrences of 'y' in the second formula are bound because they are in the scope of the existential quantifier. A wff with at least one free variable is an open wff, and a closed formula is one with no free variables. A sentence is a closed wff. For example, 'Female(kelly)' and '∃y∃x Married(y, x)' are sentences but 'OlderThan(kelly, y)' and '(∃x Male(x) & Female(z))' are not. So, not all of the wffs of M are sentences. As noted below, this will affect our definition of truth for M.

b. Semantics for M

We now provide a semantics for M. This is done in two steps. First, we specify a domain of discourse, that is, the chunk of the world that our language M is about, and interpret M's predicates and names in terms of the elements composing the domain. Then we state the conditions under which each type of M-sentence is true. To each of the above syntactic rules (1-7) there corresponds a semantic rule that stipulates the conditions in which the sentence constructed using the syntactic rule is true. The principle of bivalence is assumed and so 'not true' and 'false' are used interchangeably. In effect, the interpretation of M determines a truth-value (true, false) for each and every sentence of M.

Domain D—The McKeons: Matt, Beth, Shannon, Kelly, Paige, and Evan.

Here are the referents and extensions of the names and predicates of M.

Terms: 'matt' refers to Matt, 'beth' refers to Beth, 'shannon' refers to Shannon, etc.

Predicates. The meaning of a predicate is identified with its extension, that is the set (possibly empty) of elements from the domain D the predicate is true of. The extension of a one-place predicate is a set of elements from D, the extension of a two-place predicate is a set of ordered pairs of elements from D.

The extension of 'Male' is {Matt, Evan}.

The extension of 'Female' is {Beth, Shannon, Kelly, Paige}.

The extension of 'Parent' is {<Matt, Shannon>, <Matt, Kelly>, <Matt, Paige>, <Matt, Evan>, <Beth, Shannon>, <Beth, Kelly>, <Beth, Paige>, <Beth, Evan>}.

The extension of 'Married' is {<Matt, Beth>, <Beth, Matt>}.

The extension of 'Sister' is {<Shannon, Kelly>, <Kelly, Shannon>, <Shannon, Paige>, <Paige, Shannon>, <Kelly, Paige>, <Paige, Kelly>, <Kelly, Evan>, <Paige, Evan>, <Shannon, Evan>}.

The extension of 'Brother' is {<Evan, Shannon>, <Evan, Kelly>, <Evan, Paige>}.

The extension of 'OlderThan' is {<Beth, Matt>, <Beth, Shannon>, <Beth, Kelly>, <Beth, Paige>, <Beth, Evan>, <Matt, Shannon>, <Matt, Kelly>, <Matt, Paige>, <Matt, Evan>, <Shannon, Kelly>, <Shannon, Paige>, <Shannon, Evan>, <Kelly, Paige>, <Kelly, Evan>, <Paige, Evan>}.

The extension of 'Admires' is {<Matt, Beth>, <Shannon, Matt>, <Shannon, Beth>, <Kelly, Beth>, <Kelly, Matt>, <Kelly, Shannon>, <Paige, Beth>, <Paige, Matt>, <Paige, Shannon>, <Paige, Kelly>, <Evan, Beth>, <Evan, Matt>, <Evan, Shannon>, <Evan, Kelly>, <Evan, Paige>}.

The extension of '=' is {<Matt, Matt>, <Beth, Beth>, <Shannon, Shannon>, <Kelly, Kelly>, <Paige, Paige>, <Evan, Evan>}.

(I) An atomic sentence with a one-place predicate is true iff the referent of the term is a member of the extension of the predicate, and an atomic sentence with a two-place predicate is true iff the ordered pair formed from the referents of the terms in order is a member of the extension of the predicate.

The atomic sentence 'Female(kelly)' is true because, as indicated above, the referent of 'kelly' is in the extension of the property designated by 'Female'. The atomic sentence 'Married(shannon, kelly)' is false because the ordered pair <Shannon, Kelly> is not in the extension of the relation designated by 'Married'.

Let α and β be any M-sentences.

(II) '' is true iff α is false.
(III) '(α & β)' is true when both α and β are true; otherwise '(α & β)' is false.
(IV) 'v β)' is true when at least one of α and β is true; otherwise 'v β)' is false.
(V) '(α → β)' is true if and only if (iff) α is false or β is true. So, '(α → β)' is false just in case α is true and β is false.

The meanings for '~' and '&' roughly correspond to the meanings of 'not' and 'and' as ordinarily used. We call '' and '(α & β)' negation and conjunction formulas, respectively. The formula '(~α v β)' is called a disjunction and the meaning of 'v' corresponds to inclusive or. There are a variety of conditionals in English (e.g., causal, counterfactual, logical), each type having a distinct meaning. The conditional defined by (V) above is called the material conditional. One way of following (V) is to see that the truth conditions for '(α → β)' are the same as for '~(α & ~β)'.

By (II) '~Married(shannon, kelly)' is true because, as noted above, 'Married(shannon, kelly)' is false. (II) also tells us that '~Female(kelly)' is false since 'Female(kelly)' is true. According to (III), '(~Married(shannon, kelly) & Female(kelly))' is true because '~Married(shannon, kelly)' is true and 'Female(kelly)' is true. And '(Male(shannon) & Female(shannon))' is false because 'Male(shannon)' is false. (IV) confirms that '(Female(kelly) v Married(evan, evan))' is true because, even though 'Married(evan, evan)' is false, 'Female(kelly)' is true. From (V) we know that the sentence '(~(beth = beth) → Male(shannon))' is true because '~(beth = beth)' is false. If α is false then '(α → β)' is true regardless of whether or not β is true. The sentence '(Female(beth) → Male(shannon))' is false because 'Female(beth)' is true and 'Male(shannon)' is false.

Before describing the truth conditions for quantified sentences we need to say something about the notion of satisfaction. We've defined truth only for the formulas of M that are sentences. So, the notions of truth and falsity are not applicable to non-sentences such as 'Male(x)' and '((x = x) → Female(x))' in which 'x' occurs free. However, objects may satisfy wffs that are non-sentences. We introduce the notion of satisfaction with some examples. An object satisfies 'Male(x)' just in case that object is male. Matt satisfies 'Male(x)', Beth does not. This is the case because replacing 'x' in 'Male(x)' with 'matt' yields a truth while replacing the variable with 'beth' yields a falsehood. An object satisfies '((x = x) → Female(x))' if and only if it is either not identical with itself or is a female. Beth satisfies this wff (we get a truth when 'beth' is substituted for the variable in all of its occurrences), Matt does not (putting 'matt' in for 'x' wherever it occurs results in a falsehood). As a first approximation, we say that an object with a name, say 'a', satisfies a wff 'Ψv' in which at most v occurs free if and only if the sentence that results by replacing v in all of its occurrences with 'a' is true. 'Male(x)' is neither true nor false because it is not a sentence, but it is either satisfiable or not by a given object. Now we define the truth conditions for quantifications, utilizing the notion of satisfaction. The notion of satisfaction will be revisited below when we formalize the semantics for M and give the model-theoretic characterization of logical consequence.

Let Ψ be any formula of M in which at most v occurs free.

(VI) 'vΨ' is true just in case there is at least one individual in the domain of quantification (e.g. at least one McKeon) that satisfies Ψ.
(VII) 'vΨ' is true just in case every individual in the domain of quantification (e.g. every McKeon) satisfies Ψ.

Here are some examples. '∃x(Male(x) & Married(x, beth))' is true because Matt satisfies '(Male(x) & Married(x, beth))'; replacing 'x' wherever it appears in the wff with 'matt' results in a true sentence. The sentence '∃xOlderThan(x, x)' is false because no McKeon satisfies 'OlderThan(x, x)', that is replacing 'x' in 'OlderThan(x, x)' with the name of a McKeon always yields a falsehood.

The universal quantification '∀x( OlderThan(x, paige) → Male(x))' is false for there is a McKeon who doesn't satisfy '(OlderThan(x, paige) → Male(x))'. For example, Shannon does not satisfy '(OlderThan(x, paige) → Male(x))' because Shannon satisfies 'OlderThan(x, paige)' but not 'Male(x)'. The sentence '∀x(x = x)' is true because all McKeons satisfy 'x = x'; replacing 'x' with the name of any McKeon results in a true sentence.

Note that in the explanation of satisfaction we suppose that an object satisfies a wff only if the object is named. But we don't want to presuppose that all objects in the domain of discourse are named. For the purposes of an example, suppose that the McKeons adopt a baby boy, but haven't named him yet. Then, '∃x Brother(x, evan)' is true because the adopted child satisfies 'Brother(x, evan)', even though we can't replace 'x' with the child's name to get a truth. To get around this is easy enough. We have added a list of names, 'w1', 'w2', 'w3', etc., to M, and we may say that any unnamed object satisfies 'Ψv' iff the replacement of v with a previously unused wi assigned as a name of this object results in a true sentence. In the above scenerio, '∃xBrother(x, evan)' is true because, ultimately, treating 'w1' as a temporary name of the child, 'Brother(w1, evan)' is true. Of course, the meanings of the predicates would have to be amended in order to reflect the addition of a new person to the domain of McKeons.

3. What is a Logic?

We have characterized an interpreted formal language M by defining what qualifies as a sentence of M and by specifying the conditions under which any M-sentence is true. The received view of logical consequence entails that the logical consequence relation in M turns on the nature of the logical constants in the relevant M-sentences. We shall regard just the sentential connectives, the quantifiers of M, and the identity predicate as logical constants (the language M is a first-order language). For discussion of the notion of a logical constant see Section 5c below.

At the start of this article, it is said that a sentence X is a logical consequence of a set K of sentences, if and only if, in virtue of logic alone, it is impossible for all the sentences in K to be true without X being true as well. A model-theoretic conception of logical consequence in language M clarifies this intuitive characterization of logical consequence by appealing to the semantic properties of the logical constants, represented in the above truth clauses (I)-(VII). In contrast, a deductive-theoretic conception clarifies logical consequence in M, conceived of in terms of deducibility, by appealing to the inferential properties of logical constants portrayed as intuitively valid principles of inference, that is, principles justifying steps in deductions. See Logical Consequence, Deductive-Theoretic Conceptions for a deductive-theoretic characterization of logical consequence in terms of a deductive system, and foror a discussion on the relationship between the logical consequence relation and the model-theoretic and deductive-theoretic conceptions of it.

Following Shapiro (1991, p. 3), we define a logic to be a formal language L plus either a model-theoretic or a deductive-theoretic account of logical consequence. A language with both characterizations is a full logic just in case the two characterizations coincide. The logic for M developed below may be viewed as a classical logic or a first-order theory.

4. Model-Theoretic Consequence

The technical machinery to follow is designed to clarify how it is that sentences receive truth-values owing to interpretations of them. We begin by introducing the notion of a structure. Then we revisit the notion of satisfaction in order to make it more precise, and link structures and satisfaction to model-theoretic consequence. We offer a modernized version of the model-theoretic characterization of logical consequence sketched by Tarski and so deviate from the details of Tarski's presentation in his (1936).

a. Truth in a structure

Relative to our language M, a structure U is an ordered pair <D, I>.

(1) D, a non-empty set of elements, is the domain of discourse. Two things to highlight here. First, the domain D of a structure for M may be any set of entities, e.g. the dogs living in Connecticut, the toothbrushes on Earth, the natural numbers, the twelve apostles, etc. Second, we require that D not be the empty set.
(2) I is a function that assigns to each individual constant of M an element of D, and to each n-place predicate of M a subset of Dn (that is, the set of n-tuples taken from D). In essence, I interprets the individual constants and predicates of M, linking them to elements and sets of n-tuples of elements from of D. For individual constants c and predicates P, the element IU(c) is the element of D designated by c under IU, and IU(P) is the set of entities assigned by IU as the extension of P.

By 'structure' we mean an L-structure for some first-order language L. The intended structure for a language L is the course-grained representation of the piece of the world that we intend L to be about. The intended domain D and its subsets represent the chunk of the world L is being used to talk about and quantify over. The intended interpretation of L's constants and predicates assigns the actual denotations to L's constants and the actual extensions to the predicates. The above semantics for our language M, may be viewed, in part, as an informal portrayal of the intended structure of M, which we refer to as UM. That is, we take M to be a tool for talking about the McKeon family with respect to gender, who is older than whom, who admires whom, etc. To make things formally prim and proper we should represent the interpretation of constants as IUM(matt) = Matt, IUM(beth) = Beth, and so on. And the interpretation of predicates can look like IUM(Male) = {Matt, Evan}, IUM(Female) = {Beth, Shannon, Kelly, Paige}, and so on. We assume that this has been done.

A structure U for a language L (that is, an L-structure) represents one way that a language can be used to talk about a state of affairs. Crudely, the domain D and the subsets recovered from D constitute a rudimentary representation of a state of affairs, and the interpretation of L's predicates and individual constants makes the language L about the relevant state of affairs. Since a language can be assigned different structures, it can be used to talk about different states of affairs. The class of L-structures represents all the states of affairs that the language L can be used to talk about. For example, consider the following M-structure U'.

D = the set of natural numbers

IU'(beth) = 2
IU'(matt) = 3
IU'(shannon) = 5
IU'(kelly) = 7
IU'(paige) = 11
IU'(evan) = 10
I U'(Male) = {d D | d is prime}
I U'(Female) = {d D | d is even}
I U'(Parent) = ∅
I U'(Married) = {<d, d'> D2 | d + 1 = d' }
I U'(Sister) = ∅
I U'(Brother) = {<d, d'> D2 | d < d' }
I U'(OlderThan) = {<d, d'> D2 | d > d' }
I U'(Admires) = ∅
I U'(=) = {<d, d'> D2 | d = d' }

 

In specifying the domain D and the values of the interpretation function defined on M's predicates we make use of brace notation, instead of the earlier list notation, to pick out sets. For example, we write

{d D | d is even}

to say "the set of all elements d of D such that d is even." And

{<d, d'> D2 | d > d'}

reads: "The set of ordered pairs of elements d, d' of D such that d > d'." Consider: the sentence

OlderThan(beth, matt)

is true in the intended structure UM for <IUM(beth), IUM(matt)> is in IUM(OlderThan). But the sentence is false in U' for <IU'(beth), IU'(matt)> is not in IU'(OlderThan) (because 2 is not greater than 3). The sentence

(Female(beth) & Male(beth))

is not true in UM but is true in U' for IU'(beth) is in IU'(Female) and in IU'(Male) (because 2 is an even prime). In order to avoid confusion it is worth highlighting that when we say that the sentence '(Female(beth) & Male(beth))' is true in one structure and false in another we are saying that one and the same wff with no free variables is true in one state of affairs on an interpretation and false in another state of affairs on another interpretation.

b. Satisfaction revisited

Note the general strategy of giving the semantics of the sentential connectives: the truth of a compound sentence formed with any of them is determined by its component well-formed formulas (wffs), which are themselves (simpler) sentences. However, this strategy needs to be altered when it comes to quantificational sentences. For quantificational sentences are built out of open wffs and, as noted above, these component wffs do not admit of truth and falsity. Therefore, we can't think of the truth of, say,

∃x(Female(x) & OlderThan(x, paige))

in terms of the truth of '(Female(x) & OlderThan(x, paige))' for some McKeon x. What we need is a truth-relevant property of open formulas that we may appeal to in explaining the truth-value of the compound quantifications formed from them. Tarski is credited with the solution, first hinted at in the following.

The possibility suggests itself, however, of introducing a more general concept which is applicable to any sentential function [open or closed wff] can be recursively defined, and, when applied to sentences leads us directly to the concept of truth. These requirements are met by the notion of satisfaction of a given sentential function by given objects. (Tarski 1933, p. 189)

The needed property is satisfaction. The truth of the above existential quantification will depend on there being an object that satisfies both 'Female(x)' and 'OlderThan(x, paige)'. Earlier we introduced the concept of satisfaction by describing the conditions in which one element satisfies an open formula with one free variable. Now we want to develop a picture of what it means for objects to satisfy a wff with n free variables for any n ≥ 0. We begin by introducing the notion of a variable assignment.

A variable assignment is a function g from a set of variables (its domain) to a set of objects (its range). We shall say that the variable assignment g is suitable for a well-formed formula (wff) Ψ of M if every free variable in Ψ is in the domain of g. In order for a variable assignment to satisfy a wff it must be suitable for the formula. For a variable assignment g that is suitable for Ψ, g satisfies Ψ in U iff the object(s) g assigns to the free variable(s) in Ψ satisfy Ψ. Unlike the earlier first-step characterization of satisfaction, there is no appeal to names for the entities assigned to the variables. This has the advantage of not requiring that new names be added to a language that does not have names for everything in the domain. In specifying a variable assignment g, we write α/v, β/v', χ/v'', ... to indicate that g(v) = α, g(v' ) = β, g(v'' ) = χ, etc. We understand

U ⊨ Ψ[g]

to mean that g satisfies Ψ in U.

UM ⊨ OlderThan(x, y)[Shannon/x, Paige/y]

This is true: the variable assignment g, identified with [Shannon/x, Paige/y], satisfies 'Olderthan(x, y)' because Shannon is older than Paige.

UM ⊨ Admires(x, y)[Beth/x, Matt/y]

This is false for this variable assignment does not satisfy the wff: Beth does not admire Matt. However, the following is true because Matt admires Beth.

UM ⊨ Admires(x, y)[Matt/x, Beth/y]

For any wff Ψ, a suitable variable assignment g and structure U together ensure that the terms in Ψ designate elements in D. The structure U insures that individual constants have referents, and the assignment g insures that any free variables in Ψ get denotations. For any individual constant c, c[g] is the element IU(c). For each variable v, and assignment g whose domain contains v, v[g] is the element g(v). In effect, the variable assignment treats the variable v as a temporary name. We define t[g] as 'the element designated by t relative to the assignment g'.

c. A formalized definition of truth for Language M

We now give a definition of truth for the language M via the detour through satisfaction. The goal is to define for each formula α of M and each assignment g to the free variables, if any, of α in U what must obtain in order for U ⊨ α[g].

(I) Where R is an n-place predicate and t1, ..., tn are terms, UR(t1, ..., tn)[g] if and only if (iff) the n-tuple <t1[g], ..., tn[g]> is in IU(R).
(II) U ⊨ ~α[g] iff it is not true that U ⊨ α[g].
(III) U ⊨ (α & β)[g] iff U ⊨ α[g] and U ⊨ β[g].
(IV) U ⊨ (α v β)[g] iff U ⊨ α[g] or U ⊨ β[g].
(V) U ⊨ (α → β)[g] iff either it is not true that U ⊨ α[g] or U ⊨ β[g].

Before going on to the (VI) and (VII) clauses for quantificational sentences, it is worthwhile to introduce the notion of a variable assignment that comes from another. Consider

∃y(Female(x) & OlderThan(x, y)).

We want to say that a variable assignment g satisfies this wff if and only if there is a variable assignment g' differing from g at most with regard to the object it assigns to the variable y such that g' satisfies '(Female(x) & OlderThan(x, y))'. We say that a variable assignment g' comes from an assignment g when the domain of g' is that of g and a variable v, and g' assigns the same values as g with the possible exception of the element g' assigns to v. In general, we represent an extension g' of an assignment g as follows.

[g, d/v]

This picks out a variable assignment g' which differs at most from g in that v is in its domain and g'(v) = d, for some element d of the domain D. So, it is true that

UM ⊨∃y(Female(x) & OlderThan(x, y)) [Beth/x]

since

UM ⊨ (Female(x) & OlderThan(x, y)) [Beth/x, Paige/y].

What this says is that the variable assignment that comes from the assignment of Beth to 'x' by adding the assignment of Paige to 'y' satisfies '(Female(x) & OlderThan(x, y))' in UM. This is true for Beth is a female who is older than Paige. Now we give the satisfaction clauses for quantificational sentences. Let Ψ be any formula of M.

(VI) U ⊨∃vΨ[g] iff for at least one element d of D, U ⊨ Ψ[g, d/v].
(VII) U ⊨ ∀vΨ[g] iff for all elements d of D, U ⊨ Ψ[g, d/v].

If α is a sentence, then it has no free variables and we write U ⊨ α[g] which says that the empty variable assignment satisfies α in U. The empty variable assignment g does not assign objects to any variables. In short: the definition of truth for language L is

A sentence α is true in U if and only if U ⊨ α[g], that is the empty variable assignment satisfies α in U.

The truth definition specifies the conditions in which a formula of M is true in a structure by explaining how the semantic properties of any formula of M are determined by its construction from semantically primitive expressions (e.g., predicates, individual constants, and variables) whose semantic properties are specified directly. If every member of a set of sentences is true in a structure U we say that U is a model of the set. We now work through some examples. The reader will be aided by referring when needed to the clauses (I)-(VII).

It is true that UM ⊨ ~Married(kelly, kelly))[g], that is, by (II) it is not true that UM ⊨ Married(kelly, kelly))[g], because <kelly[g], kelly[g]> is not in IUM(Married). Hence, by (IV)

UM ⊨ (Married(shannon, kelly) v ~Married(kelly, kelly))[g].

Our truth definition should confirm that

∃x∃y Admires(x, y)

is true in UM. Note that by (VI) UM ⊨∃yAdmires(x, y)[g, Paige/x] since UM ⊨ Admires(x, y)[g, Paige/x, kelly/y]. Hence, by (VI)

UM ⊨∃x∃y Admires(x, y)[g] .

The sentence, '∀x∃y(Older(y, x) → Admires(x, y))' is true in UM . By (VII) we know that

UM ⊨ ∀x∃y(Older(y, x) → Admires(x, y))[g]

if and only if

for all elements d of D, UM ⊨∃y(Older(y, x) → Admires(x, y))[g, d/x].

This is true. For each element d and assignment [g, d/x], UM ⊨ (Older(y, x) → Admires(x, y))[g, d/x, d'/y], that is, there is some element d' and variable assignment g differing from [g, d/x] only in assigning d' to 'y', such that g satisfies '(Older(y, x) → Admires(x, y))' in UM .

d. Model-theoretic consequence defined

For any set K of M-sentences and M-sentence X, we write

K ⊨ X

to mean that every M-structure that is a model of K is also a model of X, that is, X is a model-theoretic consequence of K.

(1) OlderThan(paige, matt)
(2) ∀x(Male(x) → OlderThan(paige, x))

Note that both (1) and (2) are false in the intended structure UM . We show that (2) is not a model theoretic consequence of (1) by describing a structure which is a model of (1) but not (2). The above structure U' will do the trick. By (I) it is true that U' ⊨ OlderThan(paige, matt)[g] because <(paige)[g], (matt)[g]> is in IU'(OlderThan) (because 11 is greater than 3). But, by (VII), it is not the case that

U' ⊨ ∀x(Male(x) → OlderThan(paige, x))[g]

since the variable assignment [g, 13/x] doesn't satisfy '(Male(x) → OlderThan(paige, x))' in U' according to (V) for U' ⊨ Male(x)[g, 13/x] but not U' ⊨ OlderThan(paige, x))[g, 13/x]. So, (2) is not a model-theoretic consequence of (1). Consider the following sentences.

(3) (Admires(evan, paige) → Admires(paige, kelly))
(4) (Admires(paige, kelly) → Admires(kelly, beth))
(5) (Admires(evan, paige) → Admires(kelly, beth))

(5) is a model-theoretic consequence of (3) and (4). For assume otherwise. That is assume, that there is a structure U'' such that

(i) U'' ⊨ (Admires(evan, paige) → Admires(paige, kelly))[g]

and

(ii) U'' ⊨ (Admires(paige, kelly) → Admires(kelly, beth))[g]

but not

(iii) U'' ⊨ (Admires(evan, paige) → Admires(kelly, beth))[g].

By (V), from the assumption that (iii) is false, it follows that U'' ⊨ Admires(evan, paige)[g] and not U'' ⊨ Admires(kelly, beth)[g]. Given the former, in order for (i) to hold according to (V) it must be the case that U'' ⊨ Admires(paige, kelly))[g]. But then it is true that U'' ⊨ Admires(paige, kelly))[g] and false that U'' ⊨ Admires(kelly, beth)[g], which, again appealing to (V), contradicts our assumption (ii). Hence, there is no such U'', and so (5) is a model-theoretic consequence of (3) and (4).

Here are some more examples of the model-theoretic consequence relation in action.

(6) ∃xMale(x)
(7) ∃xBrother(x, shannon)
(8) ∃x(Male(x) & Brother(x, shannon))

(8) is not a model-theoretic consequence of (6) and (7). Consider the following structure U'''.

D = {1, 2, 3}

For all M-individual constants c, IU'''(c) = 1.

IU'''(Male) = {2}, IU'''(Brother) = {<3, 1>}. For all other M-predicates P, IU'''(P) = ∅.

Appealing to the satisfaction clauses (I), (III), and (VI), it is fairly straightforward to see that the structure U''' is a model of (6) and (7) but not of (8). For example, U''' is not a model of (8) for there is no element d of D and assignment [d/x] such that

U''' ⊨ (Male(x) & Brother(x, shannon))[g, d/x].

Consider the following two sentences

(9) Female(shannon)
(10) ∃x Female(x)

(10) is a model-theoretic consequence of (9). For an arbitrary M-structure U, if U ⊨ Female(shannon)[g], then by satisfaction clause (I), shannon[g] is in IU(Female), and so there is at least one element of D, shannon[g], in IU(Female). Consequently, by (VI), U ⊨∃x Female(x)[g].

For a sentence X of M, we write

⊨ X.

to mean that X is a model-theoretic consequence of the empty set of sentences. This means that every M-structure is a model of X. Such sentences represent logical truths; it is not logically possible for them to be false. For example,

⊨ (∀x Male(x) → ∃x Male(x))

is true. Here's one explanation why. Let U be an arbitrary M-structure. We now show that

U ⊨ (∀x Male(x) → ∃x Male(x))[g].

If U ⊨ ∀x Male(x) [g] holds, then by (VII) for every element d of the domain D, U ⊨ Male(x)[g, d/x]. But we know that D is non-empty, by the requirements on structures (see the beginning of Section 4.1), and so D has at least one element d. Hence for at least one element d of D, U ⊨ Male(x)[g, d/x], that is by (VI), U ⊨∃x Male(x))[g]. So, if U ⊨ (∀x Male(x)[g] then U ⊨∃x Male(x))[g], and, therefore according to (V),

U ⊨ (∀x Male(x) → ∃x Male(x))[g].

Since U is arbitrary, this establishes

⊨ (∀x Male(x) → ∃x Male(x)).

If we treat '=' as a logical constant and require that for all M-structures U, IU(=) = {<d, d'> D2| d = d'}, then M-sentences asserting that identity is reflexive, symmetrical, and transitive are true in every M-structure, that is the following hold.

⊨ ∀x(x = x)
⊨ ∀x∀y((x = y) → (y = x))
⊨ ∀x∀y∀z(((x = y) & (y = z)) → (x = z))

Structures which assign {<d, d'> D2| d = d'} to the identity symbol are sometimes called normal models. Letting 'Ψ(v)' be any wff in which just variable v occurs free,

∀x∀y((x = y) → (Ψ(x) → Ψ(y)))

is an instance of the principle that identicals are indiscernible—if x = y then whatever holds of x holds of y—and it is true in every M-structure U that is a normal model. Treating '=' as a logical constant (which is standard) requires that we restrict the class of M-structures appealed to in the above model-theoretic definition of logical consequence to those that are normal models.

5. The Status of the Model-Theoretic Characterization of Logical Consequence

Logical consequence in language M has been defined in terms of the model-theoretic consequence relation. What is the status of this definition? We answered this question in part in Logical Consequence, Deductive-Theoretic Conceptions: Section 5a. by highlighting Tarski's argument for holding that the model-theoretic conception of logical consequence is more basic than any deductive-system account of it. Tarski points to the fact that there are languages for which valid principles of inference can't be represented in a deductive-system, but the logical consequence relation they determine can be represented model-theoretically. In what follows, we identify the type of definition the model-theoretic characterization of logical consequence is, and then discuss its adequacy.

a. The model-theoretic characterization is a theoretical definition of logical consequence

In order to determine the success of the model-theoretic characterization, we need to know what type of definition it is. Clearly it is not intended as a lexical definition. As Tarski's opening passage in his (1936) makes clear, a theory of logical consequence need not yield a report of what 'logical consequence' means. On other hand, it is clear that Tarski doesn't see himself as offering just a stipulative definition. Tarski is not merely stating how he proposes to use 'logical consequence' and 'logical truth' (but see Tarski 1986) any more than Newton was just proposing how to use certain words when he defined force in terms of mass and acceleration. Newton was invoking a fundamental conceptual relationship in order to improve our understanding of the physical world. Similarly, Tarski's definition of 'logical consequence' in terms of model-theoretic consequence is supposed to help us formulate a theory of logical consequence that deepens our understanding of what Tarski calls the common concept of logical consequence. Tarski thinks that the logical consequence relation is commonly regarded as necessary, formal, and a priori . As Tarski (1936, p. 409) says, "The concept of logical consequence is one of those whose introduction into a field of strict formal investigation was not a matter of arbitrary decision on the part of this or that investigator; in defining this concept efforts were made to adhere to the common usage of the language of everyday life."

Let's follow this approach in Tarski's (1936) and treat the model-theoretic definition as a theoretical definition of 'logical consequence'. The questions raised are whether the Tarskian model-theoretic definition of logical consequence leads to a good theory and whether it improves our understanding of logical consequence. In order to sketch a framework for thinking about this question, we review the key moves in the Tarskian analysis. In what follows, K is an arbitrary set of sentences from a language L, and X is any sentence from L. First, Tarski observes what he takes to be the commonly regarded features of logical consequence (necessity, formality, and a prioricity) and makes the following claim.

(1) X is a logical consequence of K if and only if (a) it is not possible for all the K to be true and X false, (b) this is due to the forms of the sentences, and (c) this is known a priori.

Tarski's deep insight was to see the criteria, listed in bold, in terms of the technical notion of truth in a structure. The key step in his analysis is to embody the above criteria (a)-(c) in terms of the notion of a possible interpretation of the non-logical terminology in sentences. Substituting for what is in bold in (1) we get

(2) X is a logical consequence of K if and only if there is no possible interpretation of the non-logical terminology of the language according to which all the sentences in K are true and X is false.

The third step of the Tarskian analysis of logical consequence is to use the technical notion of truth in a structure or model to capture the idea of a possible interpretation. That is, we understand there is no possible interpretation of the non-logical terminology of the language according to which all of the sentences in K are true and X is false in terms of: Every model of K is a model of X, that is, K ⊨ X.

To elaborate, as reflected in (2), the analysis turns on a selection of terms as logical constants. This is represented model-theoretically by allowing the interpretation of the non-logical terminology to change from one structure to another, and by making the interpretation of the logical constants invariant across the class of structures. Then, relative to a set of terms treated as logical, the Tarskian, model-theoretic analysis is committed to

(3) X is a logical consequence of K if and only if K ⊨ X.

and

(4) X is a logical truth, that is, it is logically impossible for X to be false, if and only if ⊨ X.

As a theoretical definition, we expect the ⊨-relation to reflect the essential features of the common concept of logical consequence. By Tarski's lights, the ⊨-consequence relation should be necessary, formal, and a priori. Note that model theory by itself does not provide the means for drawing a boundary between the logical and the non-logical. Indeed, its use presupposes that a list of logical terms is in hand. For example, taking Sister and Female to be logical constants, the consequence relation from (A) 'Sister(kelly, paige)' to (B) 'Female(kelly)' is necessary, formal and a priori. So perhaps (B) should be a logical consequence of (A). The fact that (B) is not a model-theoretic consequence of (A) is due to the fact that the interpretation of the two predicates can vary from one structure to another. To remedy this we could make the interpretation of the two predicates invariant so that '∀x(∃y Sister(x, y) → Female(x))' is true in all structures, and, therefore if (A) is true in a structure, (B) is too. The point here is that the use of models to capture the logical consequence relation requires a prior choice of what terms to treat as logical. This is, in turn, reflected in the identification of the terms whose interpretation is constant from one structure to another.

So in assessing the success of the Tarskian model-theoretic definition of logical consequence for a language L, two issues arise. First, does the model-theoretic consequence relation reflect the salient features of the common concept of logical consequence? Second, is the boundary in L between logical and non-logical terms correctly drawn? In other words: what in L qualifies as a logical constant? Both questions are motivated by the adequacy criteria for theoretical definitions of logical consequence. They are central questions in the philosophy of logic and their significance is at least partly due to the prevalent use of model theory in logic to represent logical consequence in a variety of languages. In what follows, I sketch some responses to the two questions that draw on contemporary work in philosophy of logic. I begin with the first question.

b. Does the model-theoretic consequence relation reflect the salient features of the common concept of logical consequence?

The ⊨-consequence relation is formal. Also, a brief inspection of the above justifications that K ⊨ X obtain for given K and X reveals that the ⊨-consequence relation is a priori. Does the ⊨-consequence relation capture the modal element in the common concept of logical consequence? There are critics who argue that the model-theoretic account lacks the conceptual resources to rule out the possibility of there being logically possible situations in which sentences in K are true and X is false but no structure U such that U ⊨ K and not U ⊨ X. Kneale (1961) is an early critic, and Etchemendy (1988, 1999) offers a sustained and multi-faceted attack. We follow Etchemendy. Consider the following three sentences.

(1) (Female(shannon) & ~Married(shannon, matt))
(2) (~Female(matt) & Married(beth, matt))
(3) ~Female(beth)

(3) is neither a logical nor a model-theoretic consequence of (1) and (2). However, in order for a structure to make (1) and (2) true but not (3) its domain must have at least three elements. If the world contained, say, just two things, then there would be no such structure and (3) would be a model-theoretic consequence of (1) and (2). But in this scenario, (3) would not be a logical consequence of (1) and (2) because it would still be logically possible for the world to be larger and in such a possible situation (1) and (2) can be interpreted true and (3) false. The problem raised for the model-theoretic account of logical consequence is that we do not think that the class of logically possible situations varies under different assumptions as to the cardinality of the world's elements. But the class of structures surely does since they are composed of worldly elements. This is a tricky criticism. Let's look at it from a slightly different vantagepoint.

We might think that the extension of the logical consequence relation for an interpreted language such as our language M about the McKeons is necessary. For example, it can't be the case that for some K and X, even though X isn't a logical consequence of a set K of sentences, X could be. So, on the supposition that the world contains less, the extension of the logical consequence relation should not expand. However, the extension of the model-theoretic consequence does expand. For example, (3) is not, in fact, a model-theoretic consequence of (1) and (2), but it would be if there were just two things. This is evidence that the model-theoretic characterization has failed to capture the modal notion inherent in the common concept of logical consequence.

In defense of Tarski (see Ray 1999 and Sher 1991 for defenses of the Tarskian analysis against Etchemendy), one might question the force of the criticism because it rests on the supposition that it is possible for there to be just finitely many things. How could there be just two things? Indeed, if we countenance an infinite totality of necessary existents such as abstract objects (e.g., pure sets), then the class of structures will be fixed relative to an infinite collection of necessary existents, and the above criticism that turns on it being possible that there are just n things for finite n doesn't go through (for discussion see McGee 1999). One could reply that while it is metaphysically impossible for there to be merely finitely many things it is nevertheless logically possible and this is relevant to the modal notion in the concept of logical consequence. This reply requires the existence of primitive, basic intuitions regarding the logical possibility of there being just finitely many things. However, intuitions about possible cardinalities of worldly individuals—not informed by mathematics and science—tend to run stale. Consequently, it is hard to debate this reply: one either has the needed logical intuitions, or not.

What is clear is that our knowledge of what is a model-theoretic consequence of what in a given L depends on our knowledge of the class of L-structures. Since such structures are furniture of the world, our knowledge of the model-theoretic consequence relation is grounded on knowledge of substantive facts about the world. Even if such knowledge is a priori, it is far from obvious that our a priori knowledge of the logical consequence relation is so substantive. One might argue that knowledge of what follows from what shouldn't turn on worldly matters of fact, even if they are necessary and a priori (see the discussion of the locked room metaphor in Logical Consequence, Philosophical Considerations: Section 2.2.1). If correct, this is a strike against the model-theoretic definition. However, this standard logical positivist line has been recently challenged by those who see logic penetrated and permeated by metaphysics (e.g., Putnam 1971, Almog 1989, Sher 1991, Williamson 1999). We illustrate the insight behind the challenge with a simple example. Consider the following two sentences.

(4) ∃x(Female(x) & Sister(x, evan))
(5) ∃x Female(x)

(5) is a logical consequence of (4), that is, there is no domain for the quantifiers and no interpretation of the predicates and the individual constant in that domain which makes (4) true and not (5). Why? Because on any interpretation of the non-logical terminology, (4) is true just in case the intersection of the set of objects that satisfy Female(x) and the set of objects that satisfy Sister(x, evan) is non-empty. If this obtains, then the set of objects that satisfy Female(x) is non-empty and this makes (5) true. The basic metaphysical truth underlying the reasoning here is that for any two sets, if their intersection is non-empty, then neither set is the empty set. This necessary and a priori truth about the world, in particular about its set-theoretic part, is an essential reason why (5) follows from (4). This approach, reflected in the model-theoretic consequence relation (see Sher 1996), can lead to an intriguing view of the formality of logical consequence reminiscent of the pre-Wittgensteinian views of Russell and Frege. Following the above, the consequence relation from (4) to (5) is formal because the metaphysical truth on which it turns describes a formal (structural) feature of the world. In other words: it is not possible for (4) to be true and (5) false because

For any extensions of P, P', if an object α satisfies '(P(v) & P'(v, n))', then α satisfies 'P(v)'.

According to this vision of the formality of logical consequence, the consequence relation between (4) and (5) is formal because what is in bold expresses a formal feature of reality. Russell writes that, "Logic, I should maintain, must no more admit a unicorn than zoology can; for logic is concerned with the real world just as truly as zoology, though with its more abstract and general features" (Russell 1919, p. 169). If we take the abstract and general features of the world to be its formal features, then Russell's remark captures the view of logic that emerges from anchoring the necessity, formality and a priority of logical consequence in the formal features of the world. The question arises as to what counts as a formal feature of the world. If we say that all set-theoretic truths depict formal features of the world, including claims about how many sets there are, then this would seem to justify making

∃x∃y~(x = y)

(that is, there are at least two individuals) a logical truth since it is necessary, a priori, and a formal truth. To reflect model-theoretically that such sentences, which consist just of logical terminology, are logical truths we would require that the domain of a structure simply be the collection of the world's individuals. See Sher (1991) for an elaboration and defense of this view of the formality of logical truth and consequence. See Shapiro (1993) for further discussion and criticism of the project of grounding our logical knowledge on primitive intuitions of logical possibility instead of on our knowledge of metaphysical truths.

Part of the difficulty in reaching a consensus with respect to whether or not the model-theoretic consequence relation reflects the salient features of the common concept of logical consequence is that philosophers and logicians differ over what the features of the common concept are. Some offer accounts of the logical consequence relation according to which it is not a priori (e.g., see Koslow 1999, Sher 1991 and see Hanson 1997 for criticism of Sher) or deny that it even need be strongly necessary (Smiley 1995, 2000, section 6). Here we illustrate with a quick example.

Given that we know that a McKeon only admires those who are older (that is, we know that (a) ∀x∀y(Admires(x, y) → OlderThan(y, x))), wouldn't we take (7) to be a logical consequences of (6)?

(6) Admires(paige, kelly)
(7) OlderThan(kelly, paige)

A Tarskian response is that (7) is not a consequence of (6) alone, but of (6) plus (a). So in thinking that (7) follows from (6), one assumes (a). A counter suggestion is to say that (7) is a logical consequence of (6) for if (6) is true, then necessarily-relative-to-the-truth-of-(a) (7) is true. The modal notion here is a weakened sense of necessity: necessity relative to the truth of a collection of sentences, which in this case is composed of (a). Since (a) is not a priori, neither is the consequence relation between (6) and (7). The motive here seems to be that this conception of modality is inherent in the notion of logical consequence that drives deductive inference in science, law, and other fields outside of the logic classroom. This supposes that a theory of logical consequence must not only account for the features of the intuitive concept of logical consequence but also reflect the intuitively correct deductive inferences. After all, the logical consequence relation is the foundation of deductive inference: it is not correct to deductively infer B from A unless B is a logical consequence of A. Referring to our example, in a conversation where (a) is a truth that is understood and accepted by the conversants, the inference from (6) to (7) seems legit. Hence, this should be supported by an accompanying concept of logical consequence. This idea of construing the common concept of logical consequence in part by the lights of basic intuitions about correct inferences is reflected in the Relevance logician's objection to the Tarskian account. The Relevance logician claims that X is not a logical consequence of K unless K is relevant to X. For example, consider the following pairs of sentences.

(1) (Female(evan) & ~Female(evan)) (1) Admires(kelly, paige)
(2) Admires(kelly, shannon) (2) (Female(evan) v ~Female(evan))

In the first pair, (1) is logically false, and in the second, (2) is a logical truth. Hence it isn't possible for (1) to be true and (2) false. Since this seems to be formally determined and a priori, for each pair (2) is a logical consequence of (1) according to Tarski. Against this Anderson and Belnap write, "the fancy that relevance is irrelevant to validity [that is logical consequence] strikes us as ludicrous, and we therefore make an attempt to explicate the notion of relevance of A to B" (Anderson and Belnap 1975, pp. 17-18). The typical support for the relevance conception of logical consequence draws on intuitions regarding correct inference, e.g. it is counterintuitive to think that it is correct to infer (2) from (1) in either pair for what does being a female have to do with who one admires? Would you think it correct to infer, say, that Admires(kelly, shannon) on the basis of (Female(evan) & ~Female(evan))? For further discussion of the different types of relevance logic and more on the relevant philosophical issues see Haack (1978, pp. 198-203) and Read (1995, pp. 54-63). The bibliography in Haack (1996, pp. 264-265) is helpful. For further discussion on relevance logic, see Logical Consequence, Deductive-Theoretic Conceptions: Section 5.2.1.

Our question is, does the model-theoretic consequence relation reflect the essential features of the common concept of logical consequence? Our discussion illustrates at least two things. First, it isn't obvious that the model-theoretic definition of logical consequence reflects the Tarskian portrayal of the common concept. One option, not discussed above, is to deny that the model-theoretic definition is a theoretical definition and argue for its utility simply on the basis that it is extensionally equivalent with the common concept (see Shapiro 1998). Our discussion also illustrates that Tarski's identification of the essential features of logical consequence is disputed. One reaction, not discussed above, is to question the presupposition of the debate and take a more pluralist approach to the common concept of logical consequence. On this line, it is not so much that the common concept of logical consequence is vague as it is ambiguous. At minimum, to say that a sentence X is a logical consequence of a set K of sentences is to say that X is true in every circumstance (that is logically possible situation) in which the sentences in K are true. "Different disambiguations of this notion arise from taking different extensions of the term 'circumstance' " (Restall 2002, p. 427). If we disambiguate the relevant notion of 'circumstance' by the lights of Tarski, 'Admires(kelly, paige)' is a logical consequence of '(Female(evan) & ~Female(evan))'. If we follow the Relevance logician, then not. There is no fact of the matter about whether or not the first sentence is a logical consequence of the second independent of such a disambiguation.

c. What is a logical constant?

We turn to the second, related issue of what qualifies as a logical constant. Tarski (1936, 418-419) writes,

No objective grounds are known to me which permit us to draw a sharp boundary between [logical and non-logical terms]. It seems possible to include among logical terms some which are usually regarded by logicians as extra-logical without running into consequences which stand in sharp contrast to ordinary usage.

And at the end of his (1936), he tells us that the fluctuation in the common usage of the concept of consequence would be accurately reflected in a relative concept of logical consequence, that is a relative concept "which must, on each occasion, be related to a definite, although in greater or less degree arbitrary, division of terms into logical and extra logical" (p. 420). Unlike the relativity described in the previous paragraph, which speaks to the features of the concept of logical consequence, the relativity contemplated by Tarski concerns the selection of logical constants. Tarski's observations of the common concept do not yield a sharp boundary between logical and non-logical terms. It seems that the sentential connectives and the quantifiers of our language M about the McKeons qualify as logical if any terms of M do. We've also followed many logicians and included the identity predicate as logical. (See Quine 1986 for considerations against treating '=' as a logical constant.) But why not include other predicates such as 'OlderThan'?

(1) OlderThan(kelly, paige) (3) ~OlderThan(kelly, kelly)
(2) ~OlderThan(paige, kelly)

Then the consequence relation from (1) to (2) is necessary, formal, and a priori and the truth of (3) is necessary, formal and also a priori. If treating 'OlderThan' as a logical constant does not do violence to our intuitions about the features of the common concept of logical consequence and truth, then it is hard to see why we should forbid such a treatment. By the lights of the relative concept of logical consequence, there is no fact of the matter about whether (2) is a logical consequence of (1) since it is relative to the selection of 'OlderThan' as a logical constant. On the other hand, Tarski hints that even by the lights of the relative concept there is something wrong in thinking that B follows from A and B only relative to taking 'and' as a logical constant. Rather, B follows from A and B we might say absolutely since 'and' should be on everybody's list of logical constants. But why do 'and' and the other sentential connectives, along with the identity predicate and the quantifiers have more of a claim to logical constancy than, say, 'OlderThan'? Tarski (1936) offers no criteria of logical constancy that help answer this question.

On the contemporary scene, there are three general approaches to the issue of what qualifies as a logical constant. One approach is to argue for an inherent property (or properties) of logical constancy that some expressions have and others lack. For example, topic neutrality is one feature traditionally thought to essentially characterize logical constants. The sentential connectives, the identity predicate, and the quantifiers seem topic neutral: they seem applicable to discourse on any topic. The predicates other than identity such as 'OlderThan' do not appear to be topic neutral, at least as standardly interpreted, e.g., 'OlderThan' has no application in the domain of natural numbers. One way of making the concept of topic neutrality precise is to follow Tarski's suggestion in his (1986) that the logical notions expressed in a language L are those notions that are invariant under all one-one transformations of the domain of discourse onto itself. A one-one transformation of the domain of discourse onto itself is a one-one function whose domain and range coincide with the domain of discourse. And a one-one function is a function that always assigns different values to different objects in its domain (that is, for all x and y in the domain of f, if f(x) = f(y), then x = y).

Consider 'Olderthan'. By Tarski's lights, the notion expressed by the predicate is its extension, that is the set of ordered pairs <d, d'> such that d is older than d'. Recall that the extension is:

{<Beth, Matt>, <Beth, Shannon>, <Beth, Kelly>, <Beth, Paige>, <Beth, Evan>, <Matt, Shannon>, <Matt, Kelly>, <Matt, Paige>, <Matt, Evan>, <Shannon, Kelly>, <Shannon, Paige>, <Shannon, Evan>, <Kelly, Paige>, <Kelly, Evan>, <Paige, Evan>}.

If 'OlderThan' is a logical constant its extension (the notion it expresses) should be invariant under every one-one transformation of the domain of discourse (that is the set of McKeons) onto itself. A set is invariant under a one-one transformation f when the set is carried onto itself by the transformation. For example, the extension of 'Female' is invariant under f when for every d, d is a female if and only if f(d) is. 'OlderThan' is invariant under f when <d, d'> is in the extension of 'OlderThan' if and only if <f(d), f(d')> is. Clearly, the extensions of the Female predicate and the Olderthan relation are not invariant under every one-one transformation. For example, Beth is older than Matt, but f(Beth) is not older than f(Matt) when f(Beth) = Evan and f(Matt) = Paige. Compare the identity relation: it is invariant under every one-one transformation of the domain of McKeons because it holds for each and every McKeon. The invariance condition makes precise the concept of topic neutrality. Any expression whose extension is altered by a one-one transformation must discriminate among elements of the domain, making the relevant notions topic-specific. The invariance condition can be extended in a straightforward way to the quantifiers and sentential connectives (see McCarthy 1981 and McGee 1997). Here I illustrate with the existential quantifier. Let Ψ be a well-formed formula with 'x' as its only free variable. '∃x Ψ' has a truth-value in the intended structure UM for our language M about the McKeons. Let f be an arbitrary one-one transformation of the domain D of McKeons onto itself. The function f determines an interpretation I' for Ψ in the range D' of f. The existential quantifier satisfies the invariance requirement for UM ⊨∃x Ψ if and only if U ⊨∃x Ψ for every U derived by a one-one transformation f of the domain D of UM (we say that the U's are isomorphic with UM ).

For example, consider the following existential quantification.

∃x Female(x)

This is true in the intended structure for our language M about the McKeons (that is, UM ⊨∃x Female(x)[g]) ultimately because the set of elements that satisfy 'Female(x)' on some variable assignment that extends g is non-empty (recall that Beth, Shannon, Kelly, and Paige are females). The cardinality of the set of McKeons that satisfy an M-formula is invariant under every one-one transformation of the domain of McKeons onto itself. Hence, for every U isomorphic with UM, the set of elements from DU that satisfy 'Female(x)' on some variable assignment that extends g is non-empty and so

U ⊨∃x Female(x)[g].

Speaking to the other part of the invariance requirement given at the end of the previous paragraph, clearly for every U isomorphic with UM, if U ⊨∃x Female(x)[g], then UM ⊨∃x Female(x)[g] (since U is isomorphic with itself). Crudely, the topic neutrality of the existential quantifier is confirmed by the fact that it is invariant under all one-one transformations of the domain of discourse onto itself.

Key here is that the cardinality of the subset of the domain D that satisfies an L-formula under an interpretation is invariant under every one-one transformation of D onto itself. For example, if at least two elements from D satisfy a formula on an interpretation of it, then at least two elements from D' satisfy the formula under the I' induced by f. This makes not only 'All' and 'Some' topic neutral, but also any cardinality quantifier such as 'Most', 'Finitely many', 'Few', 'At least two', etc. The view suggested in Tarski (1986, p. 149) is that the logic of a language L is the science of all notions expressible in L which are invariant under one-one transformations of L's domain of discourse. For further discussion, defense of, and extensions of the Tarskian invariance requirement on logical constancy, in addition to McCarthy (1981) and McGee (1997), see Sher (1989, 1991).

A second approach to what qualifies as a logical constant is not to make topic neutrality a necessary condition for logical constancy. This undercuts at least some of the significance of the invariance requirement. Instead of thinking that there is an inherent property of logical constancy, we allow the choice of logical constants to depend, at least in part, on the needs at hand, as long as the resulting consequence relation reflects the essential features of the intuitive, pre-theoretic concept of logical consequence. I take this view to be very close to the one that we are left with by default in Tarski (1936). The approach is suggested in Prior (1976) and developed in related but different ways in Hanson (1996) and Warmbrod (1999). It amounts to regarding logic in a strict sense and loose sense. Logic in the strict sense is the science of what follows from what relative to topic neutral expressions, and logic in the loose sense is the study of what follows from what relative to both topic neutral expressions and those topic centered expressions of interest that yield a consequence relation possessing the salient features of the common concept.

Finally, a third approach the issue of what makes an expression a logical constant is simply to reject the view of logical consequence as a formal consequence relation, thereby nullifying the need to distinguish logical terminology in the first place (see Etchemendy 1983 and Bencivenga 1999). We just say, for example, that X is a logical consequence of a set K of sentences if the supposition that all of the K are true and X false violates the meaning of component terminology. Hence, 'Female(kelly)' is a logical consequence of 'Sister(kelly, paige)' simply because the supposition otherwise violates the meaning of the predicates. Whether or not 'Female' and 'Sister' are logical terms doesn't come into play.

6. Conclusion

Using the first-order language M as the context for our inquiry, we have discussed the model-theoretic conception of the conditions that must be met in order for a sentence to be a logical consequence of others. This theoretical characterization is motivated by a distinct development of the common concept of logical consequence. The issue of the nature of logical consequence, which intersects with other areas of philosophy, is still a matter of debate. Any full coverage of the topic would involve study of the logical consequence relation between sentences from other types of languages such as modal languages (containing necessity and possibility operators) (see Hughes and Cresswell 1996) and second-order languages (containing variables that range over properties) (see Shapiro 1991). See also the entries, Logical Consequence, Philosophical Considerations, and Logical Consequence, Deductive-Theoretic Conceptions, in the encyclopedia.

7. References and Further Reading

  • Almog, J. (1989): "Logic and the World", pp. 43-65 in Themes From Kaplan, ed. J. Almog, J. Perry, and H. Wettstein. New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Anderson, A.R., and N. Belnap (1975): Entailment: The Logic of Relevance and Necessity. Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Bencivenga, E. (1999): "What is Logic About?", pp. 5-19 in Varzi (1999).
  • Etchemendy, J. (1983): "The Doctrine of Logic as Form", Linguistics and Philosophy 6, pp. 319-334.
  • Etchemendy, J. (1988): "Tarski on truth and logical consequence", Journal of Symbolic Logic 53, pp. 51-79.
  • Etchemendy, J. (1999): The Concept of Logical Consequence. Stanford: CSLI Publications.
  • Haack, S. (1978): Philosophy of Logics. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Haack, S. (1996): Deviant Logic, Fuzzy Logic. Chicago: The University of Chicago Press.
  • Hanson, W. (1997): "The Concept of Logical Consequence", The Philosophical Review 106, pp. 365-409.
  • Hughes, G. E. and M.J Cresswell (1996): A New Introduction to Modal Logic. London: Routledge.
  • Kneale, W. (1961): "Universality and Necessity", British Journal for the Philosophy of Science 12, pp. 89-102.
  • Kneale, W. and M. Kneale (1986): The Development of Logic. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Koslow, A. (1999): "The Implicational Nature of Logic: A Structuralist Account", pp. 111-155 in Varzi (1999).
  • McCarthy, T. (1981): "The Idea of a Logical Constant", Journal of Philosophy 78, pp. 499-523.
  • McCarthy, T. (1998): "Logical Constants", pp. 599-603 in Routledge Encyclopedia of Philosophy, vol. 5, ed. E. Craig. London: Routledge.
  • McGee, V. (1999): "Two Problems with Tarski's Theory of Consequence", Proceedings of the Aristotelean Society 92, pp. 273-292.
  • Priest. G. (1995): "Etchemendy and Logical Consequence", Canadian Journal of Philosophy 25, pp. 283-292.
  • Prior, A. (1976): "What is Logic?", pp. 122-129 in Papers in Logic and Ethics ed. P.T. Geach and A. Kenny. Amherst: University of Massachusetts Press.
  • Putnam, H. (1971): Philosophy of Logic. New York: Harper & Row.
  • Quine, W.V. (1986): Philosophy of Logic, 2nd ed. Cambridge: Harvard University Press.
  • Ray, G. (1996): "Logical Consequence: A Defense of Tarski", Journal of Philosophical Logic 25, pp. 617-677.
  • Read, S. (1995): Thinking About Logic. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Restall, G. (2002): "Carnap's Tolerance, Meaning, And Logical Pluralism", Journal of Philosophy 99, pp. 426-443.
  • Russell, B. (1919): Introduction to Mathematical Philosophy. London: Routledge, 1993 printing.
  • Shapiro, S. (1991): Foundations without Foundationalism: A Case For Second-order Logic. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Shapiro, S. (1993): "Modality and Ontology", Mind 102, pp. 455-481.
  • Shapiro, S. (1998): "Logical Consequence: "Models and Modality", pp. 131-156 in The Philosophy of Mathematics Today, ed. Matthias Schirn. Oxford, Clarendon Press.
  • Sher, G. (1989): "A Conception of Tarskian Logic", Pacific Philosophical Quarterly 70, pp. 341-368.
  • Sher, G. (1991): The Bounds of Logic: A Generalized Viewpoint. Cambridge, Mass: MIT Press.
  • Sher, G. (1996): "Did Tarski Commit 'Tarski's Fallacy'?" Journal of Symbolic Logic 61, pp. 653-686.
  • Sher, G. (1999): "Is Logic a Theory of the Obvious?", pp.207-238 in Varzi (1999).
  • Smiley, T. (1995): "A Tale of Two Tortoises", Mind 104, pp. 725-36.
  • Smiley, T. (1998): "Consequence, Conceptions of", pp. 599-603 in Routledge Encyclopedia of Philosophy, vol. 2, ed. E. Craig. London: Routledge.
  • Tarski, A. (1933): "Pojecie prawdy w jezykach nauk dedukeycyjnych", translated as "On the Concept of Truth in Formalized Languages", pp. 152-278 in Tarski (1983).
  • Tarski, A. (1936): "On the Concept of Logical Consequence", pp. 409-420 in Tarski (1983).
  • Tarski, A. (1983): Logic, Semantics, Metamathematics 2nd ed. Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing.
  • Tarski, A. (1986): "What are Logical Notions?" History and Philosophy of Logic 7, pp. 143-154.
  • Varzi, A., ed. (1999): European Review of Philosophy, vol. 4, The Nature of Logic. Stanford: CSLI Publications.
  • Warbrod, K., (1999): "Logical Constants", Mind 108, pp. 503-538.

Author Information

Matthew McKeon
Email: mckeonm@msu.edu
Michigan State University
U. S. A.

Categories: Logic