When we try to reconcile opposing moral opinions we usually appeal to shared ethical principles. Yet often enough the principles themselves are opposed. We may then try to reconcile opposing principles by clarifying how we arrived at them. But since most of our principles are cultural inheritances, discussions halt at a tolerant mutual respect, even when we remain convinced that the other person is wrong. What is needed is a method in ethics that can uncover the sources of error. After all, even culturally inherited principles first occurred to someone, and that someone may or may not have been biased. So there is considerable merit to investigating the innate methods of our minds and hearts by which we construe – and sometimes misconstrue – ethical principles. The work of Bernard Lonergan can guide this investigation. His opus covers methodological issues in the natural sciences, the human sciences, historical scholarship, aesthetics, economics, philosophy and theology. He begins with an invitation to consider in ourselves what occurs when we come to knowledge. He then defines a corresponding epistemological meaning of objectivity. From there he lays out basic metaphysical categories applicable in the sciences. Finally, he proposes a methodical framework for collaboration in resolving basic differences in all these disciplines.
This review will begin by tracing the origins of Lonergan’s approach. Following that will be the four steps of a cognitional theory, an epistemology, a metaphysics, and a methodology, particularly as they apply to resolving differences in moral opinions and in ethical principles. Finally, there will be a reexamination of several fundamental categories in ethics.
Bernard Lonergan, a preeminent Canadian philosopher, theologian and economist, (1904-1984) was the principal architect of what he named a “generalized empirical method.” Born in Buckingham, Quebec, Lonergan received a typical Catholic education and eventually entered the Society of Jesus (Jesuits), leading to his ordination to the priesthood in 1936. He specialized in both theology and economics at this time, having been deeply influenced by his doctoral work on Thomas Aquinas and by his long-standing interest in the philosophy of culture and history, honed by his reading of Hegel and Marx. In the early 1950s, while teaching theology in Toronto, Lonergan wrote Insight: A Study of Human Understanding – his groundbreaking philosophical work. Then, in the early 70s, he published his equally fundamental work, Method in Theology. Throughout his career, he lectured and wrote on topics related to theology, philosophy, and economics. The University of Toronto has undertaken the publication of The Collected Works of Bernard Lonergan, for which 20 volumes are projected.
Lonergan aimed to clarify what occurs in any discipline – science, math, historiography, art, literature, philosophy, theology, or ethics. The need for clarification about methods has been growing over the last few centuries as the world has turned from static mentalities and routines to the ongoing management of change. Modern languages, modern architecture, modern art, modern science, modern education, modern medicine, modern law, modern economics, the modern idea of history and the modern idea of philosophy all are based on the notion of ongoing creativity. Where older philosophies sought to understand unchanging essentials, logic and law were the rule. With the emergence of modernity, philosophies have turned to understanding the innate methods of mind by which scientists and scholars discover what they do not yet know and create what does not yet exist.
The success of the empirical methods of the natural sciences confirms that the mind reaches knowledge by an ascent from data, through hypothesis, to verification. To account for disciplines that deal with humans as makers of meanings and values, Lonergan generalized the notion of data to include the data of consciousness as well as the data of sense. From that compound data, one may ascend through hypothesis to verification of the operations by which humans deal with what is meaningful and what is valuable. Hence, a “generalized empirical method” (GEM).
Lonergan also referred to GEM as a critical realism. By realism, in line with the Aristotelian and Thomist philosophies, he affirmed that we make true judgments of fact and of value, and by critical, he aimed to ground knowing and valuing in a critique of the mind similar to that proposed by Kant.
GEM traces to their roots in consciousness the sources of the meanings and values that constitute personality, social orders, and historical developments. GEM also explores the many ways these meanings and values are distorted, identifies the elements that contribute to recovery, and proposes a framework for collaboration among disciplines to overcome these distortions and promote better living together.
These explorations are conducted in the manner of personal experiments. In Insight and Method in Theology, Lonergan leads readers to discover what happens when they reach knowledge, evaluate options, and make decisions. He expects that those who make these discoveries about themselves reach an explicit knowledge of how anyone reaches knowledge and values, how inquiries are guided by internal criteria, and how therefore any inquiry may be called “objective.” Such objectivity implies structural parallels between the processes of inquiry and the structures of what any inquirer, in any place or time, can know and value. Lonergan proposes that these structures, in turn, provide a personally verified clarification of the methods specific to the natural and human sciences, historiography and hermeneutics, economics, aesthetics, theology, ethics, and philosophy itself.
So there are four questions, as it were, that GEM proposes for anyone seeking to ground the methods of any discipline. (1) A cognitional theory asks, “What do I do when I know?” It encompasses what occurs in our judgments of fact and value. (2) An epistemology asks, “Why is doing that knowing?” It demonstrates how these occurrences may appropriately be called “objective.” (3) A metaphysics asks “What do I know when I do it?” It identifies corresponding structures of the realities we know and value. (4) A methodology asks, “What therefore should we do?” It lays out a framework for collaboration, based on the answers to the first three questions.
In the following sections, a review of how ethicists familiar with GEM deal with each of these four questions will reveal dimensions that directly affect one’s method in ethics.
GEM relies on a personal realization that we know in two different manners – commonsense and theoretical. In both we experience insights, which are acts of understanding. In the commonsense mode, we grasp how things are related to ourselves because we are concerned about practicalities, our interpersonal relations, and our social roles. In the theoretical mode, we grasp how things are related to each other because we want to understand the nature of things, such as the law of gravity in physics or laws of repression in psychology. Theoretical insights may not be immediately practical, but because they look at the always and everywhere, their practicality encompasses any brand of common sense with its preoccupation with the here and now.
The theoretical terms defined in GEM should not be confused with their commonsense usage. To take a basic distinction, GEM defines morality as the commonsense assessments and behaviors of everyday living and ethics as the theoretical constructs that shape morality.
Each mode of knowing has its proper criteria, although not everyone reputed to have either common sense or theoretical acumen can say what these criteria are. A recurring theme throughout Lonergan’s opus is that the major impediment in theoretical pursuits is the assumption that understanding must be something like picturing. For example, mathematicians who blur understanding with picturing will find it difficult to picture how 0.999… can be exactly 1.000…. Now most adults understand that 1/3 = 0.333…, and that when you triple both sides of this equation, you get exactly 1.000… and 0.999…. But only those who understand that an insight is not an act of picturing but rather an act of understanding will be comfortable with this explanation. Among them are the physicists who understand what Einstein and Heisenberg discovered about subatomic particles and macroastronomical events – it is not by picturing that we know how they function but rather by understanding the data.
Lonergan also notes that philosophers who blur the difference between picturing and the theoretical modes of knowing will be confused about objectivity. When it comes to understanding how the mind knows, they typically picture a thinker in here and reality out there, and ask how one gets from in here to out there – failing to notice that it is not by any picture but by verifying one’s understanding of data that the thinker already knows that he or she really thinks.
GEM’s goal of a theory of cognition, therefore, is not a set of pictures. It is a set of insights into the data of cognitive activities, followed by a personal verification of those insights. In disciplines that study humans, GEM incorporates the moral dimension by addressing how we know values that lead to moral decisions. So, in GEM’s model of the thinking and choosing person, consciousness has four levels – experience of data, understanding the data, judgment that one’s understanding is correct, and decision to act on the resulting knowledge. These are referred to as levels of self-transcendence, meaning that they are the principal set of operations by which we transcend the solitary self and deal with the world beyond ourselves through our wonder and care.
GEM builds on these realizations by the further personal discovery of certain innate norms at each of the four levels. On the level of experience, our attention is prepatterned, shifting our focus, often desultorily, among at least seven areas of interest – biological, sexual, practical, dramatic, aesthetic, intellectual, and mystical. On the level of understanding, our intellects pursue answers to questions of why and how and what for, excluding irrelevant data and half-baked ideas. On the level of judgment, our reason tests that our understanding makes sense of experience. On the level of decision, our consciences make value judgments and will bother us until we conform our actions to these judgments. Lonergan names these four innate norming processes “transcendental precepts.” Briefly expressed, they are: Be attentive, Be Intelligent, Be reasonable, and Be responsible. But these expressions are not meant as formulated rules; they are English words that point to the internal operating norms by which anyone transcends himself or herself to live in reality. GEM uses the term authenticity to refer to the quality in persons who follow these norms.
Any particular rules or principles or priorities or criteria we formulate about moral living stem ultimately from these unformulated, but pressing internal criteria for better and worse. Whether our formulations of moral stances are objectively good, honestly mistaken, or malevolently distorted, there are no more fundamental criteria by which we make moral judgments. Maxims, such as “Treat others as you want to be treated,” cannot be ultimately fundamental, since it is not on any super-maxim that we selected this one. Nor do authorities provide us with our ultimate values, since there is no super-authority to name the authorities we ought to follow. Rather, we rely on the normative criteria of being attentive, intelligent, reasonable and responsible; howsoever they may have matured in us, by which we select all maxims and authorities.
GEM includes many other elements in this analysis, including the roles of belief and inherited values, the dynamics of feelings and our inner symbolic worlds, the workings of bias, the rejection of true value in favor of mere satisfaction, and the commitment to love rather than hate.
GEM may be characterized as a systems approach that correlates the subject’s operations of knowing and choosing to their corresponding objects. Hence it understands objectivity as a correlation between the subject’s intentionality and the realities and values intended. A subject’s intention of objectivity functions as an ideal to be continuously approached. That ideal may be defined as the totality of correct judgments, supported by understanding, and verified in experience. Because our knowledge and values are mostly inherited, objectivity is the intended cumulative product of all successful efforts to know what is truly so and appreciate what is truly good. Clearly, we never know everything real or appreciate everything good. But despite any shortfalls, this principal notion of objectivity – the totality of correct judgments — remains the recurring desire and the universal goal of anyone who wonders. In GEM’s correlation-based, theoretical definition, such objectivity is a progressively more intelligent, reasonable and responsible worldview. Briefly put, an objective worldview is the fruit of subjective authenticity.
Confusion about objectivity may be traced to confusion about knowing. GEM proposes that any investigator who realizes that knowing is a compound of experience, understanding, and judgment may also recognize a persistent tendency to reduce objectivity to only one of these components.
There is an experiential component of objectivity in the sheer givenness of data. In commonsense discourse, we imagine that what we experience through our five senses is really “out there.” But we also may refer to what we think is true or good as really “out there.” Unfortunately, such talk stifles curiosity about the criteria we use to come to this knowledge. Knowing reality is easily reduced to a mental look. Similarly, the notion of moral objectivity collapses into a property of objects, detached from occurrences in subjects, so that we deem certain acts or people as “objectively evil” or “objectively good,” where “objectively” means “out there for anyone to see.” This naiveté about objectivity condenses the criteria regarding the morality of an act to what we picture, overlooking the meanings that the actors attach to the act.
Beyond this experiential component, which bows to the data as “objectively” given, there is a normative component, which bows to the inner norming processes to be attentive, intelligent, reasonable, and responsible. When we let these norms have their way, we raise relevant questions, assemble a coherent set of insights, avoid rash judgments, and test whether our ideas make sense of the data. This normative component is not a property of objects; it is a property of subjects. We speak of it when we say, “You’re not being objective” or “Objectively speaking, I say….” It guards us against wishful thinking and against politicizing what should be an impartial inquiry. Still, while this view incorporates the subject in moral assessments, some philosophers tend to collapse other aspects of objectivity into this subjective normativity. For them, thorough analysis, strict logic, and internal coherence are sufficient for objectivity. They propose their structural analyses not as hypotheses that may help us understand concrete experience correctly but as complete explanations of concrete realities. The morality of an act is determined by its coherence with implacable theory, suppressing further questions about actual cases that fall outside their conceptual schemes.
Beyond the experiential and normative components of objectivity, there is an absolute component, by which all inquiry bows to reality as it is. The absolute component lies in our intention to affirm what is true or good independent of the fact that we happen to affirm it. It is precisely what is absent when what we affirm as real or good is not real or good. The absolute component lies neither in the object alone nor the subject alone but in a linking of the two. It exists when the subject’s normative operations correctly confirm that the given experiential data meet all the conditions to make the judgment that X is so or Y is good. As a correlation between objective data and subjective acts, it corresponds to Aristotle’s understanding of truth as a relation between what we affirm and what really is so. Moralists who collapse knowing into judgment alone typically overlook the conditions set by experience and understanding that make most moral judgments provisional. The result is the dogmatist, out of touch with experience and incapable of inviting others to reach moral judgments by appeal to their understanding.
In popular use, metaphysics suggests a cloud of speculations about invisible forces on our lives. Among philosophers, metaphysics is the science that identifies the basic concepts about the structures of reality. GEM not only identifies basic concepts, but also traces them to their sources in the subject. Thus, concepts issue from insights, and insights issue from questions, and questions have birthdates, parented by answers to previous generations of questions. Moreover, the so-called raw data are already shaped by the questions that occur to an inquirer. These questions, in turn, contain clues to their answers insofar as the insight we expect is related to the kind of judgment we expect. It could be a logical conclusion, a judgment of fact, a judgment that an explanation is correct, or a judgment of value.
Because these complexities of human wonder are part of reality, GEM’s metaphysics encompasses the relationship between the processes that guide our wonder and the realities we wonder about. The assumption is that when they operate successfully, the processes of wonder form an integrated set isomorphic to the integral dimensions of reality. For example, the scientific movement from data to hypothesis to verification corresponds to Lonergan’s view that knowing moves from experience to understanding to judgment, as well as to Aristotle’s view that reality consists of potency, form, and act. In GEM, then, metaphysics comprises both the processes of knowing and the corresponding features of anything that can be known.
This metaphysics is latent but operative before it is conceptualized and named. People who consistently tackle the right question and sidestep the wrong ones already possess latent abilities to discern some structured features of the object of their inquiry. With moral questions, their heuristic anticipations show up as seemingly innate strategies: Don’t chisel your moral principles in stone. Consider historical circumstances. A bright idea is not necessarily a right idea. And so forth.
Eventually, these canny men and women may conceptualize and name their latent metaphysics. Should they ask themselves how they ever learned to discern the difference between good thinking and bad thinking, they may look beneath what they think about and wonder how their thinking works. They may realize what GEM takes as fundamental: Any philosophy will rest upon the operative methods of cognitional activity, either as correctly conceived or as distorted by oversights and mistaken orientations. Then, insofar as they correctly understand their cognitional activity, they may begin to make their latent metaphysics explicit.
In the remainder of this article, some of Lonergan’s metaphysical terms particularly relevant to ethics are highlighted in bold face.
When we expect to understand anything, our insights fall into two classes. We can understand things as they currently function, or we can understand things as they develop over time. Regarding things as they currently function, we may notice that we have both direct insights and “inverse” insights. These correspond to two different kinds of intelligibilities that may govern what we aim to understand. Lonergan’s use of “intelligibility” here corresponds to what Aristotle referred to as “form” and what modern science calls “the nature of.”
A classical intelligibility (corresponding to the “classical” scientific insights of Galileo, Newton and Bacon) is grasped by a direct insight into functional correlations among elements. We understand the phases of the moon, falling bodies, pushing a chair – any events that result necessarily from prior events, other things being equal. A statistical intelligibility is grasped by an inverse insight that there is no direct insight available. But while we often understand that many events cannot be functionally related to each other, we also may understand that an entire set of such events within a specific time and place will cluster about some average. For if any subset of events we consider random varies regularly from this average, we will look for regulating factors in this subset, governed by a classical intelligibility to be grasped through a direct insight. Statistical intelligibility, then, does not regard events resulting necessarily from prior events. It regards sets of events, in place P during time T, resulting under probability from multiple and shifting events.
This distinction affects moral appeals to a “natural law.” For example, those who hold that artificial birth control is morally wrong typically appeal to a direct, functional relationship between intercourse and conception. However, the nature of this relationship is not one conception per intercourse but the probability of one conception for many acts of intercourse – a relationship of statistical intelligibility. If this is the nature of births, then the natural law allows that each single act of intercourse need not be open to conception.
Regarding things as they develop over time, there are two basic kinds of development, again based on the distinction between direct and inverse insights.
A genetic intelligibility is grasped by a direct insight into some single driving factor that keeps the development moving through developmental phases, such as found in developmental models of stars, plants, human intelligence, and human morality. A dialectical intelligibility is grasped by an inverse insight that there is no single driving factor that keeps the development moving. Instead, there are at least two driving factors that modify each other while simultaneously modifying the developing entity.
These anticipations are key to understanding moral developments. Inquiry into a general pattern of moral development will anticipate a straight-line, genetic unfolding of a series of stages. Inquiry into a specific, actual moral development will anticipate a dialectical unfolding wherein the drivers of development modify each other at every stage, whether improving or worsening.
Genetic intelligibility is what we expect to grasp when we ask how new things emerge out of old. In this perspective, the metaphysical notion of potency takes on a particularly important meaning for ethics. Potency covers all the possibilities latent in given realities to become intelligible elements of higher systems. What distinguishes creative thinkers is not just their habit of finding uses in things others find useless. They expect that nature brings about improvements even without their help as, for example, when floating clouds of interstellar dust congeal into circulating planets or when damaged brains develop alternate circuits around scar tissue.
In this universe characterized by the potency for successive higher systems, the field of ethics extends to anything we can know. Hence, the “goodness” of the universe lies partly in its potentials for more intelligible organization. Human concern is an instance, indeed a most privileged instance, of a burgeoning universe. A sense of this kind of finality commands respect for whatever naturally comes to be even if no immediate uses come to mind.
An ethics whose field covers universal potentials will trace how morality is about allowing better. It means allowing not only the potentials of nature to reveal themselves but also a maximum freedom to the innate human imperative to do better. It means thinking of any moral option as essentially a choice between preventing and allowing the exercise of a pure desire for the better. Thus, the work of moral living is largely preventive – preventing our neurotic fixations or egotism from narrowing our horizons, preventing our loyalties from suppressing independent thinking, or preventing our mental impatience from abandoning the difficult path toward complete understanding. The rest feels less like work and more like allowing a natural exuberance to a moral creativity whose range has not been artificially narrowed by bias.
In contrast, a commonsense view of the universe imagines only the dimensions studied by physicists. The rule is simple: Any X either does or does not exist. Without this rule, scientists could never build up knowledge of what is and what is not. However, in cases like ourselves, where the universal potency for higher forms has produced responsible consciousness, this rule does not cover all possibilities. We also make the value judgments that some Xs should or should not exist. To recognize that the universe produces normative acts of consciousness is to recognize that the universe is more than a massive factual conglomeration. It is a self-organizing, dynamic and improving entity. Its moral character emerges most clearly with us, in raising moral objections when things get worse, in anticipating that any existing thing may potentially be part of something better, and, sadly, in acting against our better judgment.
Another key metaphysical element within the dynamism of reality toward fuller being is the notion of development. GEM rejects the mechanist view that counts on physics alone to explain the appearance of any new thing. It also rejects the vitalist view that pictures a wondrous life force driving everything from atoms, molecules, and cells, to psyches, minds and hearts. The reality of development, particularly moral development, involves a historical sequence of notions about better and worse. We inherit moral standards, subtract what we think is nonsense and add what we think makes sense. Our inheritance is likewise a sum of our previous generation’s inheritance, what they subtracted from it and added to it. Any moral tradition is essentially a sequence of moral standards, each linked to the past by an impure inheritance and to the future by the bits added and subtracted by a present generation.
Not every tradition is a morally progressing sequence, of course, but those that make progress alternate between securing past gains and opening the door to future improvements. GEM names the routines that secure gains a higher system as integrator. It names the routines within the emerged system that open the door to a better system a higher system as operator. Within a developing moral tradition, value judgments perform the integrator functions, while value questions perform the operator functions. The integrating power of value judgments will be directly proportional to the absence of operator functions — specifically, any further relevant value questions. So we regard some values as rock solid because no one has raised any significant questions about them. Value judgments that are provisional will function as limited integrators – limited, to be exact, to the extent that lingering value questions function as operators, scrutinizing value judgments for factual errors, misconceived theories, or bias in the investigator.
Feelings may function as either operators or integrators. As operators, they represent our initial response to possible values, moving us to pose value questions. As integrators they settle us in our value judgments as our psyches link our affects to an image of the valued object. Lonergan names this linkage of affect and image a symbol. (This is a term that identifies an event in consciousness; it is not to be confused with the visible flags and icons we also call “symbols.”) The concrete, functioning symbols that suffuse our psyches can serve as integrator systems for how we view our social institutions, various classes of people, and our natural environment, making it easy for us to respond smoothly without having to reassess everything at every moment. Symbols can also serve as operators insofar as the affect-image pair may disturb our consciousness, alerting us to danger or confusion, and prompting the questions we pose about values.
Although the operators that improve a community’s tradition involve the questions that occur to its members, not all questions function as operators. Some value questions are poorly expressed, even to ourselves. We experience disturbing symbols, but have yet to pose a value question in a way that actually results in a positive change. Some value questions are posed by biased investigators, which degrade a community’s moral heritage. Only those individuals who pose the questions that actually add values or remove disvalues will function as operators in an improving tradition. What makes any tradition improve, then, is neither the number of cultural institutions, nor governmental support of the arts, nor legal protections for freedom of thought, nor freedom of religion. These support the operators, and need to be regulated as such. But the operators themselves are the questions raised by the men and women who put true values above mere satisfactions.
The same alternating dynamic is evident in the moral development of an individual. While psychotherapists expect that an individual’s age is not a reliable measure of moral maturity, those who understand development as an alternation of operators and integrators may pose their questions about a patient’s maturity much more precisely: How successfully did this person meet the sequence of operator questions at turning points in his or her life? And what are the resultant integrator symbols guiding this person today? Similarly, in theories of individual development, what counts is what the operators may be at any stage. Where some theorists only describe the various stages, GEM looks for an account of a prior stage as integrator that connects directly to the operator questions to which an emerging stage is an answer.
The foregoing genetic model of development gives a gross view of stages and a first approximation to actual development. But actual development is the bigger story. Who we are is a unique weaving of the mutual impacts of external challenges and our internal decisions. So we come to the kind of intelligibility that accounts for concrete historical growth or decline – dialectical intelligibility. We expect this kind of understanding when we anticipate a tension among drivers of development and changes in these very drivers, depending on the path that the actual development takes.
Friendship, for example, has been compared to a garden that needs tending, but the analogy is misleading. What we understand about gardens falls under genetic intelligibility. Seeds will produce their respective vegetables, fruits or flowers; all we do is provide the nutrients. In a friendship, however, each partner is changed with each compromise, accommodation, resistance or refusal. So the inner dynamic of any friendship is a concrete unfolding of two personalities, each linked to the other yet able to oppose the other.
A community, too, is a dialectical reality. Its members’ perceptions, their patterns of behavior, their ways of collaborating and disputing, and all their shared purposes are the concrete result of three linked but opposed principles: their spontaneous intersubjectivity, their practical intelligence, and their values.
Spontaneous Intersubjectivity: Our spontaneous needs and wants constitute the primitive, intersubjective dimensions of community. We nest; we take to our kind; we share the unreflective social routines of the birds and bees, seeking one particular good after another.
Practical Intelligence: We also get insights into how to meet our needs and wants more efficiently. We design our houses to fit our circumstances and pay others to build them. In exchange, others pay us to make their bread, drive them to work, or care for their sick. Here is where the intelligent dimensions of a community emerge, comprising all the linguistic, technological, economic, political and social systems springing from human insight that constitute a society.
Values: Where practical intelligence sets up what a community does, values ground why they do it. Here is where the moral dimensions of community emerge – the shoulds and should-nots conveyed in laws, agreements, education, art, public opinion and moral standards. They embody all the commitments and priorities that constitute a culture.
These three principles are linked. Spontaneously, we pursue the particular goods that we need or want. Intellectually, we discover the technical, economic, political and social means to ensure the continuing flow of these particular goods, and we adapt our personal skills and habits to work within these systems. Morally, we decide whether the particular goods and the systems that deliver them actually improve our lives. Yet the principles are forever opposed. Insight often suppresses the urges of passion, while passion unmoored from insight would carry us along its undertow. Conscience, meanwhile, passes judgment on both our choices of particular goods and the systems we set up to keep them coming.
A dialectical anticipation regards a community as a moving, concrete resultant of the mutual conditioning of these three principles. When spontaneous intersubjectivity dominates a community, its members’ intellects are deformed by animal passion. When practical intelligence ignores spontaneous intersubjectivity, a society becomes stratified into an elite with its grand plans and a proletariat living from hand to mouth. Where members prefer mere satisfactions over values, intelligences are biased, and deeper human needs for authenticity are ignored. In any case, communities move, pushed and pulled by these principles, now converging toward, now diverting away from genuine progress.
The idea of development implies a lack of intelligibility, namely, the intelligibility yet to be realized. Likewise, there is a lack of intelligibility in the distorted socio-cultural institutions and self-defeating personal habits that pose the everyday problems confronting us. Yet even these are intelligibly related to the events that created them.
What lacks intelligibility it itself, however, is the refusal to make a decision that one deems one ought to make. GEM follows the Christian tradition of the apostle Paul, of Augustine, and of Aquinas in recognizing the phenomenon that we can act against our better judgment. This tradition is aware that much wrongdoing results from coercion, or conditioning, or invincible ignorance, but it asserts nonetheless that we can refuse to choose what we know is worth choosing. Lonergan refers to these events as “basic sin” to distinguish them from the effects of such refusals on one’s socio-cultural institutions and personal habits. Their unintelligibility is radical, in the sense that a deliberate refusal to obey a dictate of one’s deliberation cannot be explained, even if, as often happens, later deliberation dictates something else. It is radical also in the etymological sense of a root that branches into the actions, habits and institutions that we consider “bad.”
Different media subdivide ethics in different ways. News media divide it according to the positions people take on moral issues. Many college textbooks divide it into three related disciplines: metaethics (methods), normative ethics (principles), and applied ethics (case studies). This division implies that we first settle issues of method, then establish general moral principles, and finally apply those principles straightaway into practice. GEM proposes that moral development is not the straight line of genetic development nourished solely by principles but rather a dialectical interplay of spontaneous intersubjectivity, practical intelligence, and values. So, instead of a deductive, three-step division of moral process, GEM expects moral reflection to spiral forward inductively, assessing new situations with new selves at every turn. The question then becomes how ethicists might collaborate in wending the way into the future.
In his Method in Theology, Lonergan grouped the processes by which theology reflects on religion into eight specializations, each with functional relationships to the other seven. As illustrated in the chart below, the four levels of human self-transcendence – being attentive, intelligent, reasonable, and responsible – function in the two phases of understanding the past and planning for the future. Thus, we learn about the past by moving upward through research, interpretation, history, and a dialectical evaluation. We move into the future by moving downward through foundational commitments, basic doctrines, systematic organizations of doctrines, and communication of the resulting meanings and values. Our future slips into our past soon enough, and the process continues, turn after turn, reversing or advancing the forces of decline, meeting ever new challenges or buckling under the current ones.
While Lonergan presented this view primarily to meet problems in theology, he extended the notion of functional specialties to ethics, historiography and the human sciences by associating doctrines, systematics, and communications with policies, plans and implementations, respectively. These eight functional specialties are not distinct professions or separate university departments. They represent Lonergan’s grouping of the operations of mind and heart by which we actually do better. That is, he is not suggesting a recipe for better living; he is proposing a theoretical explanation of how the mind and heart work whenever we actually improve life, along with a proposal for collaboration in light of this explanation.
The bottom three rows of functions will be initially familiar to anyone involved in practically any enterprise. The top row of functions is less familiar, but it represents Lonergan’s clarification of the evaluative moments that occur in any collaboration that improves human living.
The functional specialty dialectic occurs when investigators explicitly sort out and evaluate the basic elements in any human situation. They evaluate the data of research, the explanations of interpreters, and the accounts of historians. To ensure that all the relevant questions are met, they bring together different people with different evaluations with a view to clarifying and resolving any differences that may appear.
From a GEM perspective, the most radical differences result from the presence or absence of conversion. Three principal types have been identified. There is an intellectual conversion by which a person has personally met the challenges of a cognitional theory, an epistemology, a metaphysics, and a methodology. There is a moral conversion by which a person is committed to values above mere satisfactions. And there is an affective conversion by which a person relies on the love of neighbor, community, and God to heal bias and prioritize values.
By attending to these radical differences, GEM rejects the typical liberal assumption that (1) people always lie, cheat and steal; (2) realistically, nothing can be done about these moral shortcomings; and (3) social institutions can do no more than balance conflicting interests. This assumption constricts moral vision to a pragmatism that may look promising in the short run but fails to deal with the roots of moral shortcomings in the long run. Dialectic occurs when investigators explicitly deal with each other’s intellectual, moral and affective norms, under the assumption that converted horizons are objectively better than unconverted horizons.
The functional specialty foundations occurs when investigators make their commitments and make them explicit. Relying on the evaluations and mutual encounters that occur in the specialty, dialectic, investigators deliberately select the horizons and commitments upon which they base any proposed improvements. These foundations are expressed in explanatory categories insofar as investigators make explicit their latent metaphysics and the horizons opened by their intellectual, moral and affective conversions.
Regarding ethics, investigators use a number of categories to formulate ethical systems, to track developments, to propose moral standards, and to express specific positions on issues. By way of illustration below, there are six sets of categories that seem particularly important: (1) action, concepts and method, (2) good and bad, (3) better and worse, (4) authority and power, (5) principles and people, and (6) duties and rights.
While commonsense discourse uses these terms descriptively, GEM’s theoretical approach defines them as correlations between subjective operations and their objective correlatives. An ethics based on GEM assumes that if science is to take seriously the data of consciousness, then it is necessary to deal explicitly with the normative elements that make consciousness moral. Because these subjective operations include moral norms and because their objective correlatives involve concrete values, the categories will not be empirically indifferent. Their power to support explanations of moral situations and proposals will derive from normative elements in their definitions, which, in turn are openly grounded in the innate norms to be attentive, intelligent, reasonable, and responsible.
Interest in method may be considered as a third plateau in humanity’s progressive enlargement of what has become meaningful.
Morality initially regards action, but it has expanded into a variety of conceptual systems under the heading of ethics. It is these systems, and their associated categories, which are the focus of the third-plateau methodological critique. On the third plateau, concepts lose their rigidity. As long as investigators are explicit about their cognitional theory, epistemology and metaphysics, they will continually refine or replace concepts developed in previous historical contexts.
Although the second plateau emerged from the first and the third is currently emerging from the second, GEM anticipates that any investigator today may be at home with action only, with both action and concepts, or with action, concepts, and method. The effort of foundations is for investigators to include all three plateaus in their investigations. The effort of dialectic is to invite all dialog partners to do the same.
Where second-plateau minds would typically name things good or bad insofar as they fall under preconceived concepts such as heroism or murder, liberation or oppression, philanthropy or robbery, third-plateau minds look to concrete assessments of situations. To ensure that this assessment is sufficiently grounded in theory, GEM requires an understanding of certain correlations between intentional acts and their objects. This requires more than a notional assent to concepts; it requires personally verified insight into what minds and hearts intend and how they intend it.
The relevant correlations that constitute anything called bad or good may be viewed according to the three levels of intentionality that dialectically shape any community. (1) Spontaneously, our interests, actions and passions intend particular goods. (2) Intelligently and reasonably, our insights and judgments intend the vast, interlocking set of systems that give us these particular goods regularly. (3) Responsibly and affectively, our decisions and loves intend what is truly worthwhile among these particular goods and the systems that deliver them.
In authentic persons, affectivity and responsibility shape reasonable and intelligent operations, which in turn govern otherwise spontaneous interests, actions and passions. This hierarchy in intentionality correlates with a priority of cultural values over social systems, and social systems over the ongoing particular activities of a populace. Thus, GEM regards human intelligence and reason as at the service of moral and affective orientations. This turns upside down the view of “materialistic” economic and educational institutions that dedicate intelligence and reason to serving merely spontaneous interests, actions, and passions.
At the same time, moral and affective orientations rely on intelligent and reasonable analyses of situations to produce moral precepts – an approach that contrasts with ethics that look chiefly to virtue and good will for practical guidance. Lonergan demonstrated how intelligent and reasonable analyses produce moral precepts in his works on the economy (Macroeconomic Dynamics: An Essay in Circulation Analysis) and on marriage (“Finality, Love, Marriage”).
So GEM regards the concepts of good and bad as useful for expressing moral conclusions, provide they are rooted in intelligent analysis, dialectical encounter, and personal conversion. GEM relies on dialectical encounter to expose the oversights when “good” and “bad” are used to categorize actions in the abstract.
The complexities of one’s situation involve not only its history, but the views of history embraced by its participants. Darwinian, Hegelian and Marxist views of history are largely genetic, insofar as they support the liberal thesis that life automatically improves, and that wars, disease, and economic crashes are necessary steps in the forward march of history. GEM declares an end to this age of scientific innocence. It regards this thesis of progress as simply a first of three successively more thorough approximations toward a full understanding of actual situations. A second approximation takes in the working of bias and the resulting dynamics of historical decline. A third approximation takes in the factors of recovery by which bias and its objective disasters may be reversed.
First Approximation: What drives progress. We experience a situation and feel the impulse to improve it. We spot what’s missing, or some overlooked potentials. We express our insight to others, getting their validation or refinement. We make a plan and put it into effect. The situation improves, bringing us back to feeling yet further impulses to improve things. The odds of spotting new opportunities grow as, with each turn of the cycle, more and more of what doesn’t make sense is replaced by what does. Such is the nature of situations that improve.
Second Approximation: What drives decline. Again, we experience a situation and an impulse to improve it. But we do not, or will not, spot what’s missing. We express our oversight to others, making it out to be an insight. If they lack any critical eye, they take us at our word rather than notice our oversight. We make a plan, put it into effect, and discover later the inevitable worsening of the situation. Now the odds of spotting ways to improve things decrease, owing to the additional complexity and cross-purposes of the anomalies. With each turn of the cycle, less and less makes sense. Such is the nature of situations that worsen.
Lonergan proposed that such oversights might be rooted in any of four biases endemic to consciousness: (1) Neurosis resists insight into one’s psyche. (2) Egoism resists insight into what benefits others. (3) Loyalism resists insights into the good of other groups. (4) Anti-intellectualism resists insights that require any thorough investigation, theory-based analyses, long-range planning, and broad implementation. In each type, one’s intelligence is selectively suppressed and one’s self-image is supported by positive affects that reinforce the bias and by negative affects toward threats to the bias.
Third Approximation: What drives recovery. GEM offers an analysis of love to show how it functions to reverse the dynamics of decline.
GEM’s perspective on moral recovery aims to help historians and planners understand how any situation gets better or worse. It helps historians locate the causes of problems in biases as opposed to merely deploring the obvious results. It helps planners propose solutions based on the actual drivers of progress and recovery, as opposed to mere cosmetic changes.
Common sense typically thinks of authority as the people in power. GEM roots the meaning of authority in the normative functions of consciousness and defines the expression of authority in terms of legitimate power.
An initial meaning of power is physical, and physical power is multiplied by collaboration. But in the world of social institutions, a normative meaning of power emerges – the power produced by insights and value judgments. Insights are expressed in words; words raise questions of value; judgments of value lead to decisions; decisions result in cooperation; and this kind of cooperation vastly reduces the physical power needed while achieving vastly better results. The social power of a community grows as it consolidates the gains of the past, restricts behaviors that would diminish the community’s effectiveness, organizes labors for specific tasks, and spells out moral guidelines for the future. As normative, the memory and commitments involved in this heritage constitute a community’s “word of authority.”
The community appoints “authorities” to implement these tasks. Authorities are the spokespersons, delegates, and caretakers of a community’s spiritual and material assets. Winning the vote does not confer an authority upon them; it confers a responsibility upon them to speak and embody the community’s word of authority. The honor owed to them by titles and ceremony does not derive from any virtue of their persons but rather from the honorable heritage and common purpose with which they have been entrusted.
While the community’s social power resides in its ways and means, not all its ways and means are legitimate. A community’s heritage is a mixed bag of sense and nonsense. To the extent that authorities lack the authenticity of being attentive, intelligent, reasonable and responsible, their power to build up is diminished. Even if everyone does what they say, inauthentic authorities will be blind to the higher viewpoints and better ideas needed to stave off chaos and seize opportunities for improving life together. Their power is justifiably called naked because it is stripped of the intelligent, reasonable, and responsible contributions their subjects are quite capable of making. Similarly, to the extent that the subjects lack authenticity, they will cripple their own creativity, which otherwise would foresee problems, overcome obstacles, and open new lines of development. At the extremes, a noble leader of egotistical followers has no more effective power than an egotistical leader of noble followers. Between these extremes, the typical dynamic is an ongoing dialectic between an incomplete authenticity of the community and an incomplete authenticity of its authorities.
In this concrete perspective, GEM defines authority as power legitimated by authenticity. That is, authority is that portion of a heritage produced by attention, intelligence, reason, and responsibility. As only a portion of a heritage, authority is a dialectical reality, to be worked out in mutual encounter, rather than a dictatorial iron law (a classical reality), an anarchical or libertarian social order (a statistical reality), or a natural, evolutionary dynasty (a genetic reality).
This definition of authority as the power legitimated by authenticity offers historians defensible explanations for their distinctions between legitimate and illegitimate exercises of power within a historical period. It offers policymakers the normative categories they need to explain to their constituents the reasons for proposed changes in the community’s constitution, laws, and sanctions. It reminds authorities that they have been entrusted with the maintenance and refinement of a heritage created by the community.
A commonsense use of “moral principles” usually means any set of conceptualized standards, such as, “The punishment should fit the crime” or “First, do no harm.”
When ethicists consider how moral principles should be used, disagreements arise. Some scorn them because principles are only abstract generalizations that do not apply in concrete situations. When we try to apply them, disputes arise about the meaning of terms such as “crime” or “harm.” Particular cases always require further value judgments on the relative importance of mitigating factors, which generalizations omit. What counts is a thorough assessment of the concrete situation, which will result in an intuition of what seems best.
Others reject such situation-based ethics because people have different intuitions about what seems best in particular situations. What is needed is a general principle that supports the common good. Moreover, history proves that formulated principles are good things. Because they represent wisdom gained by others who met threats to their well being, to neglect them is to unknowingly expose oneself to the same threats. We codify principles in our laws, appeal to them in our debates, and teach them to our children. For children in particular, and for adults whose moral intelligence has not matured, principles are firm anchors in a stormy sea.
GEM regards principles as concepts that need the critique of a third-plateau reflection on the methods used to develop them. They are not really principles in the sense of starting points. That is, they are not the source of normative demands. The actual sources of normative demands are self-transcending people being attentive, intelligent, reasonable, and responsible. Formulated principles are the products of people shaped by an ambiguous heritage, exposed to a dialectic of opinions, and directed by personal commitments within intellectual, moral and affective horizons. These horizons may complement each other; they may develop from earlier stages; or they may be dialectically opposed, as when people who mouth the same principles attach opposite meanings to them, or when people espouse the principle but act otherwise.
GEM grants no exception for moral principles proposed by religions. A religious revelation is considered neither a delivery from the sky of inscribed tablets nor a dictation heard from unseen divinities. In its data of consciousness perspective, GEM considers revelation as a person’s judgment of value regarding known proposals, whether inscribed or spoken or imagined. Its religious sanction is based on a person’s claim that this judgment is prompted by a transcendent love from a transcendent source in his or her heart.
Those who formulate specific moral principles need to understand that there are distinct methodological issues associated with each of the eight specialties that form a group in consciousness. This understanding begins with men and women who think about their intellectual, moral and affective commitments in explanatory categories (foundations). It is first expressed in these categories as judgments of fact or value (doctrines/policies). It expands through understanding the relationships these principles have with other principles (systematics/planning). It becomes effective thorough adaptations that take into account the current worldview of a community, the media used, and the values implicit in the community’s language (communications/implementation). These adaptations become data (research) for further understanding (interpretation) within historical contexts (history) to be evaluated (dialectic.)
GEM’s strategy for resolving differences among principles is to exercise the functional specialty dialectic to reveal their true source. Investigators evaluate not only the historical accounts of how any principle arose, but also the principle itself. GEM proposes that where investigators overcome disagreements, the parties have lain open their basic horizons, particularly the intellectual, moral and affective horizons that reveal the radical grounds of disagreements and agreements. In this mutual encounter, people concerned about morality are already familiar with normative elements in their consciousness and may only lack the insights and language to make them intelligible parts of how they present their views. The strategy is not to prove one’s principle or disprove another’s but to tap one another’s experience of a desire for authenticity. GEM counts on the probability that those people with more effective intellectual, moral and affective horizons will, by laying bare the roots of any differences, attract and guide those whose horizons are less effective.
Besides people who appreciate authenticity, there are people who crave its opposite, as the history of hatred amply demonstrates. If GEM has accurately identified the dialectic of decline as driven by an increasingly degraded authenticity, with its increasingly narrow and unconnected solutions to problems, then the reversal of moral evil must appeal to any remnants of authenticity in the hater. The appeal involves enlargements of horizons at many levels. For communities of hatred, this enlargement will require moving from legends about their heritage to a critical history, revising the rhetoric and rituals that secure commitment, and rewriting their laws. At the same time, there is also an enlargement to be expected of the communities who seek to convert communities of hatred. This is because more comprehensive political protocols and moral standards will be required to achieve a yet higher integration of those portions of both heritages that resulted from authenticity.
In the perspective of GEM, the elemental meaning of duty is found in the originating set of “oughts” in the impulses to be attentive, intelligent, reasonable, and responsible, plus the overriding “ought” to maintain consistency between what one knows and how one acts. The oughts issued by conscience not only provide all the norms expressed in written rules, but also issue far more commands and prohibitions than parents, police, and public policy ever could. It is this inner duty that enables one to break from a minor authenticity that obeys the written rule and to exercise a major authenticity that may expose a written rule as illegitimate.
At first glance, the GEM view of morality may appear sympathetic to “deontological” theories that base all moral obligation on duty rather than consequences. While it is true that GEM traces all specific obligations to an underlying, universal duty, it goes deeper than concept-based maxims by identifying the dynamic originating duty in every person to be attentive, intelligent, reasonable and responsible. By tracing the source of any maxims about duty to their historical origins, GEM leaves open the possibility that new historical circumstances may require new maxims.
Moreover, insofar as any formulations of duty are consequences of past historical situations, and as new formulations will be consequences of new situations, GEM supports the consideration of consequences in ethical theory. What this approach adds, however, is the requirement that all consequences pass under the scrutiny of dialectic, which aims to filter merely satisfying consequences from the truly valuable, and to consider how specific consequences contribute to historical progress, decline, or recovery. These consequences include not only changes in observable behaviors and social standards but also any shifts in the intellectual, moral and affective horizons of a community.
As adults juggle their customary duties to social norms and their originating duty to be authentic, many discover that the best parts of these social norms arose from the authenticity of forebears. With this discovery comes a recognition of a present duty to preserve those portions of one’s heritage based on authenticity, to critique those portions based on bias, and to create the social and economic institutions that facilitate authenticity.
Lonergan depicted such preservation, critique, and creativity as an ongoing experiment of history. The success of the race, and of any particular peoples, depends on collaborative efforts to conduct this experiment rather than serve as its guinea pigs. Collaboration, in turn, requires authenticity of all collaborators.
Any collaboration that successfully makes life more intelligible will require a freedom to speak one’s mind, to associate, to maintain one’s health, and to be educated. The notion of human rights, therefore, is a derivative of this intelligibility intrinsic to nourishing a heritage. While “rights” usually appear as one-way demands by one party upon others, their essential meaning is that they are expressions of the mutual demands intrinsic to any collaborative process aimed at improving life. Any individual’s claim in the name of rights is essentially an assumption that others will honor his or her duty to contribute to the experiment to improve a common heritage.
Conflicts of rights are often the ordinary conflicts involved in any compromise. More seriously, they may be differences between plateaus of meaning among a community’s members. First-plateau minds, focused on action, will think of rights as the behaviors and entitlements that lawmakers allow to citizens. Many will conclude that they have a right to do wrong. In contrast, GEM views lawmakers as responsible for protecting the liberty of citizens to live authentically. Thus, while the law lets every dog have a free bite, GEM repudiates the conclusion that anyone has a right to do wrong.
Second-plateau minds promote the ancient and honorable notion that rights are a set of immutable, universal properties of human nature. GEM considers that the strength of the modern notion of rights has been based mainly on logical consistency and permanent validity. However, from the methods perspective of the third plateau of meaning, GEM also recovers elements in the ancient notion of natural right that include personal authenticity and defines these elements in terms of personal conversion. On that basis, GEM proposes a collaborative superstructure driven by the functional specialties, dialectic and foundations.
In any case, GEM considers rights as historically conditioned means for authentic ends. As historically conditioned means, rights may take any number of legal and social forms. So, for example, the historical expansion from civil rights (speech, assembly, suffrage) to social rights (work, education, health care), to group rights (women, homosexuals, ethnic groups) is evidence of the ongoing emergence of new kinds of claims on each other’s duty to replenish a heritage. As oriented toward authentic ends, the validity of any rights claim depends on how well it enables authentic living, a question addressed through the mutual exposures that occur in the functional specialty dialectic. Consequently, ethicists familiar with GEM rely less on the language of rights and more on the language of dialog, encounter, and heritage.
A generalized empirical method in ethics clarifies the subject’s operations regarding values. The effort relies on a personal appropriation of what occurs when making value judgments, on a discovery of innate moral norms, and on a grasp of the meaning of moral objectivity. These innate methods of moral consciousness are expressed in explanatory categories, to be used both for conceptualizing for oneself what occurs regarding value judgments and for expressing to others the actual grounds for one’s value positions.
GEM is based on a gamble that the odds of genuine moral development are best when the players lay these intellectual, moral and affective cards on the table. Concretely, this implies a duty to acknowledge the historicity of one’s moral views as well as a readiness to admit oversights in one’s self-knowledge. Moreover, given the proliferation of moral issues that affect confronting cultures with different histories today, it also implies a duty to meet the stranger in a place where this openness can occur.
U. S. A.
Last updated: June 30, 2005 | Originally published: