Peter Lombard, a scholastic theologian of the twelfth century, was commonly known as “the Lombard” after his birthplace which actually was probably Novara. It is expected that he then moved to Lombardy approximately after his birth in 1105-1110 CE He died in Paris, France about 1160 (1164). Although his family was poor, he found powerful patrons such as St. Bernard, that enabled him to gain a higher education at Bologna, then at Reims in France, and finally in Paris. In Paris, Peter taught theology in the cathedral school of Notre Dame, and it was there he found the time to produce the works discussed later in this article. Their dates can be only approximately fixed. The most famous of them, the Libri quatuor sententiarum , was probably composed between 1147 and 1150, although it may be placed as late as 1155. Nothing is certainly known of his later life except that be became bishop of Paris in 1159. According to Walter of St. Victor, a hostile witness, Peter obtained the office by simony; the more usual story is that Philip, younger brother of Louis VII. and archdeacon of Paris, was elected but declined in favor of Peter, his teacher. The date of his death can not be determined with certainty. The ancient epitaph in the church of St. Marcel at Paris assigns it to 1164, but the figures seem to be a later addition. The demonstrable fact that Maurice of Sully was bishop before the end of 1160 seems conclusive against it, although it is possible that in that year he resigned his see and lived three or four years longer.
The historic importance of Peter Lombard rests on his Sentences and the position taken by them in medieval philosophy. The earlier dogmatic theologians, such as Isidore of Seville, Alcuin, and Paschasius Radbert, had attempted to establish the doctrine of the Church from Bible texts and quotations from the Fathers. In the eleventh century this method gave place to dialectical and speculative working over of the traditional dogmas. Peter Lombard came into the field at a time when the now methods and their dialectical artifices were still exposed to wide-spread objection, but when the thirst for knowledge was exceedingly keen. One text-book after another was being published, the majority of them either issuing from the school of Abelard, or in some degree inspired by him. Of these works the greatest influence was attained by that of Peter, which was, for the time, an admirable compendium of theological knowledge. It is written under the influence preeminently of Abelard, Hugo of St. Victor, and the Decretum of Gratian. Whether Peter had himself seen the early writers whom he cites is frequently uncertain. As to his contemporaries, whom he knew thoroughly, he shows the influence of Abelard in his whole method and in countless details, while preserving a critical attitude toward his most pronounced peculiarities. On the other hand, he follows Hugo very closely and often textually, though here also with a tendency to avoid the purely speculative elements. For his sacramental doctrine, Gratian is very useful, especially through the quotations adduced by him and his legal attitude toward these questions.
The first book of the Sentences deals, principally from a cosmological standpoint, with the evidences for the existence of God. For the doctrine of the Trinity he appeals to the analogies used since Augustine. However, he denies that any real knowledge of the doctrine can be obtained from these analogies without positive revelation and faith, and emphasizing the fact that human speech cannot give a satisfactory account of the nature of God. Joachim of Flore asserted that Peter changed the Trinity into a quaternity, and the charge was investigated at the Lateran Council of 1215. The basis of this charge was the manner in which he distinguished the divine substance from the three persons. Lombard asserted, as a realist, the substantive reality of this common substance. Joachim accused him of adding this substance to the three persons, but Innocent III. and the council decided that he was perfectly orthodox. The relation between the prescience of God and events is conceived in such a way that neither that which happens is the actual ground of the foreknowledge nor the latter of the former, but each is to the other a causa sine qua non . Predestination is thus, as a divine election, the preparation of grace and the foreknowledge and preparation of the blessings of God, through which man is justified. There is no such thing as merit antecedent to grace, not even in the sense that man can merit not to be cast away. The omnipotence of God consists in this, that he does what he wills and suffers nothing. A distinction is made between the absolute uncaused will of God, which is always accomplished, and what may be called his will in a loose sense. To thesigna beneplaciti , the signs of the latter, including commands, prohibitions, counsels, operations, permissions, results do not always correspond-” for God commanded Abraham to sacrifice his son, yet did not will it to be done.”
The second book of the Sentences deals with creation and the doctrine of the angels. Peter, following Hugo, considers the ” image ” and ” likeness ” of God as distinct, but does not decide for any of the three explanations of this distinction which he quotes. He rejects the traducianist theory of the origin of the human soul. He calls the will free, inasmuch as it ” has power to desire and choose, without coercion or necessity, what it has decreed on grounds of reason,” but he denies Abelard’s theory that the moral character of an act depends on the will of the doer. Of some importance is the strong emphasis laid upon the actually sinful character of the nature derived from Adam, in conjunction with the condemnation of Abelard’s proposition that ” we inherit from Adam not guilt but penalty.” In regard to grace he shows some independent thought, which had its influence on later teaching. Grace (gratia operans) is a power (virtus) which frees and heals the will, enabling it to perform good and meritorious works. Of grace and the will, grace is the more important. The third book deals with Christology, reproducing the traditional orthodox conceptions, but showing some influence from Abelard. One portion of this discussion brought him into suspicion of Nihilianism. He was accused by John of Cornwall and Walter of St. Victor, and more than one council took up the question without reaching a conclusion. The charge of Nestorianisn, which Gerhoh of Reichersberg brought against the Christology of his time, was made also against the Lombard. In regard to the atonement, he endeavored both to follow out the accepted system of his day and to make use of suggestions from Abelard. Christ merited glorification by his life, and by his death man’s entrance into Paradise, his liberation from sin and its penalty and from the power of the devil. Christ as man is a perfect and sufficient sacrifice to achieve reconciliation, through the revelation of God’s love made in his death; ” the death of Christ then justifies us, when by it love is awakened in our hearts.” Further, Christ sets man free from eternal punishment relaxando debitum; but to set man free from the temporal punishment, which is remitted in baptism and mitigated by penance, ” the penances laid upon those who repent by the Church would not suffice unless the penalty borne by Christ were added to release us.” There is a lack of clearness about this whole subject; the ideas of Abelard (Anselm is not noticed) show themselves now and again through all the effort to preserve the objective notion of the work of redemption.
The fourth book deals with the sacraments. Here Peter follows Hugo and the Decretum of Gratian; and his teaching was of great significance for the later development. He was probably the first to make a distinct classification of seven and only seven sacraments; he laid down the dogmatic questions to be discussed under the head of each, and he introduced matter from church law into his discussion of the sacramental dogma. In regard to the Eucharist, he speaks of the ” conversion ” of one substance into the other, without defining any further, and denies both the symbolic view and the consubstantiation taught by some followers of Berengar. In his doctrine of penance he follows Abelard in seeking theoretical justification for the change which by this time had taken place in the practice.
In spite of the cautious objectivity of the whole treatment, some of the propositions laid down in the Sentences were considered erroneous in after years. Walter of St. Victor asserts that at the Lateran council of 1179 it was proposed to condemn the Sentences but other matters prevented a discussion of the proposal. From the middle of the thirteenth century the University of Paris refused its assent to eight propositions, of a highly technical character, it is true, and Bonaventure declined to press them. Others were afterward added; but these objections did not interfere with the general popularity of the work, which had increased to such an extent by Roger Bacon’s time (1267) that he could complain that lectures on it had forced those on Scriptural subjects into the background. Besides the ” Sentences,” other extant works of Peter Lombard are Commentarius in psalmos Davidicos and Collectanea in omnes D. Paitli epistolas both collections, in the manner of medieval Catenae, of quotations from patristic and early medieval theologians, with occasional independent remarks. A few unpublished manuscripts, some of them of doubtful authenticity, remain in various places. Of these the most important for a complete knowledge of the author are two manuscripts, one early thirteenth century, the other fourteenth, in the Bibliotheque Nationale at Paris, containing twenty-five festival sermons representing. a moderate type of medieval mystical theology, dominated by allegorical exegesis, but making some excellent practical points.
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Last updated: April 17, 2001 | Originally published: April/17/2001
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