French post-structuralist philosopher, best known for his highly influential formulation of postmodernism in The Postmodern Condition. Despite its popularity, however, this book is in fact one of his more minor works. Lyotard’s writings cover a large range of topics in philosophy, politics, and aesthetics, and experiment with a wide variety of styles. His works can be roughly divided into three categories: early writings on phenomenology, politics, and the critique of structuralism, the intermediate libidinal philosophy, and later work on postmodernism and the “differend.” The majority of his work, however, is unified by a consistent view that reality consists of singular events which cannot be represented accurately by rational theory. For Lyotard, this fact has a deep political import, since politics claims to be based on accurate representations of reality. Lyotard’s philosophy exhibits many of the major themes common to post-structuralist and postmodernist thought. He calls into question the powers of reason, asserts the importance of nonrational forces such as sensations and emotions, rejects humanism and the traditional philosophical notion of the human being as the central subject of knowledge, champions heterogeneity and difference, and suggests that the understanding of society in terms of “progress” has been made obsolete by the scientific, technological, political and cultural changes of the late twentieth century. Lyotard deals with these common themes in a highly original way, and his work exceeds many popular conceptions of postmodernism in its depth, imagination, and rigor. His thought remains pivotal in contemporary debates surrounding philosophy, politics, social theory, cultural studies, art and aesthetics.
Jean-François Lyotard was born in Vincennes, France, on August 10, 1924. His father, Jean-Pierre Lyotard, was a sales representative. His mother’s maiden name was Madeleine Cavalli. He was schooled at the Paris Lycées Buffon and Louis-le-Grand, and his youthful aspirations to be a Dominican monk, a painter, an historian, or a novelist eventually gave way to a career in philosophy. He studied philosophy and literature at the Sorbonne (after twice failing the entrance exam to the Ecole Normale Supérieure), where he became friends with Gilles Deleuze. His early interest in philosophies of indifference resulted in his M.A. dissertation Indifference as an Ethical Notion. Lyotard describes his existence up until the Second World War as a ‘poetic, introspective and solitary way of thinking and living.’ The war disrupted both his way of life and his thought; he acted as a first-aid volunteer in the fight for liberation in the Paris streets in August 1944, and gave up the idea of indifference for a commitment to the investigation of reality in terms of social interactions. Lyotard became a husband and father at a young age, marrying Andrée May in 1948 and subsequently having two children, Corinne and Laurence. Lyotard passed the agrégation (the examination required in order to teach in France) and took up a position teaching philosophy at a boy’s lycée (school) in Constantine in French-occupied East Algeria in 1950. From 1952-59 he taught at a school for the sons of military personnel at La Flèche. In Constantine Lyotard read Marx and became acquainted with the Algerian political situation, which he believed was ripe for socialist revolution. In 1954 Lyotard joined the socialist revolutionary organisation Socialisme ou Barbarie (Socialism or Barbarism). Other members of the organisation included Cornelius Castoriadis, Claude Lefort, and Pierre Souyris. Lyotard had met Souyris at a union meeting late in 1950, and they had a long and close friendship, eventually troubled by political and theoretical differences.
Lyotard became an intellectual militant, and asserts that for fifteen years he was so dedicated to the cause of socialist revolution that no other aspect of life (with the sole exception of love) diverted him from this task. His writings in this period are solely concerned with ultra-left revolutionary politics, with a sharp focus on the Algerian situation (the war of independence had broken out in 1954). He contributed to and edited the Socialisme ou Barbarie journal, and wrote pamphlets to distribute to workers at protests and at factory gates. In 1964 a schism erupted in Socialisme ou Barbarie over Castoriadis’ new theoretical direction for the group. Lyotard, along with Souyris, became a member of the splinter group Pouvoir Ouvrier (Worker’s Power), but resigned in 1966. He had lost belief in the legitimacy of Marxism as a totalising theory, and returned to the study and writing of philosophy. From 1959 to 1966 Lyotard was maître-assistant at the Sorbonne, and then gained a position in the philosophy department at the University of Paris X, Nanterre. There he took part in the May 1968 political actions, organising demonstrations for the “March 22 Movement.”
Lyotard attended the radical psychoanalyst Jacques Lacan’s seminars in the mid-60s, and his reaction to Lacan’s theories resulted in Discours, figure, for which he received the degree of doctorat d’état. From 1968 to 1970 Lyotard was chargé de recherches at the Centre National de la Recherche Scientifique. In the early 1970s Lyotard was appointed to the University of Paris VIII, Vincennes, where he was a popular teacher and a prolific writer. In 1972 he was made maître de conferences, and in 1987 he became Professor Emeritus at Vincennes. The 1979 publication of The Postmodern Condition brought Lyotard worldwide fame, and in the 1980s and 90s he lectured widely outside of France. Lyotard was professor of French and Italian at the University of California, Irvine, Robert W. Woodruff Professor of French at Emory University, and a founding member and sometime president of the Collège International de Philosophie. Lyotard was a visiting professor at numerous universities, including John Hopkins, the University of California, Berkeley and San Diego, the University of Minnesota, the Université de Montréal, Canada, the Universität Siegen, West Germany, and the University of Saõ Paulo, Brazil. Lyotard married his second wife Dolorès Djidzek in 1993 and had a son, David. Lyotard died of leukaemia in Paris on April 21, 1998.
Lyotard’s first book, published in 1954, is a short introduction to and examination of phenomenology. The first part introduces phenomenology through the work of Edmund Husserl, and the second part evaluates phenomenology’s relation to the human sciences (particularly psychology, sociology, and history). In the second part the focus shifts from Husserl to the work of Maurice Merleau-Ponty. Throughout, Lyotard is concerned with phenomenology’s attempt to find a “third way” between subjectivism and objectivism, avoiding the problems of each. In particular, he is interested in the bearing this problem has on the question of whether phenomenology can think history politically, thus potentially contributing to Marxism. This theme (the relation of phenomenology to Marxism) was a prime concern for French thinkers of the fifties, and Lyotard’s book is a useful documentation of the issues at stake. Much of his exposition and discussion is positive, and Lyotard argues that phenomenology can make valuable contributions to the social sciences, where it should serve two functions: firstly, to define the object of the science eidetically (i.e. in its essence) prior to all experimentation, and secondly, to philosophically reassess the results of experimentation. Lyotard argues, for example, that sociology has need of a phenomenological definition of the essence of the social before it can proceed effectively as a science. While he sees the usefulness of phenomenology in many disciplines, however, Lyotard’s conclusions about the usefulness of phenomenology to Marxism are largely negative. He argues that phenomenology does not represent progress on Marxism, but is in fact a step backwards. For Lyotard phenomenology cannot properly formulate a materialist worldview and the objective nature of the relations of production; it ends up interpreting class struggle as taking place in consciousness. Lyotard rejects phenomenology’s attempt to find a third way between subjectivism and objectivism, and asserts Marxism’s superiority in viewing subjectivity as already contained in objectivity.
In the fifteen years between his first two books of philosophy, Lyotard devoted all his writing efforts to the cause of revolutionary politics. His most substantial writings of this time were his contributions to the Socialisme ou Barbarie journal on the political situation in Algeria [many of which are collected in Political Writings]. The project of Socialisme ou Barbarie was to provide theoretical resources to contribute to socialist revolution, critiquing other existing socialist strands (particularly Stalinism and the French communist party) as a hindrance to revolution, and with a particular emphasis on the critique of bureaucracy. In the essays on Algeria, Lyotard applies this project to the French occupation, trying to determine the potential for socialist revolution arising from this situation. He pays close attention to the economic forces at work in occupied Algeria, arguing that it is in the economic interests of France to keep Algerians in a state of underdevelopment and poverty. Furthermore, Lyotard introduces a notion of ‘terror’ that he develops more fully in his later works, indicating the suppression of Algerian culture by the imposition of foreign (French) cultural forms. The conclusion Lyotard comes to is that the occupation must end if the Algerian people are to prosper, but he remains ambivalent about the possibility of revolution. He surmises that a nationalist, democratic revolution will only lead to new forms of social inequality and domination, and insists that a socialist revolution is necessary. This ambivalence was reflected in Socialisme ou Barbarie‘s debate about whether or not to support the Algerian war of independence, fearing that its democratic and nationalistic leanings would not bring about the result they desired. In “Algeria Evacuated,” written after the end of the occupation, Lyotard regretfully asks why a socialist revolution did not take place, concluding that the social and political upheavals resulted in an opportunistic struggle for power rather than a class-based action. The end result of Lyotard’s work on Algeria and the disappointment at the failure of socialist revolution to take place led him to an abandonment of revolutionary socialism and traditional Marxism on the grounds that social reality is too complex to describe accurately with any master-discourse.
Lyotard’s second book of philosophy is long and difficult. It covers a wide variety of topics, including phenomenology, psychoanalysis, structuralism, poetry and art, Hegelian dialectics, semiotics, and philosophy of language. The main thrust of this work, however, is a critique of structuralism, particularly as it manifests itself in Lacan’s psychoanalysis. The book is divided into two parts: the first uses Merleau-Ponty’s phenomenology to undermine structuralism, and the second uses Freudian psychoanalysis to undermine both Lacanian psychoanalysis and certain aspects of phenomenology. Lyotard begins with an opposition between discourse, related to structuralism and written text, and figure (a visual image), related to phenomenology and seeing. He suggests that structured, abstract conceptual thought has dominated philosophy since Plato, denigrating sensual experience. The written text and the experience of reading are associated with the former, and figures, images and the experience of seeing with the latter. Part of Lyotard’s aim is to defend the importance of the figural and sensual experience such as seeing. He proceeds to deconstruct this opposition, however, and attempts to show that discourse and figure are mutually implicated. Discourse contains elements of the figural (poetry and illuminated texts are good examples), and visual space can be structured like discourse (when it is broken up into ordered elements in order for the world to be recognisable and navigable by the seeing subject). He develops an idea of the figural as a disruptive force which works to interrupt established structures in the realms of both reading and seeing. Ultimately, the point is not to privilege the figural over the discursive, but to show how these elements must negotiate with each other. The mistake of structuralism is to interpret the figural in entirely discursive terms, ignoring the different ways in which these elements operate. In the second part of Discours, figure, structure and transgression are related to Freudian libidinal forces, paving the way for the libidinal philosophy developed in Libidinal Economy.
In the early 1970s Lyotard developed a philosophy based around Sigmund Freud’s theory of the libido. For Lyotard, libidinal energy can be used as a “theoretical fiction” to describe the transformations that take place in society. After his break with Marxism and rejection of totalising theory, he sought to develop a theory that will take account of multiple and different forces and desires at work in any political or social situation, from the writing of theory to revolutionary politics to global economics. Lyotard’s libidinal philosophy is developed in the major work Libidinal Economy and in two sets of essays, Dérive à partir de Marx et Freud [some of which is translated in Driftworks] and Des Dispositifs Pulsionnels. Libidinal Economy is an unusual and difficult work, and encompasses a complex set of theories concerning politics, economics, theory, academic style, and readings of Marx and Freud. It is written in a bewildering combination of styles (at times reading more like an avant-garde novel than a philosophical text), a method Lyotard uses in an attempt to overcome the limitations he sees in traditional academic theory.
The libidinal philosophy begins Lyotard’s general commitment to an ontology of events, which also underlies his later postmodern philosophy. Lyotard sees reality in terms of unpredictable happenings (events), rather than structured regularities. These events can be interpreted in different ways, and no single interpretation will capture events accurately. Events always exceed interpretation; there is always something “left over” that an interpretation does not account for. In the libidinal philosophy Lyotard uses the idea of libidinal energy to describe events and the way they are interpreted or exploited, and he develops a philosophy of society and theory in terms of the economy of libidinal energies. Lyotard uses the terms “libidinal intensities,” and “affects” to refer to events. These intensities and affects are, in more common terminology, feelings and desires. In the terms of Freudian psychoanalysis, they are the “primary processes” of the libido, the forces that exist in the body on a more basic level than the “secondary processes” of the conscious mind. In particular, Lyotard focuses on sexual desire. He uses these terms metaphorically, however, to describe the workings of reality and society as a whole, divorcing them from their usual attachments to human beings. Lyotard describes the wholly impersonal as well as the personal in terms of feelings and desires, and paints a picture of the world that moves and is moved in the ways that feelings move people. Lyotard admits that this description of everything in libidinal terms is a “theoretical fiction,” merely a way of speaking which gives us useful terms for theorizing about what happens in the world. Metaphysically, Lyotard is a materialist, and for him affects must be understood as concrete material entities. An affect might be a sound, a color, a smile or a caress: anything which has an ability to “move,” to produce feelings and desires. Affects are structured and interpreted in systems made up of dispositifs, libidinal dispositions or set-ups, and society is composed of multitudes of different dispositions that compete to exploit the energies of libidinal events. Lyotard develops a complex set of figures to describe how this process takes place.
Libidinal Economy begins with the figure of a body (ambivalently sexed), being cut open and spread out to form a flat, band-like surface. Lyotard is here beginning to describe a region on which libidinal intensities take place and on which they meet with the dispositifs that channel libidinal energy. This region is material like the body, but it is not yet organized, thus the figure of dismemberment. The flat band that the body has become is then given a twist and joined end to end, forming a moebius strip (a circular figure which has only one surface due to the twist it contains; a line traced along one side of the strip will end up on the other side without breaking contact with the surface). This strip is then set in motion, circulating so fast it glows red with heat. This is the libidinal band (sometimes called the libidinal skin). It represents the “primary processes” of desire and libidinal intensity in which libidinal energy circulates in an aleatory fashion, not yet investing anything. Because the libidinal band is a moebius strip, desire circulates on only one surface; there is no inside or outside. In time the band begins to slow and cool, and forms what Lyotard calls “the (disjunctive) bar.”
As the bar slows, sometimes it invests this region, sometimes that. It becomes disjunctive, distinguishing this from not-this. This stage in the transformation of the libidinal band represents the formation of rational thought, dominated by binary logic and the law of noncontradiction. Finally the bar stops and forms a stable disjunction. Lyotard describes the bar as then turning around on itself and creating an enclosed space, a theatrical volume. This is the particular transformation of the libidinal band – or the particular dispositif on the libidinal band – that gives rise to representation and theory. The theatrical space has an inside and an outside, a clear disjunction between this and not-this. Lyotard’s image of theory as theatre is based on the etymological relationship between the two terms; they are both derived from the Greek theasthai, meaning to look at, contemplate, or behold. The theorist is like a spectator who views the representation of the world (outside the theatre) on the stage (inside the theatre).
Lyotard’s description of the transformations of the libidinal band is a theoretical fiction which provides an account of how the world works through the interplay of intense, excited libidinal energies and the stable structures which exploit them and dampen their intensity. The band is the space on which libidinal intensities meet dispositifs, or libidinal set-ups. These set-ups channel energy into more or less stable systems and structures, and therefore all dispositifs, all systems and structures, can be described in terms of the slowing and cooling of the band. An example would be the way political institutions channel desires to change society away from violent, disruptive eruptions towards more moderate, less disruptive modes of action. Systems exploit libidinal intensities by channeling them into stable structures. And yet, these systems deny their own origins in intense and aleatory libidinal energy, taking themselves to be permanent and stable. Systems hide, or dissimulate, affects (libidinal intensities). Conversely, however, affects dissimulate systems. Systems and affects dissimulate each other. This means that systems contain and hide affects, and that affects contain and hide the possibility for forming systems. Dissimulation is a concept that allows us to see the elements of the libidinal economy as duplicitous. That is, they have more than one possibility. It is always possible for intensities to channel into a stable system, or to disrupt a system by destabilising it through intense investment.
Lyotard develops a critical but nuanced approach towards theory, politics and economics within the terms of the libidinal philosophy. His prime concern is that the structures that exploit libidinal intensities tend to become hegemonic. That is, they tend to claim sole right to the exploitation or interpretation of intensities. At the same time, they often deny libidinal intensities themselves, taking themselves to be primary and stable structures. Lyotard sees these tendencies as limiting and nihilistic, in the sense that they deny the full possibilities of the expression of intensities. In theory, politics, and cultural conventions, structured dispositions take themselves to be the actual structures of reality or “correct” interpretations, thus limiting the possibilities of change. For Lyotard change is life affirming, whereas the stable structures that inhibit change are nihilistic and life denying. However, Lyotard does not simply assert libidinal intensity as an affirmative “other” to nihilism. For Lyotard, there is no affirmative region, no pure outside to nihilism. Lyotard does not propose that we champion affects, singularities, intensities and libidinal energy over systems, structures, theory, concepts and representation. This is because the only way libidinal energies can exist is within structures. Lyotard does not advocate a simple liberation of desire and does not attempt to set up a place beyond representation which would be immune to the effects of nihilism. Lyotard presents us, rather, with a metaphysical system in which intensities and structures are both essential elements of the libidinal economy.
Lyotard’s response to the nihilism of structure takes place through the concept of dissimulation, which suggests that libidinal energy must work within structures. All structures contain libidinal energy as an under-exploited potentiality, waiting to be released and to flow into new structures. This libidinal energy is the event, which always contains more possibilities for interpretation and exploitation than any single structure can give it. Lyotard’s libidinal philosophy prescribes a “freeing up” of structures, so that events may be allowed their maximum potentiality of expression in competing interpretations and dispositions. Releasing the energy in structures in turn creates new events, with their own energetic potentialities. Because the event is unpredictable, we cannot actively control the way it will be released and form new structures. However, we can “act passively” so as to encourage the maximum release of intensity within structures. Lyotard’s own style of writing in Libidinal Economy is one attempt to do this: by multiplying genres of discourse, there is no overall dominant structure in the text and it is open to several competing modes of reading, interpretation and application. Ultimately, libidinal philosophy suggests a method of subversion from within existing structures through experimentation with the forms of those structures.
Lyotard abandoned his libidinal philosophy in the later years of the seventies, beginning a philosophy of paganism that developed, by the eighties, into his unique version of postmodernism. The turn from the libidinal to the pagan and the postmodern continued a concern with events and the limits of representation, but concerned two key changes: 1. A change in the mode of analysis from libidinal forces to language, and 2. a new focus on justice. Whereas in the libidinal philosophy the focus was to see that a single interpretation of an event did not become hegemonic, in Lyotard’s later philosophy he is primarily concerned with the problems of justice that arise between competing interpretations of events. Lyotard’s philosophy of language and justice is most fully developed through the concept of the differend, in the book of the same name.
Lyotard develops the notion of paganism in “Lessons in Paganism” (reprinted in The Lyotard Reader), Just Gaming and various other short works of the late seventies. The term “paganism” refers to a way of thinking that takes into account and strives to do justice to incommensurable differences. Just as pagan religions believe in a number of different gods rather than just one God, Lyotard’s pagan philosophy represents a concern for pluralism and multiplicity (terms he uses synonymously to oppose the idea of universality). This concern for difference, multiplicity and pluralism is related to Lyotard’s basic commitment to an ontology of singular events: if reality is constituted by unique happenings, then there will be no universal law of judgement which will be able to take account of each and every event in a way which does them all justice. Paganism suggests that there are irreducible differences in the order of things, and that we must take things on their own terms without attempting to reduce them to universals. In his writings on paganism, Lyotard analyses politics in the form of a justice of rhetoric. In “Lessons in Paganism” he claims that all discourse is narrative; all theory, all politics, all law, are merely a collection of stories. In Just Gaming, he analyses situations where questions of justice and judgement arise in terms of language games. Lyotard rejects the claims of any discourse to be grounded in truth. He rejects the idea of a master-discourse (later called a metanarrative) that is thought to provide the basis for judgement in all situations. (Marxism, Hegelian philosophy, and Kant’s ideal of unity or totality as regulating justice are examples of master-discourses that have dominated the philosophical tradition.) Instead, Lyotard suggests that paganism is the most appropriate response to the desire for justice. Paganism is godless politics; it is the abandonment of universal judgement for specific, plural judgements. This means giving up the idea of a single, law-like theoretical schema which could be applied to any situation in which judgment is required. Lyotard asserts that a justice of multiplicities requires a multiplicity of justices. Paganism is the attempt to judge without pre-existing criteria, in matters of truth, beauty, politics and ethics.
Paganism rejects any universal criteria for judgement, yet Lyotard claims that we must judge, that justice demands this of us. So how do we judge, without criteria? Lyotard invokes both Kant and Nietzsche in his answer. In Kantian terms, we judge through the constitutive imagination. For Kant, this ability to judge, and to invent criteria, is mysterious, and there is little we can say about it. In Nietzschean terms, Lyotard says that judgement is an expression of the will to power. It is perhaps misleading of Lyotard to say that paganism is judgement without criteria; for it is judgement only without universal criteria. What he is denying is the possibility of a discourse that will give us adequate criteria for judgement in each and every case. Instead, what we must do (as pagans) is meet every circumstance that requires judgement anew, and create criteria specific to that case by an affirmative act of the imaginative will. Thus we will get a plurality of criteria, a plurality of judgements, a plurality of justices. In this sense, paganism can be thought of as a plurality of rules of judgement (gods), as opposed to belief in just one rule or set of rules (God). Somewhat paradoxically, perhaps (as Lyotard himself admits), the justice of this pluralism is assured by a prescriptive of universal value – the prescriptive that the rules of individual language games be respected; that they are not subsumed under a single criterion of judgement.
Lyotard soon abandoned the term ‘paganism’ in favour of ‘postmodernism.’ He presents his initial and highly influential formulation of postmodernism in The Postmodern Condition: A Report on Knowledge, commissioned by the government of Quebec and published in 1979. Lyotard famously defines the postmodern as ‘incredulity towards metanarratives,’ where metanarratives are understood as totalising stories about history and the goals of the human race that ground and legitimise knowledges and cultural practises. The two metanarratives that Lyotard sees as having been most important in the past are (1) history as progressing towards social enlightenment and emancipation, and (2) knowledge as progressing towards totalisation. Modernity is defined as the age of metanarrative legitimation, and postmodernity as the age in which metanarratives have become bankrupt. Through his theory of the end of metanarratives, Lyotard develops his own version of what tends to be a consensus among theorists of the postmodern – postmodernity as an age of fragmentation and pluralism.
The Postmodern Condition is a study of the status of knowledge in computerized societies. It is Lyotard’s view that certain technical and technological advancements have taken place since the Second World War (his historical pin-pointing of the beginning of postmodernity) which have had and are still having a radical effect on the status of knowledge in the world’s most advanced countries. As a defining element with which to characterise these technical and technological advancements, Lyotard chooses computerization. Lyotard identifies the problem with which he is dealing – the variable in the status of knowledge – as one of legitimation. For Lyotard, this is a question of both knowledge and power. Knowledge and power are simply two sides of the same question: who decides what knowledge is, and who knows what needs to be decided? According to Lyotard, in the computer age the question of knowledge is now more than ever a question of government. With vast amounts of knowledge stored digitally in databases, who decides what knowledge is worth storing (what is legitimate knowledge) and who has access to these databases? Lyotard points a suspicious finger at multinational corporations. Using IBM as an example, he suggests a hypothetical in which the corporation owns a certain belt in the Earth’s orbital field in which circulate satellites for communication and/or for storing data banks. Lyotard then asks, ‘who will have access to them? Who will determine which channels or data are forbidden? The State? Or will the State simply be one user among others?’
The method Lyotard chooses to use in his investigations is that of language games. Lyotard writes that the developments in postmodernity he is dealing with have been largely concerned with language: ‘phonology and theories of linguistics, problems of communication and cybernetics, modern theories of algebra and informatics, computers and their languages, problems of translation and the search for areas of compatibility among computer languages, problems of information storage and data banks, telematics and the perfection of intelligent terminals, paradoxology.’ Lyotard’s use of language games is derived from Ludwig Wittgenstein. The theory of language games means that each of the various categories of utterance can be defined in terms of rules specifying their properties and the uses to which they can be put. Lyotard makes three particularly important observations about language games. Firstly, the rules of language games do not carry within themselves their own legitimation, but are subject to a “contract” between “players” (interlocutors). Secondly, if there are no rules there is no game and even a small change in the rules changes the game. Thirdly, every utterance should be thought of as a “move” in a game. Different types of utterances, as identified by Wittgenstein, pertain to different types of language games. Lyotard gives us a few examples of types of utterances. The “denotative” is an utterance which attempts to correctly identify the object or referent to which it refers (such as “Snow is white”). The “performative” is an utterance which is itself a performance of an act to which it refers (such as “I promise”). The “prescriptive” is an utterance which instructs, recommends, requests, or commands (such as “Give me money”). For both Wittgenstein and Lyotard, language games are incommensurable, and moves in one language game cannot be translated into moves in another language game. For example, we cannot judge what ought to be the case (a prescriptive) from what is the case (a denotative.)
Lyotard’s choice of language games is primarily political in motivation, and relates to the close links between knowledge and power. In examining the status of knowledge in postmodernity, Lyotard is examining the political as well as epistemological aspects of knowledge (legitimation), and he sees the basic social bond – the minimum relation required for society to exist – as moves within language games. Lyotard needs a methodological representation to apply to society in order to examine the status of knowledge in postmodern societies. He presents us with two alternative views of society that have been popular in this century: society as a unitary whole (“traditional” theory) or society as a binary division (“critical” theory). Lyotard rejects both of these alternatives on the grounds that the choice seems difficult or arbitrary, and also rejects a third alternative – that we might distinguish two kinds of equally legitimate knowledge, one based on the view of society as unitary and the other on the view of society as binary. This division of knowledge is caught within a type of oppositional thinking that Lyotard believes is out of step with postmodern modes of knowledge.
Instead of the recently popular or “modern” models of society, Lyotard argues that even as the status of knowledge has changed in postmodernity, so has the nature of the social bond, particularly as it is evident in society’s institutions of knowledge. Lyotard presents a postmodern methodological representation of society as composed of multifarious and fragmented language games, but games which strictly (but not rigidly – the rules of a game can change) control the moves which can be made within them by reference to narratives of legitimation which are deemed appropriate by their respective institutions. Thus one follows orders in the army, prays in church, questions in philosophy, etc., etc. In his analysis of the state of knowledge in postmodernity, Lyotard firstly distinguishes between two types of knowledge – “narrative” knowledge and “scientific” knowledge. Narrative knowledge is the kind of knowledge prevalent in “primitive” or “traditional’ societies, and is based on storytelling, sometimes in the form of ritual, music and dance. Narrative knowledge has no recourse to legitimation – its legitimation is immediate within the narrative itself, in the “timelessness” of the narrative as an enduring tradition – it is told by people who once heard it to listeners who will one day tell it themselves. There is no question of questioning it. Indeed, Lyotard suggests that there is an incommensurability between the question of legitimation itself and the authority of narrative knowledge.
In scientific knowledge, however, the question of legitimation always arises. Lyotard says that one of the most striking features of scientific knowledge is that it includes only denotative statements, to the exclusion of all other kinds (narrative knowledge includes other kinds of statements, such as prescriptives). According to the “narrative” of science, however, only knowledge which is legitimated is legitimate – i.e. is knowledge at all. Scientific knowledge is legitimated by certain scientific criteria – the repeatability of experiments, etc. If the entire project of science needs a metalegitimation, however (and the criteria for scientific knowledge would itself seem to demand that it does) then science has no recourse but to narrative knowledge (which according to scientific criteria is no knowledge at all). This narrative has usually taken the form of a heroic epic of some kind, with the scientist as a “hero of knowledge” who discovers scientific truths. The distinction between narrative and scientific knowledge is a crucial point in Lyotard’s theory of postmodernism, and one of the defining features of postmodernity, on his account, is the dominance of scientific knowledge over narrative knowledge. The pragmatics of scientific knowledge do not allow the recognition of narrative knowledge as legitimate, since it is not restricted to denotative statements). Lyotard sees a danger in this dominance, since it follows from his view that reality cannot be captured within one genre of discourse or representation of events that science will miss aspects of events which narrative knowledge will capture. In other words, Lyotard does not believe that science has any justification in claiming to be a more legitimate form of knowledge than narrative. Part of his work in The Postmodern Condition can be read as a defence of narrative knowledge from the increasing dominance of scientific knowledge. Furthermore, Lyotard sees a danger to the future of academic research which stems from the way scientific knowledge has come to be legitimated in postmodernity (as opposed to the way it was legitimated in modernity).
In modernity the narrative of science was legitimated by one of a number of metanarratives, the two principal ones being respectively Hegelian and Marxist in nature. The Hegelian metanarrative speculates on the eventual totality and unity of all knowledge; scientific advancement is legitimated by the story that it will one day lead us to that goal. The Marxist metanarrative gives science a role in the emancipation of humanity. According to Lyotard, postmodernity is characterised by the end of metanarratives. So what legitimates science now? Lyotard’s answer is – performativity. This is what Lyotard calls the “technological criterion” – the most efficient input/output ratio. The technical and technological changes over the last few decades – as well as the development of capitalism – have caused the production of knowledge to become increasingly influenced by a technological model. It was during the industrial revolution, Lyotard suggests, that knowledge entered into the economic equation and became a force for production, but it is in postmodernity that knowledge is becoming the central force for production. Lyotard believes that knowledge is becoming so important an economic factor, in fact, that he suggests that one day wars will be waged over the control of information.
Lyotard calls the change that has taken place in the status of knowledge due to the rise of the performativity criterion the mercantilization of knowledge. In postmodernity, knowledge has become primarily a saleable commodity. Knowledge is produced in order to be sold, and is consumed in order to fuel a new production. According to Lyotard knowledge in postmodernity has largely lost its truth-value, or rather, the production of knowledge is no longer an aspiration to produce truth. Today students no longer ask if something is true, but what use it is to them. Lyotard believes that computerization and the legitimation of knowledge by the performativity criterion is doing away with the idea that the absorption of knowledge is inseparable from the training of minds. In the near future, he predicts, education will no longer be given “en bloc” to people in their youth as a preparation for life. Rather, it will be an ongoing process of learning updated technical information that will be essential for their functioning in their respective professions.
Lyotard does not believe that the innovations he predicts in postmodern education will necessarily have a detrimental effect on erudition. He does, however, see a problem with the legitimation of knowledge by performativity. This problem lies in the area of research. Legitimation by performativity lends itself to what Lyotard calls “terror” – the exclusion of players from language games or the exclusion of certain games entirely. Most true “discoveries,” Lyotard argues, are discoveries by virtue of the fact that they are so radical that they change the rules of the game – they cannot even be articulated within the rules of the “dominant” game (which is dominant because it draws the consensus of opinions). Many discoveries are not found to have a use until quite some time after they are made; therefore they seem to be of little value by the performativity criterion. Furthermore, for economic reasons, legitimation by performativity tends to follow the consensus opinion – that which is perceived by the majority of experts to have the most efficient input/output ratio is considered most likely in fact to be most performatively efficient, and hence the safest investment.
Lyotard argues that legitimation by performativity is against the interests of research. He does not claim that research should be aimed at production of “the truth”; he does not try to re-invoke the metanarratives of modernity to legitimate research. Rather, he sees the role of research as the production of ideas. Legitimation of knowledge by performativity terrorises the production of ideas. What, then, is the alternative? Lyotard proposes that a better form of legitimation would be legitimation by paralogy. The etymology of this word resides in the Greek words para – beside, past, beyond – and logos in its sense as “reason.” Thus paralogy is the movement beyond or against reason. Lyotard sees reason not as a universal and immutable human faculty or principle but as a specific and variable human production; “paralogy” for him means the movement against an established way of reasoning. In relation to research, this means the production of new ideas by going against or outside of established norms, of making new moves in language games, changing the rules of language games and inventing new games. Lyotard argues that this is in fact what takes place in scientific research, despite the imposition of the performativity criterion of legitimation. This is particularly evident in what Lyotard calls “postmodern science” – the search for instabilities [see Science and Technology]. For Lyotard, knowledge is not only the known but also the “revelation” or “articulation” of the unknown. Thus he advocates the legitimation of knowledge by paralogy as a form of legitimation that would satisfy both the desire for justice and the desire for the unknown.
Lyotard develops the philosophy of language that underlies his work on paganism and postmodernism most fully in The Differend: Phrases in Dispute. This book is, by Lyotard’s own estimation, both his most philosophical and most important. Here he analyses how injustices take place in the context of language. A differend is a case of conflict between parties that cannot be equitably resolved for lack of a rule of judgement applicable to both. In the case of a differend, the parties cannot agree on a rule or criterion by which their dispute might be decided. A differend is opposed to a litigation – a dispute which can be equitably resolved because the parties involved can agree on a rule of judgement. Lyotard distinguishes the victim from the plaintiff. The later is the wronged party in a litigation; the former, the wronged party in a differend. In a litigation, the plaintiff’s wrong can be presented. In a differend, the victim’s wrong cannot be presented. A victim, for Lyotard, is not just someone who has been wronged, but someone who has also lost the power to present this wrong. This disempowerment can occur in several ways: it may quite literally be a silencing; the victim may be threatened into silence or in some other way disallowed to speak. Alternatively, the victim may be able to speak, but that speech is unable to present the wrong done in the discourse of the rule of judgement. The victim may not be believed, may be thought to be mad, or not be understood. The discourse of the rule of judgement may be such that the victim’s wrong cannot be translated into its terms; the wrong may not be presentable as a wrong.
Lyotard presents various examples of the differend, the most important of which is Auschwitz. He uses the example of the revisionist historian Faurisson’s demands for proof of the Holocaust to show how the differend operates as a sort of double bind or “catch-22.” Faurisson will only accept proof of the existence of gas chambers from eyewitnesses who were themselves victims of the gas chambers. But of course, any such eyewitnesses are dead and are not able to testify. Faurisson concludes from this that there were no gas chambers. The situation is this: either there were no gas chambers, in which case there would be no eyewitnesses to produce evidence, or there were gas chambers, in which case there would still be no eyewitnesses to produce evidence (since they would be dead). Since Faurisson will accept no evidence for the existence of gas chambers except the testimony of actual victims, he will conclude from both possibilities (i.e. gas chambers existed; gas chambers didn’t exist) that gas chambers didn’t exist. The situation is a double bind because there are two alternatives – either there were gas chambers or there were not – which lead to the same conclusion: there were no gas chambers (and no Final Solution). The case is a differend because the harm done to the victims cannot be presented in the standard of judgment upheld by Faurisson. Lyotard presents the logic of the double bind involved in the differend in general as follows: either p or not p; if not-p, then Fp; if p, then not-p, then Fp. The two possibilities (p or not-p) both lead to the same conclusion (Fp). Lyotard gives a further example of the logic of the double bind: it is like saying both either it is white, or it is not white; and if it is white it is not white.
Another example of the differend which commentators on Lyotard often invoke is that of indigenous peoples’ claims to land rights in colonised countries. This example shows the relevance of Lyotard’s work for practical problems of justice in the contemporary world. Let us take Australian Aborigines as an example. Many tribal groups claim that land which they traditionally inhabited is now owned and controlled by the descendants of European colonists. They claim that the land was taken from them wrongfully, and that it should be given back to them. There is a differend in this case because Aboriginal land rights are established by tribal law, and evidence for such rights may not be presentable in the law of the Australian government. The court of appeal in which claims to land rights are heard functions entirely according to government law, and tribal law is not considered a valid system of judgment. In the case of a dispute over a certain area of land by farmers who are descendants of colonists on the one hand, and a tribe of Aborigines on the other hand, the court of appeal will be the one which involves the law that the farmers recognise (government law), while the law that the Aborigines recognise (tribal law) will not be considered valid. It may be the case that the only evidence for the claim to land rights that the Aborigines have will not be admissible as evidence in the court of government law (though it is perfectly acceptable in tribal law). Hence, we have a case of a wrong which cannot be presented as a wrong; a differend.
Lyotard develops the theory of the differend through a complex analysis of language, drawing heavily on analytic philosophers as well as ancients and early moderns. Lyotard’s ontology of events is developed here in terms of the phrase as event, and the limits of representation are seen in the indeterminacy involved in the linking of phrases. Phrases, on Lyotard’s account, may be extralinguistic, and can include signs, gestures, or anything that happens. Every event is to be understood as a phrase in the philosophy of the differend. This characterisation of events as phrases may be understood as a theoretical fiction or “a way of speaking” which allows Lyotard to develop a theory of events through the analysis of language, just as the libidinal philosophy does using libidinal energy. Lyotard calls the way phrases are linked together in series, one after the other, the concatenation of phrases. The law of concatenation states that these linkages must be made – that is, a phrase must be followed by another phrase – but that how to link is never determinate. There are many possible ways of linking on to a phrase, and no way is the right way.
In order to characterise phrases as events which are beyond full understanding and accurate representation, Lyotard undermines the common view that the meanings of phrases can be determined by what they refer to (the referent). That is, for Lyotard the meaning of a phrase as event (something happens) cannot be fixed by appealing to reality (what actually happened). He develops this view of language by appealing to Saul Kripke’s concept of the proper name as a “rigid designator” and by defining “reality” in an original way. Proper names pick our referents in a way that is rigid and consistent but, according to Lyotard, empty of sense. For example, the name Fred may consistently pick out a particular person, but there are many different senses or meanings which may be attached to this person. Only phrases carry sense (i.e. tell us something meaningful about Fred). The proper name may fix reference, but does nothing to fix sense. The name acts as a point which links the referent and the many senses which may be attached to it. Lyotard then defines reality as this complex of possible senses attached to a referent through a name. The correct sense of a phrase cannot be determined by a reference to reality, since the referent itself does not fix sense and reality itself is defined as the complex of competing senses attached to a referent. The phrase event remains indeterminate.
Lyotard uses the concepts of a phrase universe and of the difference between presentation and situation in order to show how phases can carry meanings and yet be indeterminate. Every phrase presents a universe, composed of the following four elements or, as Lyotard calls them, instances:
In the initial presentation of the phrase, the instances of the universe are equivocal. That is, there are many possible ways in which the instances may be situated in relation to each other. Who or what uttered the phrase, and to whom? To what does the phrase refer? What sense of the phrase is meant? This equivocation means that the meaning of the phrase is not fixed in the initial presentation, and only becomes fixed through what Lyotard calls situation. Situation takes place when the instances of the phrase universe are fixed through the concatenation of phrases. That is, when the phrase is followed by another phrase. When phrases are concatenated, they follow rules for linking called phrase regimens. Phrase regimens fix the instances of the phrase universe within a concatenation; these regimens are syntactic types of phrases such as the cognitive, the descriptive, the prescriptive, the interrogative, the evaluative, and so on. Any situation of a phrase within a concatenation will only be one possible situation of the initial presentation of the phrase, however. It is always possible to situate the phrase in a different way by concatenating with a different phrase regimen. In other words, the presentation of the phrase event is not able to be accurately represented by any particular situation. This also means that there is no “correct” way of concatenating a phrase, no correct phrase regimen to be employed in following one phrase with another.
Lyotard insists that phrase regimens are heterogenous and incommensurable. That is, they are of radically different types and cannot be meaningfully compared through an initial presentation of the phrase event of which they are situations. However, different phrase regimens can be brought together through genres. Genres supply rules for the linking of phrases, but rather than being syntactic rules as phrase regimens are, genres direct how to concatenate through ends, goals, or stakes. What is at stake in the genre of comedy, for example, is to be humorous, to make people laugh. This goal directs how phrases are linked on from one to another. As an example, Lyotard suggests that the phrase “To arms!” might be followed by the phrase “You have just formulated a prescription” if the goal is to make people laugh, but not if the goal implied by the genre is to inspire direct action (such as may be the case if it is uttered by a military commander on a battlefield). Genres of discourse can bring heterogenous phrase regimens together in a concatenation, but genres themselves are heterogenous and incommensurable. This means that there is no “correct” genre in which to situate the initial phrase which is presented, and no genre has more validity than others. The differend arises on this level of genres when the phrase event gives rise to different genres, but one genre claims validity over the others. That is, one genre claims the exclusive right to impose rules of concatenation from the initial phrase.
How do we know when a differend has occurred? Lyotard says that it is signalled by the difficulty of linking on from one phrase to another. A differend occurs when a discourse does not allow the linkages which would enable the presentation of a wrong. Lyotard insists that phrases must, of necessity, follow other phrases – even silence is a kind of phrase, with its own generic effects. A silent phrase in the context of a dispute may be covering four possible states of affairs, corresponding to each of the instances in the phrase universe:
In order for the referent to be expressed, these four silent negations must be withdrawn. The referent must have reality, must be presentable in the rules of the discourse, and the addressor must have confidence in the competence of both him/her self and the addressee. Through the idea of the differend, Lyotard has drawn particular attention to the problems of the presentability of the referent when the parties in dispute cannot agree on a common discourse, or rule of judgement (i.e. cannot agree on the genre(s) of phrase linkage). Justice demands, however, that wrongs be presented – we must at least try to “present the unpresentable.” How is this possible? Lyotard does not believe that there is any easy answer. But for the sake of justice, we must try. We must identify differends as best we can – sometimes, no more than vague feelings attest to the existence of a differend. It may be the feeling of “not being able to find the words.” Lyotard associates the identification of a differend with the feeling of the sublime, the mixture of pleasure and pain which accompanies the attempt to present the unpresentable. He privileges art as the realm which is best able to provide testimony to differends through its sublime effects [see Reason and Representation; Politics; Art and Aesthetics].
Lyotard’s philosophy frequently calls into question the powers of reason, rejecting many of the claims that have been made about it in the history of philosophy. The limitations of reason are particularly evident for Lyotard in regard to the problems of representation. Since Descartes, the dominant model of rational thought in Western philosophy has been that of the human subject representing the objective world to its self. It has frequently been claimed that in this way complete and certain knowledge is possible, at least in theory. Lyotard calls such claims into doubt through his thesis that events exceed representation. Furthermore, Lyotard draws attention to the fact that reason tends to operate with structured systems of concepts which exclude the sensual and emotional, but that these exclusions can never be entirely maintained. On the one hand, any representation will miss something of the event, and on the other, non-rational forces such as feelings and desires will arise to disrupt rational schemas of thought.
Lyotard’s analysis of the limits of reason and representation is played out in Discours, figure through the terms of the discursive and the figural. The discursive is the term used for reason and representation here; it is the rational system of representation by concepts that forms a system of oppositions. The figural is what exceeds rational representation; it appeals to sensual experience, emotions and desires. Lyotard uses the metaphors of flatness and depth to refer to discourse and figure, respectively. The opposition between discourse and figure is deconstructed, however, since to maintain it as an opposition would be to remain within the logic of discourse (and to retain discourse as primary). Lyotard introduces a distinction between opposition and difference to account for the differing ways in which the discursive and the figural function. Difference corresponds to figure, and the distinction between discourse and figure itself is said to be one of difference rather than opposition. In opposition, two terms are rigidly opposed and quite distinct; in difference, the two terms are mutually implicated, yet ultimately irreconcilable. Difference is a disruptive force at the limits of discourse, indicating that no rational system of representation can ever be closed or complete, but is always opened up to forces (sensual, emotional, figural) that it cannot enclose within itself.
In Discours, figure, Lyotard takes structuralism (still a dominant intellectual trend in France in the early seventies when the book was written) as an example of the excesses of reason and representation. Structuralism seeks to explain everything in terms of underlying, conditioning structures that take the form of rigid systems of oppositions. His aim is to show that structuralism ignores the figural elements at work both outside and within representational structures. Lyotard shows that discourse and figure are mutually implicated (thus deconstructing the opposition) by examining the relationship of Ferdinand de Saussure’s linguistics and Merleau-Ponty’s phenomenology. For Saussure, language is a “flat” system of opposing terms that gain meaning from each other, rather than from referents outside the system. Merleau-Ponty’s phenomenology suggests that we experience the world on a pre-cognitive level as ambiguous and somewhat chaotic sense data which must be synthesized by the perceiving subject in order to structure the world in a meaningful way. Saussure’s linguistics suggests that our understanding of the world is given as a structure to begin with, while Merleau-Ponty’s phenomenology suggests that we first encounter an unstructured world, which we must work to structure. Drawing on Merleau-Ponty’s phenomenological analysis of the depth of the visual field, Lyotard posits an interruption of the supposedly flat system of language by this depth. This takes place through the deictic terms in language (such as here, now, I, you, this) which gain meaning by referring to temporal and spatial specificities in the world of the language-user. The discursive structure of language, therefore, needs reference at some points to sensual experience. The opposition is further deconstructed by Lyotard’s insistence that our experience of space may also be structured in a discursive fashion. Space can be broken into ordered elements related to each other in a structured and organised way, such as by mapping it with a three dimensional grid. A rigid theory of how the body interacts with space, as Merleau-Ponty may arguably be accused of developing, also exhibits structuralist tendencies. This leads Lyotard to a criticism of phenomenology as well, on the grounds that its descriptions of the body in the world are also too structural and do not account for the disruptive force of the figural. Lyotard sees Lacan’s application of Saussurean linguistics to psychoanalysis as particularly worrisome. He attacks Lacan’s famous dictum that ‘the unconscious is structured like a language’ on the grounds that it is an over-rationalisation that posits representational structures to the exclusion of the figural. Returning to Freud, Lyotard develops a theory of libidinal forces as figural, as disruptive of reason and representation.
Reason and representation are further “critiqued” in the libidinal philosophy of Libidinal Economy and the related essays, although here the very idea of critique itself is called into question, since insofar as it remains theory, it remains within the oppositional logic of representational rationality. Rather than opposing the libidinal to the rational, then, Lyotard develops his theory of dissimulation, the mutual enfoldment of the libidinal and the rational which is similar to the deconstructive logic of difference worked out in Discours, figure. Lyotard’s main criticism of representation in the libidinal philosophy is that it is nihilistic. He draws an analogy between representational structures and Friedrich Nietzsche’s characterisation of religion and transcendental philosophy as forms of nihilism. For Nietzsche religion is nihilistic because it places the highest values (as the ground for all values) in a transcendent realm which cannot be accessed, thereby cutting us off from the highest values and devaluing the realm of our actual experience. According to Lyotard, representational theory follows this model by placing the reality that representation refers to in a transcendent realm. Lyotard expresses this nihilism in terms of what he calls “the Great zero.” This zero is the divide between representation and what it represents. Representation is nihilistic because it can never close the divide between representation and reality, effectively cutting off representational thought from access to reality. What is represented is constantly deferred. For Lyotard semiotics is a prime example of representational nihilism, because the definition of the sign is that it replaces something (negating that which it replaces).
In the libidinal philosophy Lyotard does not reject theory and representation itself as necessarily nihilistic; rather, it is representational theory’s own understanding of itself – how it represents itself – that is the focus of Lyotard’s attack. Instead of opposing theory with alternative practises which are more libidinal, Lyotard asserts that theory itself is a libidinal practice which denies that it is libidinal. The nihilistic aspect of representational theory is this denial of the libidinal. Theory attempts to be detached and “cold,” and takes itself to be a stable and consistent structure which represents stable structures in the world. Lyotard’s response to the nihilism of representational theory is not to propose an “other” to it (which he believes is impossible), but to inscribe theory itself into the libidinal economy. It is the concept of dissimulation which makes this possible. Systems dissimulate affects. Representational theory is itself a libidinal dispositif, and Lyotard accentuates the libidinal aspects of theory in order to combat its nihilistic tendencies. Against the nihilism of the semiotic sign Lyotard proposes a reinterpretation of the sign: the tensor. The tensor is a duplicitous sign. One of its sides (or potentialities) is the semiotic sign; this side is the potential to be inscribed in an existing structure of meaning. The other side of the tensor contains residual potentialities for other meanings. This side of the tensor disrupts and escapes the system, flowing into new systems and structures. The tensor expresses the theory of dissimulation at work in the sign. We might think of the tensor as the semiotic sign dissimulating affects which might disrupt its meaning and flow into new systems.
The critique of reason and representation shift in Lyotard’s postmodern philosophy from a focus on the figurative and libidinal forces which disrupt systems to an analysis of incommensurability in language and the limits of the rational faculty. Lyotard uses Wittgenstein’s idea of language games to show that reason and representation cannot be totalizing. The end of metanarratives means that no single overarching theory can pretend to account for everything. Rather, the postmodern condition is composed of fragmented language games attached to incommensurable forms of life. For Lyotard language is composed of a multiplicity of phrase regimes which cannot be translated into each other. Some are descriptive, some prescriptive, etc. These phrase regimes have no outside criteria for comparison. Between them lies the differend, an absolute difference which cannot be reconciled. In Lyotard’s postmodern philosophy, then, reason and representation are set limits by the incommensurability of language games; it is not possible for reason to understand everything through a representational system. In the postmodern philosophy events are analyzed as phrases, and again Lyotard asserts that events exceed representation in that no representational system can account for all phrases.
Furthermore, Lyotard’s postmodernism draws attention to the limits of reason through its focus on the sublime. The differend is experienced as a feeling of not being able to find the words to express something; it signals the limits of one language game or phrase regime and the attempt to move on to another one. Lyotard analyses this experience in terms of Kant’s idea of the sublime, which is itself an experience of the limits of reason. In Kant’s philosophy, the sublime is the mixed feeling of pleasure and pain that we feel in the face of something of great magnitude and grandeur. We can have an idea of such things, but we cannot match up that idea with a direct sensory intuition since sublime objects surpass our sensory abilities. An example of a sublime object for Kant would be a mountain; we can have an idea of a mountain, but not a sensory intuition of it as a whole. We feel pain at the frustration of our faculties to fully grasp the sublime object, but a pleasure as well in the attempt to do so. Lyotard extends the notion of the sublime from that which is absolutely great to all things which confound our abilities to synthesize them into knowledge. Thus the sublime is situated at the differend between language games and phrase regimes; we feel a mixture of pleasure and pain in the frustration of not knowing how to follow on from a phrase but feeling that there is something important that must be put into words. In Lyotard’s postmodern philosophy the sublime is the feeling that indicates the limits of reason and representation.
Like many other prominent French thinkers of his generation (such as Michel Foucault, Jacques Derrida and Gilles Deleuze), Lyotard develops critiques of the subject and of humanism. Lyotard’s misgivings about the subject as a central epistemological category can be understood in terms of his concern for difference, multiplicity, and the limits of organisational systems. For Lyotard the subject as traditionally understood in philosophy acts as a central point for the organisation of knowledge, eliminating difference and disorderly elements. Lyotard seeks to dethrone the subject from this organisational role, which in effect means decentring it as a philosophical category. He sees the subject not as primary, foundational, and central, but as one element among others which should be examined by thought. Furthermore, he does not see the subject as a transcendent and immutable entity, but as produced by wider social and political forces. In the libidinal philosophy, the subject is construed as one organisational structure or dispositif which channels and exploits libidinal energies. Like other structures which threaten to be hegemonic, Lyotard proposes its disruption through the release of the libidinal forces it contains which are not consistent with it. That is, the opening of the subject to forces which are deemed irrational, such as feelings and desires. Furthermore, Lyotard’s insistence that the freeing of dissimulated libidinal forces can only be passively done and not actively controlled is motivated by his identification of wilful acts with the organisational subject.
In Lyotard’s postmodern philosophy, the fragmentation of language games also means the social subject fragments and seems to dissolve. The subject cannot be seen as a master of language games, a unifying power, but is rather a node at which different incommensurable language games intersect. Lyotard furthermore asserts that avant-garde art works of the twentieth century do not reinforce the subject, but call it into question through the unsettling effect of the sublime. Humanism is also called into question in Lyotard’s later philosophy through the term “Inhuman.” Lyotard objects to humanism on the grounds that it depends upon a definition of the human which is exclusionary of difference. He asks why, if humanism is correct that there is a human nature, we are not born human but rather have to go through a terroristic education in order to become acceptably human. The term “Inhuman” has two meanings for Lyotard. Firstly, it refers to the dehumanising effects of science and technology in society. Secondly, it refers to those potentially positive forces that the idea of the human tries to repress or exclude, but which inevitably return with disruptive effects. Lyotard tries to show the limit of the humanistic ideal by imagining a science-fiction-like scenario in which, in 4.5 billion years time when our sun explodes, the human race will have developed the ability to survive without the Earth. In one sense this survival is the humanist dream (since survival is essential for the central importance of the human race in the universe), but in another sense it might constitute the end of the human, since the changes required to survive in space would be so radical as to erase anything we currently recognise as human. On the one hand Lyotard criticises the dehumanising effects of the progress of science and technology that are themselves bound up with the idea of human progress, and on the other he affirms the dehumanising forces that open up our thinking to more than a simple definition of the human.
Lyotard develops some reflections on science and technology within the scope of his postmodern philosophy [see The Postmodern Condition]. The changing status of science and technology is a primary feature of the postmodern condition, and Lyotard calls certain new forms of science postmodern. His concern with an ontology of events and a politics of competing representations of those events underlies his theorization of science and technology in postmodernity, in which the collapse of metanarratives has meant the proliferation of multiple, incommensurable language games (of which science is only one). We should interpret Lyotard as taking this to be a good thing, since such a proliferation more accurately reflects his general ontological view of the world as composed of events which give rise to multiple interpretations, and which can never be accurately captured by a single narrative. Metanarratives do violence to alternative representations of events that are valid in their own right. Lyotard sees the rise of capital, science and technology linked through legitimation by performativity as a similar threat, however. He calls this threat “terrorism”: the threat of exclusion from playing a language game.
The principle of legitimation functioning in capitalism is efficiency or performativity [see The Postmodern Condition], and this principle attempts to be hegemonic. Science and technology are prime candidates for this attempted hegemony, since they contribute to the growth of capital. Lyotard accepts that performativity is a legitimate criterion for technology, but argues that it is not proper to science. He develops his argument around what he calls postmodern science, by which he means recent sciences such as Benoit Mandelbrot’s fractal theory and Rene Thom’s catastrophe theory that search for instabilities rather than regularities in systems. Following to some extent philosophers of science Thomas Kuhn and Paul Feyerabend, Lyotard argues that the performativity criterion does not accurately capture the kind of knowledge developed in the sciences nor the way such knowledge develops. For Lyotard, science is a language game to which legitimation by performativity is not proper. Such performativity merely subordinates science to capital. According to Lyotard, it is the idea of a deterministic system that allows performativity in science, since determinism allows the prediction and calculation of input/output values.
Postmodern science, however, does not function according to a legitimation by performativity precisely because it undermines determinism. Postmodern science searches for instabilities in systems, undermining predictability. Lyotard cites thermodynamics as the beginning of performativity in terms of determinism, and suggests that quantum mechanics and atomic physics have limited the applicability of this principle. Postmodern sciences, which concern themselves with undecidables, the limits of precise control, conflicts characterized by incomplete information, “fracta,” catastrophes, and pragmatic paradoxes, continue to undermine performativity in the form of determinism. Furthermore, postmodern science is undermining legitimation by performativity by retheorizing the way science itself develops: science does not develop in a progressive fashion and towards a unified knowledge, but in a discontinuous and paradoxical manner, undermining previous paradigms by the development of new ones. This is what Lyotard calls legitimation by paralogy. He suggests that science may be undergoing a paradigm shift from deterministic performativity to the paralogy of instabilities. Yet this is only a possibility: performativity still looms large on the horizon. Lyotard suggests science could go either way. He champions paralogy over performativity, since it contributes to healthy research in the sciences and undermines the hegemonic control capital attempts to have. Postmodern science is about the generation of new ideas rather than the efficient application of existing knowledge.
Lyotard is also concerned about the social impact of science and technology in postmodernity. He sees the performativity criterion as applying not just to science, technology, and capital, but to the State as well. According to the performativity criterion, society is seen as a system which must aim for efficient functioning, and this efficiency is a kind of terror which threatens to exclude inefficient elements. Furthermore, in post-industrial society information has become a primary mode of production, and Lyotard is concerned that in the interests of maximising profits information will become increasingly privatised by corporations. He proposes the possibility of IBM having exclusive control of databases and satellites. In response to these threats, Lyotard proposes that the public be given free access to memory and data banks. This will allow computerization to contribute to knowledge functioning by paralogy rather than by performativity, and to the free functioning of society as a set of heterogenous elements rather than an efficient system, removing the threat of terror.
Lyotard’s early political commitments were to revolutionary socialism and a relatively orthodox Marxism (see Biography and Early Works (b) Algeria). Despite his radical disillusion with these early political commitments, however, a strong political concern remains a central feature of all of Lyotard’s mature works. Lyotard’s notion of the political, however, must be understood as quite distinct from that employed in much traditional and contemporary politics and political theory. Having rejected the possibility of a politics based on a single theory that will accurately capture the truth of all social events (such as Marxism), Lyotard’s later concern is to do justice to multiple social realities. He is concerned with the free proliferation of heterogenous elements in society, and for him the institutions of politics and traditional political theory limit multiplicities and differences. Lyotard’s politics can be traced back to his general concern for events and the limits of representation. There is a strong correlation between his concern that events are not done justice by any one theoretical, representational system, and his concern that events of political import are not done justice by the way any particular political party or philosophy represents them.
The politics of the libidinal philosophy revolves around a nuanced reading of Marx and a duplicitous relation to capitalism. While Lyotard has given up on the possibility and desirability of a socialist revolution, he is still interested in the deployment of revolutionary desires. Libidinal Economy contains a reading of Marx’s texts as works of art, an emphasis which seeks to release the libidinal aspects of Marx, the desire for revolution. Lyotard’s interpretation of capitalism in the libidinal economy sees two possibilities inherent in capitalism, each entwined and inextricable. On the one hand, capitalism is a good system for the circulation of libidinal energies; it encourages enterprising explorations of and investments in new areas. On the other hand, capitalism tends to hoard up libidinal energy into structured and regulated systems, restricting its flow. This latter tendency is at work in the capitalist exploitation that Marx rallied against. Lyotard interprets these two tendencies of capitalism in terms of the theory of dissimulation. For Lyotard, there is no possible society that is not open to the desire to exploit and hoard libidinal energy in the way the capitalist does. This means that there is no utopian society free from exploitation, either pre-capitalist or post-revolutionary. Lyotard’s libidinal politics is not aimed at overthrowing capitalism, then, but of working within it to release the libidinal energies dissimulated within its structures. Practically, this also means working within existing political institutions, but “passively,” so as to release as much desire dissimulated within those institutions as possible, without constraining desires through planned outcomes.
Lyotard’s postmodern politics involves the attempt to rethink the political after the death of metanarratives such as Marxism and liberalism. Lyotard rejects all dominant political ideologies as master-narratives which exclude minorities and do violence to the heterogenous nature of social reality. This rejection is manifested in the philosophy of paganism that preceded Lyotard’s postmodernism. Here, the notion of “impiety” associated with the pagan is a rejection of “pious” political ideologies which unquestioningly assert principles and values as universally and unquestioningly true. In its mature form, Lyotard’s postmodern politics deals with the concern for justice and the need to bear witness to the differend. In the case of a differend, a wrong is done to a party who cannot phrase their hurt (See Postmodernism (c) The Differend). For Lyotard, no just resolution of a differend is possible. Because of the radical incommensurability of phrase regimes in the case of a differend, any “resolution” would only assert the legitimacy of one phrase regime at the cost of silencing the other, thus deepening the wrong. Justice demands a witnessing and a remembering of the fact that there is a differend. This means presenting the fact that a wrong has been done which cannot itself be presented. This is then the contradictory task of presenting the unpresentable, a task Lyotard sees as best accomplished in the arena of art.
Lyotard was a prolific writer on both art and philosophical aesthetics. An aesthetic theory focusing on the avant-garde deeply informs both major phases of his philosophical thought (the libidinal and the postmodern). Examples from particular movements in art and individual artists and writers are common in his philosophical works, and in addition he wrote a number of books on individual artists, including Georges Guiffrey, Albert Ayme, Gian-franco Baruchello, Jacques Monory, Valerio Adami, Shusaku Arakawa, and Daniel Buren. Lyotard also organised an art exhibition, Les immatériaux, at the Centre Georges Pompidou in 1985. The exhibition collected works which explored connections between the media, art, space, and matter.
Art has a privileged place in Lyotard’s philosophy of events, since it calls attention to the limits of representation. In the earlier phase of his work, art is celebrated for its figural and libidinal aspects that oppose and deregulate systems of discourse and rational thought. In Lyotard’s postmodern period, art is privileged for its sublime effects and the attention it calls to the differend. It is not all kinds of art that Lyotard celebrates; he is particularly interested in the avant-garde. Some forms of art can reinforce structured systems of meaning, but the special feature of avant-garde art is to disrupt expectations, conventions, and established orders of reception. In Discours, figure, visual arts are associated with the figural and the process of seeing. However, poetry is also privileged as a manifestation of the figural in the way it upsets established orders of meaning, following Lyotard’s move from the figural as simply sensuous to the figural as disruptive force in any system. The libidinal philosophy engages with art on the level of its affective force: shapes and colours act as tensors within the system of signification that the artwork forms, and unlike more rigidly structured systems, artworks more readily release their affective energy into different systems of interpretation, reception, and influence. Furthermore, the process of painting exemplifies the ambiguously passive yet active way in which Lyotard sees the release of libidinal energies as most effective. A painting is not a rigidly pre-planned structured piece of work in which the outcome is determined beforehand, but a process of experimentation. In this process, affects are inscribed on a surface without being strictly controlled by an actively willing and organising subject. The most important artists for Lyotard in this period include Paul Cézanne, Marcel Duchamp, and Robert Delaunay.
In Lyotard’s philosophy of postmodernism and the differend, he develops an aesthetic theory of postmodern art. It is essential to distinguish Lyotard’s concept of postmodern art from other ideas of postmodern art. There are many theories of postmodernism in the arts, literature, architecture, and other areas of cultural practise. Other theorists (such as Jean Baudrillard) have also proposed aesthetic theories of postmodernism which differ from Lyotard’s understanding of postmodernism in the arts. In particular, Lyotard’s postmodern art must be distinguished from the stylistic trends often called postmodern in the art world (such as the anti-modern return to representational realism or the simulationism of Peter Halley, Sherrie Levine, Jeff Koons and others). Lyotard’s concept of postmodernism in the arts relates more to what is usually called modernism in the arts. It focuses on the experimentation of the avant-garde, and Lyotard takes as privileged examples Abstract Expressionism and particularly the work of Barnett Newman. Lyotard makes his own distinction between the categories of modern and postmodern in art, however, in a couple of ways. Firstly, postmodernism is said to be the avant-garde movement always at work within modernism itself. It is that which is so new and different it can only be called modern in retrospect. In this sense, postmodernism is the spirit of experimentation that drives modernism into ever-changing forms; it is the disruptive force that unsettles accepted rules for reception and meaning. For Lyotard something must be postmodern before it can become modern. That is, it must be unsettling before it becomes an accepted norm.
Secondly, however, according to Lyotard postmodern avant-garde art never entirely loses its ability to disturb. This power of disturbance is related to the feeling of the sublime, and it is an indication of the differend. In this context, modern and postmodern art can be distinguished in the following way. Both are concerned with the unpresentable: that which cannot be presented (or represented) in art. Modern art, however, presents the fact that there is an unpresentable, while postmodern art attempts to present the unpresentable. This is a paradoxical task, and arouses in the viewer the mixture of pleasure and pain that is the sublime. Lyotard takes Barnett Newman’s work as a paragon of postmodern, avant-garde art. Newman consciously seeks to achieve the sublime in his paintings, and Lyotard believes he achieves this by making his viewers feel that something profound and important is going on in his works, but without being able to identify what this is. Postmodern art has a political importance for Lyotard, since it can call attention to differends through the feeling of the sublime, showing us that a wrong has been done. Bearing witness to the differend is the primary focus of Lyotard’s postmodern politics, and art is the privileged arena in which this witnessing takes place.
Two of Lyotard’s latest works were on the French writer, activist, and politician, André Malraux. Signed, Malraux is an unconventional autobiography. Lyotard’s philosophical commitments distance him from the presuppositions underlying the traditional genre of biography, where the subject is assumed to be unified and the text is taken to represent the truth about that subject. Lyotard instead takes Malraux as a set of heterogenous elements (texts, political activities, personal relationships, etc), which he, as author, consciously unifies through the creation of a fictional character. Lyotard’s interest in Malraux may be explained through the commonalities they share, in particular a problematic relation to the political and an attempted solution to this problem through art. Soundproof Room: Malraux’s Anti-Aesthetics situates Malraux’s work in a nihilist and abjectivist tradition of writers that includes Louis Céline, Georges Bataille, Antonin Artaud, and Albert Camus. What these writers share is a concern with the decline of belief in objective values (the “death of God”) and the strangeness and nausea of the human body.
The Confession of Augustine was incomplete at the time of Lyotard’s death, and has been published posthumously in partial form, with working notes appended. At first glance this somewhat cryptic, poetic, and quasi-religious work seems to bear little resemblance to any other piece in Lyotard’s oeuvre. On closer inspection, however, the themes Lyotard works through in his reading of Augustine’s Confessions can be recognised as those already touched on in earlier works. The discussion of signs recalls Lyotard’s analysis of the nihilism of semiotics in Libidinal Economy, where he refers to Augustine, and what is perhaps the main theme of this work – Augustine’s writing as a study in the phenomenology of time – is referred to in the earlier paper “The Sublime and the Avant-Garde.” Lyotard reads Augustine as the precursor to the phenomenological studies of time developed by Edmund Husserl, Martin Heidegger, and Jean-Paul Sartre. This study problematises the temporal mode of the ‘now’, the present, in its relations to the past and the future. The problematic of time is a recurring feature in Lyotard’s work, and thus The Confession of Augustine can be seen as a further investigation into one of Lyotard’s ongoing concerns.
The following is a list of books by and about Lyotard available in English. For further bibliographical references, including further original French editions, journal articles, and contributions by and about Lyotard, see Lyotard’s Peregrinations and Joan Nordquist’s Jean-François Lyotard: A Bibliography.
The Melbourne School of Continental Philosophy
Last updated: June 30, 2005 | Originally published: