The Moral Permissibility of Punishment

The legal institution of punishment presents a distinctive moral challenge because it involves a state’s infliction of intentionally harsh, or burdensome, treatment on some of its members—treatment that typically would be considered morally impermissible. Most of us would agree, for instance, that it is typically impermissible to imprison people, to force them to pay monetary sanctions or engage in community service, or to execute them. The moral challenge of punishment, then, is to establish what (if anything) makes it permissible to subject those who have been convicted of crimes to such treatment.

Traditionally, justifications of punishment have been either consequentialist or retributivist. Consequentialist accounts contend that punishment is justified as a means to securing some valuable end—typically crime reduction, by deterring, incapacitating, or reforming offenders. Retributivism, by contrast, holds that punishment is an intrinsically appropriate (because deserved) response to criminal wrongdoing. Each type of account has been roundly criticized, on a variety of grounds, by theorists in the other camp. In an effort to break this impasse, scholars have attempted to find alternative strategies that incorporate certain consequentialist or retributivist elements but avoid the standard objections directed at each. Each of these accounts has, in turn, met with criticism. Finally, abolitionists argue that none of these defenses of punishment is satisfactory, and that the practice is morally impermissible; the salient question for abolitionists, then, is how else (if at all) society should respond to those forms of wrongdoing that we now punish.

This article first looks more closely at what punishment is; in particular, it examines the distinctive features of punishment in virtue of which it stands in need of justification. It then highlights various questions that a full justification of punishment would need to answer. With these questions in mind, the article considers the most prominent consequentialist, retributivist, and hybrid attempts at establishing punishment’s moral permissibility. Finally, it considers the abolitionist alternative.

Table of Contents

  1. What is Punishment?
  2. Various Questions
  3. Consequentialist Accounts
    1. Deterrence
    2. Incapacitation
    3. Offender Reform
    4. Sentencing
    5. Objections and Responses
  4. Retributivist Accounts
    1. Deserved Suffering
    2. Fair Play
    3. Censure
    4. Other Versions
    5. Sentencing
  5. Alternative Accounts
    1. Rights Forfeiture
    2. Consent
    3. Self-Defense
    4. Moral Education
    5. Hybrid Approaches
  6. Abolitionism
  7. References and Further Reading

1. What is Punishment?

When we consider whether punishment is morally permissible, it is important first to be clear about what it is that we are evaluating. Theorists disagree about a precise definition of punishment; nevertheless, we can identify a number of features that are commonly cited as elements of punishment.

First, it is generally accepted that punishment involves the infliction of a burden. The state confines people in jails and prisons, where liberties such as their freedom of movement and association, and their privacy, are heavily restricted. It imposes often heavy monetary sanctions or forces people to take part in community service work. It subjects people to periods of probation during which their movements and activities are closely supervised. In the most extreme cases, it executes people. Theorists disagree on precisely how to characterize this feature of punishment. Some describe punishment as essentially painful, or as involving the infliction of suffering, harsh treatment, or harm. Others instead write of punishment as involving the restriction of liberties. However we characterize the specific nature of the burden, it is relatively uncontroversial that punishment in its various forms is burdensome.

One might object that some prisoners could become accustomed to incarceration and so not see it as a burden, or that the masochist might even enjoy his corporal punishment. In response to supposed counterexamples such as these, a defender of the “burdensomeness” feature of punishment might argue that the comfortable prisoner and the masochist are still punished insofar as they are treated in ways that are typically regarded as burdensome by those on whom they are inflicted. Alternatively, one might argue that a particular case of incarceration, corporal punishment, and so forth, indeed does not count as punishment if the prisoner does not find it burdensome (Boonin, 2008: 8-10). Whatever one makes of these attempted counterexamples, it remains the case that punishment theorists by and large agree that burdensomeness is an essential feature of punishment.

But punishment is not merely burdensome. A second widely accepted feature of punishment is that it is intended to be burdensome. This feature distinguishes punishment from other forms of treatment that may be burdensome but are not intentionally so. Many people undoubtedly regard it as burdensome to pay their taxes, for instance, but presumably most do not regard this as a form of punishment. This is because although taxes may be foreseeably burdensome, they are not intentionally so. That is, the state does not levy taxes intending for them to be burdensome; rather, the intention is to pay for roads, an education system, and other public goods. That paying for these goods is burdensome to many taxpayers is incidental, and if there were a way to collect sufficient revenue to pay for needed public goods without this being a burden to taxpayers, then so much the better.

Punishment, however, is different. Punishment is intended to be burdensome. If it were not burdensome, then it would not be doing its job. For instance, as we will see below, some theorists contend that the aim of punishment is to reduce crime by deterring potential criminals. But for the threat of punishment to be the sort of thing likely to deter criminals, the punishment itself must be burdensome. Other theorists (retributivists) contend that wrongdoers deserve to suffer, and that punishment is justified as the infliction of this deserved suffering. Here again, the burdensomeness of punishment is not merely incidental, it is intended.

Of course, not all impositions of intended burdens count as punishment. A third commonly accepted feature of punishment is that it is imposed on someone guilty of an offense, as a response to that offense. Actually, there is some disagreement about this point. To count as punishment, must it be imposed on someone who is actually guilty of a crime? Or would it make sense to talk of punishing an innocent person (either mistakenly or intentionally)? Some scholars contend that punishment must be of a guilty person. Susan Dimock writes, “The innocent may be ‘victimized’ by the penal system, but they cannot be ‘punished’” (Dimock, 1997: 42). By contrast, H. L. A. Hart contends that we should acknowledge not only punishment of actual offenders, but also cases (which he calls “sub-standard or secondary”) of punishment “of persons…who neither are in fact nor supposed to be offenders” (see Hart, 1968: 5).

A fourth feature of punishment, widely acknowledged at least since the publication of Joel Feinberg’s seminal 1970 article “The Expressive Function of Punishment” is that it serves to express condemnation, or censure, of the offender for her offense. As Feinberg discusses, it is this condemning element that distinguishes punishment from what he calls “nonpunitive penalties” such as parking tickets, demotions, flunkings, and so forth. (Feinberg, 1965: 398-401). As we will see below, some scholars have taken this expression of censure to be central to the justification of punishment. But whether or not it plays a role in the justification of the practice, this expressive function is typically accepted as a distinctive feature of punishment.

Finally, it is worth highlighting that this article focuses on the legal institution of punishment—rather than, say, parents’ punishment of their children or other interpersonal cases of punishment (but see Zaibert, 2006). Legal theorists often assert as one of punishment’s features that it must be imposed by a properly constituted legal authority (typically, the state). They thereby aim to differentiate legal punishment from private vengeance or vigilantism. This does not mean we must accept uncritically that the state is the proper authority to impose punishment. Ideally, a full account of punishment should provide a plausible answer to why (or if) the state has an exclusive right to impose punishment.

These, then, are the most commonly cited features of punishment: punishment involves the state’s imposition of intended burdens—burdens that express social condemnation—on people (believed to be) guilty of crimes, in response to those crimes. This is not intended as a precise definition or a set of necessary and sufficient conditions for punishment. Theorists may disagree about particular elements, or especially about how exactly to flesh out the various elements. But this description is sufficient to give us a sense of why punishment stands in need of justification: It involves the state’s treating some of its members (imposing intentionally burdensome, censuring sanctions) in ways that typically would be morally impermissible.

2. Various Questions

When theorists ask whether punishment is justified, they typically assume a backdrop in which the legal system administering punishment is legitimate, and the criminal laws themselves are reasonably just. This is not to say that they assume that all legal systems are legitimate and all criminal laws are reasonably just in the actual world. Indeed, questions of political legitimacy and criminalization are important topics that have received a great deal of attention in their own right. But even in societies in which the legal system is legitimate and the laws are reasonably just, a general question arises of whether (and if so, why) it is permissible for the state to impose intended, censuring burdens on those who violate the laws.

This general question of punishment’s moral permissibility actually comprises a number of particular questions. A full normative account of punishment should provide answers to each of these questions.

First, there is the question of punishment’s function, or purpose. Put simply, what reason is there to want an institution of punishment? H. L. A. Hart referred to this as punishment’s “general justifying aim,” although this term may be misleading in two ways: on one hand, to say that the aim is justifying implies that it is sufficient, by itself, to establish punishment’s permissibility. As we will see, some scholars point out that more is needed to justify punishment than merely citing its function, no matter how valuable. On the other hand, talk of a justifying aim seems to privilege consequentialist accounts, according to which punishment is justified as a means to some socially valuable goal. But even for retributivist accounts, according to which punishment is justified not as a means to some end but rather as an intrinsically appropriate response to wrongdoing, we still need an explanation of why such a response is important enough to warrant the state’s institution of punishment. A first question, then, is what sufficiently important function punishment serves.

Even if we establish some sufficiently valuable function of punishment, this may not be enough to justify the practice. Some scholars contend that a crucial question is whether punishment violates the moral rights of those punished. If punishing offenders violates their rights, then it may be morally impermissible even if it serves some important function (Simmons, 1991; Wellman, 2009). What we need, according to this view, is an account of why, in principle, the practice of imposing intended burdens on people in the ways characteristic of punishment does not violate their moral rights.

In addition to justifying the practice of punishment in general, a complete account of punishment should also provide guidance in determining how to punish in particular cases. Even if the institution of punishment is morally permissible, a particular sentence may be impermissible if it is excessively harsh (or on some accounts, if it is too lenient). What principles and considerations should guide assessments of how severely to punish?

Relatedly, although this point has received less attention, we should ask not only about the appropriate severity of punishment but also about the proper mode of punishment. We may critique certain sentences not in virtue of their severity but because we believe the form of punishment (incarceration, capital punishment, and so forth) is in some sense inappropriate (Reiman, 1985; Moskos, 2011). What considerations, then, should guide assessments of whether imprisonment, fines, community service, probation, capital punishment, or some other form of punishment is the appropriate response to instances of criminal wrongdoing?

Finally, as mentioned, it is important to ask about the state’s role as the agent of punishment. Why is it the state’s right to impose punishment (if indeed it is)? Furthermore, what gives the state the exclusive right to punish (Wellman, 2009)? Why may victims not inflict punishment on their assailants (or hire someone to inflict the punishment)? Another question related to the proper agent of punishment—a question that has become increasingly salient in the decades following the Nuremberg trials—is when (if ever) the international community, rather than a particular state, can be the proper agent of punishment. What sorts of crime, and which criminals, are properly accountable to the institutions of international criminal law rather than (or perhaps in addition) to the domestic legal systems of particular states?

As we will see, various accounts of punishment focus on different questions. Also, some accounts seek to answer each of these questions by appealing to the same moral principles or considerations, whereas others appeal to different considerations in answering the different questions.

3. Consequentialist Accounts

Consequentialism holds that the rightness or wrongness of actions—or rules for action, or (relevant to our context) institutions—is determined solely by their consequences. Thus consequentialist accounts of punishment defend the practice as instrumentally valuable: the consequences of maintaining an institution of legal punishment, according to this view, are better than the consequences of not having such an institution. For many consequentialists, the burden of punishment itself is seen as a negative consequence—an “evil,” as Jeremy Bentham called it (Bentham, 1789: 158). Thus for punishment to be justified, it must be the case that it brings about other, sufficiently valuable consequences to outweigh its onerousness for the person on whom it is inflicted. Typically, punishment is defended as a necessary means to the socially valuable end of crime reduction, through deterrence, incapacitation, or offender reform.

a. Deterrence

Deterrence accounts contend that the threat of punishment serves as a disincentive for potential criminals. On such accounts, for the threat of punishment to be effective as a deterrent, it must be credible—it must have teeth, so to speak—and thus the legal system must follow through on the threat and impose punishment on those who violate laws. Theorists have distinguished two potential audiences for the deterrent threat: first, the threat of punishment might serve to dissuade members of the public generally from committing crimes that they might otherwise have committed. This is called general deterrence. Second, for those who do commit crimes and are subjected to punishment, the threat of future punishment (namely, the prospect of having to experience prison again, or pay further fines, and so forth) might provide a disincentive to reoffending. This is typically referred to as specific (or special) deterrence.

b. Incapacitation

Punishment might also help to reduce crime by incapacitating criminals. Unlike deterrence, incapacitation does not operate by dissuading potential offenders. Incapacitation instead aims to remove dangerous people from situations in which they could commit crimes. Imprisoning someone in a solitary confinement unit, for instance, may or may not convince her not to commit crimes in the future; but while she is locked up, she will be unable to commit (most) crimes.

c. Offender Reform

A third way in which punishment might help to reduce crime is by encouraging or facilitating offender reform. The aim of reform is like that of specific deterrence in one respect: both seek to induce a change in the offender’s behavior. That is, the aim for both is that she should choose not to reoffend. In this respect, both reform and specific deterrence differ from incapacitation, which is concerned with restricting rather than influencing offenders’ choices. But reform differs from specific deterrence in terms of the ways in which each seeks to induce different choices. Punishment aimed at specific deterrence provides prudential reasons: we impose onerous treatment on an offender in hopes that her aversion to undergoing such treatment again will convince her not to reoffend. Punishment with the aim of offender reform, by contrast, aims to reshape offenders’ moral motives and dispositions.

d. Sentencing

Each of these aims—deterrence, incapacitation, and reform—will have distinct implications with respect to sentencing. Punishment aimed at reducing crime through deterrence would in general need to be severe enough to provide members of the public with a significant incentive not to offend, or to provide offenders with an incentive not to reoffend. Also, as Bentham explained, the severity of sentences should reflect the relative seriousness of the crimes punished (Bentham, 1789: 168). More serious crimes should receive more severe punishments than do less serious crimes, so that prospective offenders, if they are going to commit one crime or the other, will have an incentive to choose the less serious crime.

For punishment aimed at reducing crime through incapacitation, sentences should be restrictive enough that dangerous offenders will be unable to victimize others (so, for instance, prison appears generally preferable to fines as a form of incapacitative punishment). In terms of duration, incapacitative sentences should last as long as the offender poses a genuine threat. Similarly, sentences aimed at reducing crime through offender reform should be tailored, in terms of the form, severity, and duration of punishment, in whatever ways are determined to be most conducive to this aim.

Finally, insofar as punishment itself is considered to be, in Bentham’s words, an “evil,” the consequentialist is committed to the view that sentences should be no more severe than is necessary to accomplish their aim. Thus whether she endorses deterrence, incapacitation, reform, or some other aim (or a combination of these), the consequentialist should also endorse a parsimony constraint on sentence severity (Tonry, 2011). After all, to impose sentences that are more severe than is necessary to accomplish punishment’s aim(s) would appear to be an infliction of gratuitous suffering—and so, from a consequentialist perspective, unjustified.

e. Objections and Responses

Typical consequentialist accounts of punishment contend that the practice is justified because it produces, on balance, positive consequences by helping to reduce crime, either through deterrence, incapacitation, or offender reform. Critics have objected to such consequentialist accounts on a number of grounds.

First, some have objected to deterrence accounts on grounds that punishment does not actually deter potential offenders. A key worry is that often (perhaps typically) those who commit crimes act impulsively or irrationally, rather than as efficient calculators of expected utility, and so they are not responsive to the threat of punishment. The question of whether punishment deters is an empirical one, and criminological studies on this question have come to different conclusions. In general, evidence seems to indicate that punishment does have some deterrent effect, but that the certainty of apprehension plays a greater deterrent role than does the severity of punishment (Nagin, 2013).

A similar line of objection has been raised against reform-based accounts of punishment. Criminological research in the 1970s led many scholars and practitioners to conclude that punishment did not, indeed could not, promote offender reform (the mantra “nothing works” was for many years ubiquitous in these discussions). More recent criminological work, however, has generated somewhat more optimism about the prospects for offender reform (Cullen, 2013).

Whereas critics have questioned whether punishment deters or facilitates offender reform, there is little doubt that punishment—especially incarceration—incapacitates (prisoners may still have opportunities to commit crimes, but their opportunities are at least significantly limited.) Critics have raised questions, however, about the link between incapacitation and crime reduction. For punishment to be justified on incapacitative grounds, after all, it would need to be the case not only that punishment in fact incapacitates, but that in so doing it helps to reduce crime. At least in some cases, there is reason to doubt whether the link between incapacitation and crime reduction holds. Most notably, locking up drug dealers or gang members does not appear to decrease drug- or gang-related crimes, because the incapacitated person is quickly and easily replaced by someone else (Tonry, 2006: 31-32).

Even if we accept, for argument’s sake, that punishment contributes to crime reduction, it still may not be justified on consequentialist grounds if it also generates costs that outweigh its benefits. The costs of punishment are not limited to the suffering or other burdens inflicted on offenders, although these burdens do matter from a consequentialist perspective. Scholars have also highlighted burdens associated with certain forms of punishment—in particular, incarceration—for offenders’ families and communities (Mauer and Chesney-Lind, 2002). These costs matter in consequentialist calculations. In addition, we must consider the financial costs of maintaining an institution of criminal punishment. In 2012, the Vera Institute of Justice released a study of 40 U.S. states that found that the total taxpayer cost of prisons in these states was $39 billion. Thus defenders of punishment on consequentialist grounds must show not only that punishment is beneficial, but also that its benefits are significant enough to outweigh its costs to offenders and to society generally.

Furthermore, even if punishment’s benefits outweigh its costs, consequentialists must make the case that these benefits cannot be achieved through some other, less burdensome response to crime. If there are alternatives to punishment that are equally effective in reducing crime but are less costly overall, then from a consequentialist perspective, these alternatives would be preferable (Boonin, 2008: 53, 264-67).

Suppose, however, that the benefits of punishment outweigh its harms and also that there are no alternatives to punishment that generate, on balance, better overall consequences. In this case, punishment would be justified from a consequentialist perspective. Many theorists, however, do not endorse consequentialism. Indeed, the most prominent philosophical objections to consequentialist accounts of punishment take aim specifically at supposed deficiencies of consequentialism itself.

Perhaps the most common objection to consequentialist accounts is that they are unable to provide principled grounds for ruling out punishment of the innocent. If there were ever a situation in which punishing an innocent person would promote the best consequences, then consequentialism appears committed to doing so. H. J. McCloskey imagines a case in which, in the wake of a heinous crime, a small-town sheriff must decide whether to frame and punish a person whom the townspeople believe to be guilty but the sheriff knows is innocent if doing so is the only way to prevent rioting by the townspeople (McCloskey, 1957: 468-69). If punishing the innocent person defuses the residents’ hostilities and prevents the riots—and thereby produces better overall consequences than continuing to search for the actual criminal—then it appears that the consequentialist is committed to punishing the innocent person. But knowingly punishing an innocent person strikes most of us as deeply unjust.

Consequentialists have responded to this objection in various ways. Some contend that what McCloskey describes is not actually punishment, because punishment, by definition, is a response to those guilty of crimes (or at least believed to be guilty, whereas in McCloskey’s example, the sheriff knows the person to be innocent). H. L. A. Hart refers to this response as the “definitional stop” and he suggests it is unhelpful because it seeks to define away the interesting normative questions. Setting terminology aside, the relevant questions are whether and why it is permissible to impose intended, condemnatory burdens on those (believed to be) guilty of crimes. The consequentialist’s response is that doing so produces the best consequences, but then it seems that the consequentialist should be committed to imposing such burdens on those not (believed to be) guilty of crimes when doing so produces the best consequences. Such a practice would strike many as morally wrong, however. Thus the objection arises for consequentialists regardless of definitions.

Others have responded to the objection that consequentialism would allow for punishing the innocent by suggesting that scenarios such as McCloskey suggests are so far-fetched that they are unlikely to occur in the real world. In actual cases, punishing the innocent will rarely, if ever, produce the best consequences. For instance, some contend that the sheriff in the example would likely be found out, and as a result the public would lose its trust in law enforcement officials; the long-term consequences, therefore, would be worse than if the sheriff had not punished the innocent person. As critics have pointed out, however, this response only shows that punishing the innocent will usually be ruled out by consequentialism. There might still be cases, albeit rare, in which punishing the innocent would generate the best consequences (maybe the sheriff is adept at covering up his act). At best, then, consequentialism seems only able to ground a contingent prohibition on punishing the innocent. Some consequentialists have accepted this implication, albeit reluctantly (see Smart, 1973: 69-73).

A similar objection to consequentialist accounts is that they cannot provide a principled basis for the widely held intuition that punishment should be no more severe than an offender deserves (where desert is the product of the seriousness of the offense and the offender’s culpability). On this view, it is morally wrong to subject those guilty of relatively minor crimes to harsh punishment; such punishment would be excessive. For consequentialist accounts, though, it appears that excessively harsh sentences would be permitted (indeed, required) if they produced the best overall consequences.

Jeremy Bentham contended that consequentialism does have the resources to ground relative proportionality in sentencing—that is, lesser offenses should receive less severe sentences than more serious offenses receive. His reasoning was that if sentences for minor offenses were as harsh as for more serious offenses, potential offenders would have no incentive to commit the lesser offense rather than the more serious one (Bentham, 1789: 168). If Bentham is right, then there is a consequentialist basis for punishing shoplifters, for instance, less harshly than armed robbers. But this does not rule out punishing shoplifters harshly (more harshly than most of us would think justified) and punishing armed robbers even more harshly; again, a consequentialist would seem committed to such a sentencing scheme if it promoted the best overall consequences.

Defenders of consequentialist sentencing have another response available, namely that excessively harsh sentences do not, in practice, produce the best consequences. For instance, criminological research suggests a) that stiffer sentences do not produce significant deterrent effects (it is primarily the certainty of punishment rather than its severity that deters); b) that extremely long prison terms are not justified on incapacitative grounds (for one reason, most offenders “age out” of criminal behavior anyway by their 30s or 40s); and c) that extremely harsh sentences may, on balance, have criminogenic effects (that is, they may make people more likely to reoffend). This sort of response, of course, makes the prohibition of disproportionate punishment a contingent matter; in other words, if extremely harsh sentences did help to reduce crime and this produced, on balance, the best overall consequences, then consequentialism would appear to endorse such sentences. Critics thus charge that consequentialist accounts are unappealing insofar as they are unable to ground more than a contingent prohibition on disproportionately harsh punishment.

Even if we prohibit punishment of the innocent or disproportionate punishment of the guilty, a third, Kantian objection holds that consequentialist punishment is not properly responsive to the person being punished. According to this objection, to punish offenders as a means to securing some valuable social end (namely, crime reduction) is to use them as mere means, rather than respecting them as ends in themselves (Kant, 1797: 473; Murphy, 1973).

In response to this objection, some scholars have contended that although consequentialists regard punishment as a means to an end, punishment does not treat offenders as mere means to this end. If we limit punishment to those who have been found guilty of crimes, then this treatment is arguably responsive to their choices and does not use them as mere means. Kant himself suggested that as long as we reserve punishment only for those found guilty of crimes, then it is permissible to punish with an eye toward potential benefits (Kant, 1797: 473).

A more recent objection to consequentialist systems of punishment, developed by R. A. Duff (1986, 2001), charges that consequentialist systems of punishment, with their focus on crime reduction, treat offenders as dangerous “outsiders”—as the “they” whom “we,” the law-abiding members of society, must threaten, incapacitate, or remold to ensure our safety. Such a conception of the criminal law is inappropriately exclusionary, Duff claims. The criminal law, and the institution of punishment, in a liberal polity should treat offenders inclusively, as (still) members of the community who despite having violated its values could, and should, nevertheless (re)commit to these values.

In response, one might object that systems of punishment aimed at crime reduction need not be exclusionary in the way Duff suggests. In particular, punishment that aims to deter crime might be said to treat all community members equally, namely as potential offenders. For those who have not committed crimes, deterrent punishment regards them as potential offenders and aims to provide an incentive not to offend (that is, general deterrence). For those who have committed crimes, deterrent punishment similarly regards them as potential (re)offenders and aims to provide an incentive not to (re)offend (that is, specific deterrence). In this way, punishment with a deterrent aim might be said to speak to all community members in the same terms, and thus not to be objectionably exclusionary.

4. Retributivist Accounts

As we have seen, consequentialist accounts of punishment are essentially forward-looking—punishment is said to be justified in virtue of the consequences it helps to produce. A different sort of account regards punishment as justified not because of what it brings about, but instead because it is an intrinsically appropriate response to crime. Accounts of the second sort have traditionally been described as retributivist. In general, we can say that retributivism views punishment as justified because it is deserved, although particular accounts differ about what exactly this means.

Theorists have distinguished two varieties of retributivism: positive retributivism and negative retributivism. Positive retributivism is typically characterized as the view that an offender’s desert provides a positive justifying reason for punishment; in other words, the state should punish those who are found guilty of criminal wrongdoing because they deserve it. Negative retributivism, by contrast, provides a constraint on punishment: punishment is justified only of those who deserve it. Because negative retributivism provides only a constraint on punishment, not a positive reason to punish, the negative retributive constraint has featured prominently in attempts at mixed accounts of punishment; such accounts allow punishment for consequentialist aims as long as the punishment is only of those who deserve it. On the other hand, because negative retributivism does not provide a positive justifying reason to punish, some scholars argue that it does not properly count as retributivism at all.

The distinction between retributivism and consequentialism is not always a neat one. Notice that one might endorse the claim that punishment is a deserved response to wrongdoing and then further assert that it is a valuable state of affairs when wrongdoers get the punishment they deserve—a state of affairs that therefore should be promoted. On this type of account, retribution itself essentially becomes the consequentialist aim of punishment (Moore, 1903; Zaibert, 2006). Nevertheless, in keeping with general practice, this article will treat retributivism as distinct from, and in competition with, consequentialist accounts.

a. Deserved Suffering

One common version of retributivism contends simply that wrongdoers deserve to suffer in proportion to their wrongdoing. Often this claim is made by way of appeal to intuitions about particular, usually heinous crimes: surely the unrepentant war criminal, for example, who has tortured and murdered many innocent people, deserves to suffer for what he has done. Proponents argue that retributivism is justified because it best accounts for our intuitions about particular cases such as these (Moore, 1987; Kleinig, 1973).

Justifying retributivism requires more, of course, than merely appealing to common intuitions about such cases. After all, even if many (even most) people do feel, in hearing reports of terrible crimes, that the perpetrators deserve to suffer, not everyone feels this way. And even those who do have such intuitions may not feel entirely comfortable with them. What we would like to know is whether the intuitions themselves are justified, or whether, for instance, they amount to an unhealthy desire for vengeance. Critics contend that those who rely on our intuitions about particular cases as evidence that retributivism is justified fail to provide the needed explanation of why the intuitions are justified.

There are other questions for such a view: does any sort of moral wrongdoing deserve to be met with suffering, or only some cases of wrongdoing? Which ones? And why is meting out deserved suffering for wrongdoing properly the concern of the state?

b. Fair Play

Another prominent type of retributivist account begins with a conception of society as a cooperative venture in which each member benefits when there is general compliance with the rules governing the venture. Because each of us benefits when everyone else plays by the rules, fairness dictates that we each have an obligation to reciprocate by playing by the rules, too. A criminal, like other members of society, benefits from general compliance with laws, but she fails to reciprocate by complying with the laws herself. She essentially becomes a free rider, because she counts on others to play by the rules that she violates. By failing to restrain herself appropriately, she gains an unfair advantage over others in society. The justification of punishment is that it corrects this unfair advantage by inflicting burdens on the offender proportionate to the benefit she gained by committing her crime (Morris, 1968).

On the fair play view, then, punishment is justified as a deserved response to an unfair advantage taken against members of society generally. Such an account offers a relatively straightforward answer to the question of why punishment is the state’s business. The state has an interest in assuring those who accept the burdens of compliance with the law that they will not be at a disadvantage to those who would free-ride on the system.

Critics of the fair play view have argued that it provides a counterintuitive conception of the crime to which punishment responds. It seems strange, for instance, to think of the wrong perpetrated by, say, a rapist as a sort of free-riding wrong against society in general, rather than an egregious wrong perpetrated against the victim in particular. In response to this charge, Dagger (1993) argues that crimes may be wrong in both senses: they may wrong particular victims in various ways, but they are also in every case wrongs in the sense of free riding on society generally.

c. Censure

Another influential version of retributivism begins with the claim, discussed earlier, that one of punishment’s distinctive features is that it communicates censure, or condemnation, of the offender for her offense. This retributivist account, developed most notably by R. A. Duff (1986, 2001), takes the censuring feature as the key to establishing punishment’s moral permissibility. Offenders deserve to be censured for what they have done, and punishment is justified because it delivers this censuring message.

Duff understands crimes as public wrongs, as violations of important public values. It follows on this account that the state is the appropriate agent of punishment; the state properly calls offenders to account for their violations of the political community’s shared values.

Censuring involves, in part, urging an offender to think about the wrong she has done, to repent and (re)commit herself to the values that she has violated. Thus it follows from censure accounts such as Duff’s that offender self-reform is an aim of punishment. But notice the crucial distinction between this sort of account and the variety of consequentialist account that aims at offender reform. Although offender reform is an aim of punishment on the censure account, it is not a justifying aim. In other words, on the censure view, punishment is not justified insofar as it tends to promote offender reform. Rather, punishment is justified because it communicates deserved censure. Part of what it means to censure, however, is to urge wrongdoers to repent and reform.

A common critique of the censure view asks why punishment—that is, the imposition of intended burdens—is the proper way to censure wrongdoers. It seems that the polity could communicate messages of censure to offenders without imposing intended burdens; for example, it could issue a public proclamation condemning the crime and blaming the offender. Why, then, is the hard treatment characteristic of punishment an appropriate vehicle for conveying such messages? One type of response, offered by Duff and others (see also Falls, 1987), holds that hard treatment is needed to convey adequately the polity’s condemnation of crimes. Nonpunitive censure—blaming without imposing intended hard treatment—would fail to communicate the seriousness of the wrongdoing.

Also, on Duff’s account, hard treatment can function to induce in offenders the sort of moral reflection that may lead to repentance, reform, and reconciliation (with their victims and the community more generally). Some have objected, however, that such an account implies too intrusive a role for the state. It is not a proper function of the state, critics charge, to seek to induce repentance and moral reform in offenders. Thus even some scholars who agree that punishment is justified as a form of censure nevertheless disagree about the role of the hard treatment element. For Andrew von Hirsch (1993), for instance, the intended burdens characteristic of punishment act as a sort of prudential supplement: punishment, as censure, serves to remind offenders (and community members) of the moral reasons to comply with the law. Punishment, as hard treatment, also provides a prudential threat as a sort of supplement for those of us for whom the moral message is not sufficient. One worry with such an account, however, is whether the prudential threat will tend to drown out the moral message.

d. Other Versions

Alternative versions of retributivism have been offered. Some scholars, for instance, argue that those who commit crimes violate the trust of their fellow community members. Trust, on this account, is an essential feature of a healthy community. Offenders undermine this trust when they victimize others. In such cases, punishment is a deserved response to such violations and an appropriate way to help maintain (or restore) the conditions of trust among community members (see Dimock, 1997). Advocates of this trust-based variety of retributivism must explain which violations of trust rise to the level that warrants criminalization, so that violators should be subject to punishment. Also, we might question whether such accounts are purely retributivist after all: if punishment is justified at least in part as a means of helping to maintain conditions of trust in a community, then this appears to be a consequentialist rationale. On the other hand, if punishment is justified not for what it helps to bring about but rather as an intrinsically appropriate (because deserved) response to violations of trust, then we need an explanation of why such violations deserve punishment, perhaps as opposed to some other form of response.

Another form of retributivism holds that offenders incur a moral debt to their victims, and so they deserve punishment as a way to repay this debt (McDermott, 2001). This moral debt is distinct from the material debt that an offender may incur. In other words, a person who robs from another person incurs a material debt equal to the value of whatever was stolen, but she also incurs a moral debt for violating the victim’s rights. The offender takes not only a material good from the victim but also a moral good. Repayment of material goods does not settle this moral debt, and so punishment is needed to fill this role. As Daniel McDermott characterizes it, punishment serves to deny the ill-gotten moral good to the perpetrator  (McDermott, 2001: 424).

Such an account raises a host of questions: what precisely is the nature of the moral good that has been taken from the victim? How can a moral good be taken away from someone? In what sense (if at all) has the perpetrator gained this good? How does punishment deny this good to the offender, and how does this thereby make things right for the victim?

e. Sentencing

Because retributivism claims that punishment is justified as a deserved response to wrongdoing, retributivist accounts should provide some guidance about what sentences are deserved in particular cases. Typically, retributivists hold that sentences should be no more severe than is deserved. This negative retributivist constraint on sentencing corresponds with the negative retributivist constraint on punishment itself (namely, that punishment is justified only of those who deserve it). By contrast, positive retributivism holds that offenders’ sentences should be no less severe than they deserve. Some scholars find this positive retributivism unappealing because it seems to preclude the state from taking into account mercy or other considerations that might count in favor of lenient sentences. In other words, some are more comfortable with retributivism’s setting a ceiling but not a floor on sentence severity. One question, though, is whether (and if so, why) retributivists are justified in endorsing the negative retributivist constraint on sentencing without also endorsing the positive retributivist constraint.

Retributivists often discuss sentencing in terms of proportionality, where a proportionate sentence is understood as one that is deserved (or at least, on some accounts, not clearly undeserved). Sentences may be proportionate in two senses: first, they may be proportionate (or disproportionate) relative to each other. This sense of proportionality, called ordinal proportionality, holds that similarly serious offenses should receive similarly severe punishments (like cases should be treated alike); that more serious offenses should be punished more harshly than less serious offenses (murder should be punished more harshly than shoplifting, for instance); and that differences in sentence severity should reflect differences in relative seriousness of offenses (because murder is much more serious than shoplifting, murder should carry a much more severe sentence).

Some scholars have challenged the notion of ordinal proportionality constraints in sentencing, both because offenders cannot neatly be distinguished into a manageable number of desert-based groups—Michael Tonry calls this the “illusion of ‘like-situated offenders’” (Tonry, 2011)—and because individual offenders’ subjective experiences of the same sentence may vary greatly. For example, someone who is young, physically imposing, or has no children may have a much different experience of a 10-year prison term from someone who is much older, physically frail, or must leave behind her children to serve the sentence. Considerations such as these do not in themselves demonstrate that the tenets of ordinal proportionality are false (that like cases should not be treated alike, for instance, or that more serious violations should not receive harsher sentences). Rather, these considerations raise challenges to our ability in practice to implement a just sentencing scheme that reflects ordinal proportionality.

Even if sentences can be devised that satisfy ordinal proportionality, however—in other words, even if a sentencing scheme itself is internally proportionate—particular sentences may fail to be proportionate if the entire sentencing scheme is too severe (or lenient). For instance, a sentencing scheme in which even the least offenses were punished with prison terms would appear disproportionate even if sentences in the scheme were proportionate relative to each other. Thus theorists note a second sense of proportionality: cardinal, or nonrelative, proportionality. Cardinal proportionality considers whether sentences are commensurate with the crimes they punish. A prison term for jaywalking would appear to violate cardinal proportionality, because such a sentence strikes us as too severe given the offense, even if this sentence were proportionate with other sentences in a sentencing scheme—that is, even if it satisfied ordinal proportionality. Thus cardinal proportionality concerns not the relation of sentences to one another, but instead the relation of a sentence to the crime to which it is a response. Put another way, even if an entire sentencing scheme is internally (ordinally) proportionate, we need guidance in how to anchor the sentencing scheme to the crimes themselves so that offenders in particular cases receive the sentences they deserve.

In addition to addressing questions of deserved sentence severity, we would like retributivism to provide some guidance about how to determine what mode, or form, of punishment is appropriate in response to a given crime. Is prison time, community service, capital punishment, probation, or something else the deserved form of response, and why?

The implications of retributivism for sentencing will depend on the specific account’s explanation of why punishment is said to be the deserved response to offending.

Those who appeal to intuitions that the guilty deserve to suffer, for instance, can similarly appeal to intuitions that those who are guilty of more serious offenses deserve to suffer more than those who are guilty of less serious offenses. As discussed, however, we would like to know how much punishment is deserved in particular cases in nonrelative terms, and also what form the suffering should take. One well-known account of sentencing is provided by lex talionis (that is, an eye for an eye, a tooth for a tooth). Immanuel Kant famously endorsed this principle: “Accordingly, whatever undeserved evil you inflict upon another within the people, that you inflict upon yourself” (Kant, 1797: 473). As critics have noted, though, not every crime appears to have an obvious like-for-like response—what would lex talionis demand for the childless kidnapper, for instance (Shafer-Landau, 2000: 193)? And even when a like-for-like response is clearly indicated, it will not always be palatable (torturing the torturer, for example).

We might assert instead that the sentence and the offense need not be alike in kind, but that the sentence should impose an amount of suffering equal to the harm done by the offender. Still, questions arise of how to make interpersonal comparisons of suffering. And again, for the most heinous crimes, a principle of inflicting equal amounts of suffering may recommend sentences that we would find troubling.

The fair play view holds that punishment functions to remove an unfair advantage gained by an offender relative to members of society generally. Critics of this view often object, however, that it provides insufficient or counterintuitive guidance about sentencing. Put simply, there does not seem to be any advantage that an offender gains, in proportion with the seriousness of her crime, relative to community members generally. On one version of the view, the offender gains freedom from the burden of self-constraint that others accept in complying with the particular law that the offender violates. If so, then the sentence severity should be proportionate to the burden others feel in complying with that law. But compliance with laws is often not a burden for most citizens. Indeed, it is often less burdensome to comply with prohibitions on serious offenses (murder, assault, and so forth) than it is to comply with prohibitions on lesser crimes (tax evasion, jaywalking, and so forth), given that we are more often tempted to commit the lesser crimes. But if the unfair advantage that punishment aims to remove is freedom from the burden of self-constraint, and if self-constraint is often more burdensome with lesser crimes, then these less serious crimes will often appear to merit relatively more severe punishments. This is a violation of ordinal proportionality.

Similar problems arise for other versions of the fair play view. Suppose, for instance, that the unfair advantage a criminal gains is not freedom from the burden of complying with the particular law she violates, but rather freedom from complying with the rule of law in general. This general compliance, Richard Dagger writes, is a genuine burden: “there are times for almost all of us when we would like to have the best of both worlds—that is, the freedom we enjoy under the rule of law plus freedom from the burden of obeying laws” (Dagger, 1993: 483). Critics have objected, however, that on this conception of the unfair advantage all offenses become, for the purposes of punishment, the same offense. Both the murderer’s and the tax cheat’s unfair advantage is freedom from compliance with the rule of law generally. If the unfair advantage is the same, however, then removing the advantage would seem to require equal sentences. Again, such sentencing appears to violate ordinal proportionality.

For the censure view, questions arise about what form of punishment and what severity will communicate the deserved message of condemnation in particular cases. On such a view, the principles of ordinal proportionality appear to follow straightforwardly: censure should reflect the seriousness of the wrongdoing, and so if punishment is the vehicle of communicating censure, then sentences should reflect the appropriate relative degree of censure for each case.

The censure view should provide guidance not only about how severely to punish crimes relative to each other, but also how severely to punish in absolute terms, and also the appropriate mode of punishment. To say that manslaughter should be censured more severely than theft, for instance, does not actually tell us how severely to censure manslaughter or theft, or with what form of punishment. Again, the challenge is in determining how to anchor the sentencing scale to actual offenses. Should the least serious offenses receive censure in the form of a small fine, a day in jail, or a year in jail? Should the most serious offenses receive capital punishment, life imprisonment, or some less severe sentence?

Similar questions arise for accounts that characterize punishment as a deserved response to violations of trust, or as a deserved response to the incurrence of a moral debt. What form and severity of punishment is appropriate to maintain conditions of community trust in response to attempted kidnapping, or the theft of a valuable piece of art? How severe must a sentence be to resolve the moral debt that is incurred when one impersonates a police officer, or cheats on her taxes?

Indeed, questions about fixing deserved sentences in response to particular offenses arise for retributivist accounts generally. Critics have charged that retributivism is unable to provide adequate, nonarbitrary guidance about either the deserved severity or deserved form of punishment in particular cases (see Shafer-Landau, 2000).

Retributivists are, of course, aware of such objections and have sought to meet them in various ways. Nonetheless, questions about proportionate sentencing continue to be a central challenge for retributivist accounts.

5. Alternative Accounts

In part as a response to objections commonly raised against consequentialist or retributivist views, a number of theorists have sought to develop alternative accounts of punishment.

a. Rights Forfeiture

At the outset, we said that the central question of punishment’s permissibility is why (if at all) it is permissible to treat those who have committed criminal offenses in ways that typically would be impermissible. For some theorists, this question is best cast in terms of rights: why are the sorts of intended burdens characteristic of punishment, which would constitute rights violations if imposed on those who have not been convicted of criminal wrongdoing, not violations of the rights of those punished?

One way in which punishment would not violate the rights of offenders is if, in committing the crime for which they are convicted, they forfeit the relevant right(s). Because offenders forfeit their right not to be punished, the state has no corresponding duty not to punish them. As W. D. Ross writes, “the offender, by violating the life or liberty or property of another, has lost his own right to have his life, liberty, or property respected, so that the state has no prima facie duty to spare him, as it has a prima facie duty to spare the innocent” (1930: 60-61).

Notice that the forfeiture view itself does not imply any particular positive justification of punishment; it merely purports to explain why punishing offenders does not violate their rights. This is consistent with maintaining that the positive justification of punishment is that it helps reduce crime, or conversely, that wrongdoers deserve to be punished. Thus the forfeiture view does not provide a complete account of the justification of punishment. Proponents, however, take this feature to be a virtue rather than a weakness of the view.

The forfeiture claim raises a number of key questions: first, why does someone who violates the law thereby forfeit the right not to be punished? For those who are gripped by the dilemma of why punishing offenders does not violate their rights, the mere answer that offenders forfeit their rights, without some deeper account of what this forfeiture amounts to, may seem inadequate. Thus some theorists attempt to ground their forfeiture claim in a more comprehensive moral or political theory (see, for instance, Morris, 1991).

Second, what is the nature of the rights forfeited? Do offenders forfeit the same rights they violate? If so, then this raises some of the same challenges as we saw with certain forms of retributivism: what right is forfeited by a childless kidnapper, for example? Alternatively, is the forfeited right simply the right not to be punished? If every offender forfeits this same, general right, then on what basis can we distinguish what sentence is permissible for different offenders? For example, if the burglar forfeits the same right as the murderer, then what prevents us from imposing the same punishment in each case (could two offenders forfeit the same right to different degrees, as some have suggested)?

Third, how should we determine the duration of the forfeiture? Fourth, if an offender forfeits her right against punishment, then why does the state maintain an exclusive right to punish? Why are other individuals not permitted to punish?

b. Consent

Rights forfeiture theorists argue that punishment does not violate offenders’ rights because offenders forfeit the relevant rights. Another way that punishment might be said not to violate offenders’ rights is if offenders waive their rights. This is the central claim of the consent view. Defended most notably by C. S. Nino (1983), the consent view holds that when a person voluntarily commits a crime while knowing the consequences of doing so, she effectively consents to these consequences. In doing so, she waives her right not to be subject to punishment. This is not to say that she explicitly consents to being punished, but rather that by her voluntary action she tacitly consents to be subject to what she knows are the consequences.

Like the forfeiture view, the consent view does not supply a positive justification for punishment. To say that a person consents to some treatment does not by itself provide us with a reason to treat her that way. So the consent view, like the forfeiture view, is compatible with consequentialist aims or with the claim that punishment is a deserved response to offending.

One challenge for the consent view is that it does not seem to justify punishment of offenders who do not know that their acts are subject to punishment. For someone to have consented to be subject to certain consequences of an act, she must know of these consequences. What’s more, even if an offender knows she is committing a punishable act, she might not know the extent of the punishment to which she is subject. If so, then it is not clear how she can be said to consent to her punishment. It is not clear, for example, that a robber who knows that robbery is a punishable offense but does not realize the severity of the punishment to which she will be subject thereby consents to her sentence.

By contrast, other critics have charged that the consent view cannot rule out sentences that most of us would find excessive. This is because a person who voluntarily commits an action with knowledge of the legal consequences, whatever these consequences happen to be, has consented to be subject to the consequences. As Larry Alexander has put it: “If the law imposes capital punishment for overparking, then one who voluntarily overparks ‘consents’ to be executed” (Alexander, 1986).

Another difficulty for the consent view is that tacit consent typically can be overridden by explicit denials of consent. Thus it would seem to follow that one who tacitly consents to be subject to punishment could override this tacit consent by explicitly denying that she consents. But of course, we do not think that an offender should be able to avoid punishment by explicitly refusing to consent to it (Boonin, 2008).

c. Self-Defense

Another proposed justification of punishment conceives of punishment as a form of societal self-defense. First consider self-defense in the interpersonal context: When an assailant attacks me, he culpably creates a situation in which harm will occur: either harm to me if I do not effectively defend myself or harm to him if I do. In such a circumstance, I am justified in acting so that the harm falls on my attacker rather than on me. Similarly, when an offender creates a situation in which either she or her victim will be harmed, the state is permitted to use force to ensure that the harm falls on the perpetrator rather than on the victim (Montague, 1995).

So far, this view appears to justify state intervention only to stop ongoing crimes or ward off impending crimes. How does this view justify punishment as a response to past crimes? Advocates of the view claim that the state is not only justified in intervening to stop actual offenses; it is also permitted to threaten the use of force to deter such crimes. For the threat to be credible and thus effective as a deterrent, however, the state will need to follow through on the threat in cases in which offenders are not deterred. Thus punishment of offenders is permissible.

Notice that although the self-defense account views punishment as a deterrent threat, it is not a pure consequentialist account. Crucial to punishment’s permissibility on the self-defense view is the claim that an offender has culpably created the circumstance in which harm will fall either on the perpetrator or the victim. This backward-looking element is missing from pure consequentialist accounts that cite punishment’s deterrent effects in defending the practice.

Critics object that the analogy between self-defense and punishment breaks down in a number of respects. First, many self-defense theorists argue that the logic of defensive force permits the use of such force even against “innocent” threats. But we do not typically believe that, by analogy, punishment of innocent people is permitted, even if such punishment helped to maintain the credibility of a deterrent threat. Second, the degree of force that is permitted to stop an actual attack may far exceed what we intuitively believe would be permitted as punishment of an offense that has already been committed.

Third, it is one thing to follow through on a threat in order to deter the person who has just offended from offending again. It is another thing—and one might argue, more difficult to justify—to punish one person in order to maintain a credible deterrent threat against the public generally. If we believe the primary deterrent effect of punishment is as a general deterrent (rather than as a specific deterrent), then the analogy with typical accounts of self-defense seems strained. It would be as if, to deter the oncoming assailant from following through with his attack, I grab someone nearby (who has previously attacked me) and inflict the same degree of harm that I would aim to inflict on the assailant to defend myself. This might, of course, be permissible if my previous attacker had thereby acquired a duty to protect me from future harm by allowing himself to be punished as a means of maintaining a credible deterrent threat (Tadros, 2011).

d. Moral Education

The moral education view shares certain features of consequentialist accounts as well as retributivist accounts. On this view, punishment is justified as a means of teaching a moral lesson to those who commit crimes (and perhaps to community members more generally, as well).

Like standard consequentialist accounts, the education view acknowledges that part of the story of punishment’s justification involves its importance in reducing crime. But the education theorist also takes seriously the worry expressed by many retributivists that aiming to shape people’s behavior merely by issuing threats is, in G. W. F. Hegel’s words, “much the same as when one raises a cane against a dog; a man is not treated in accordance with his dignity and honour, but as a dog” (Hegel, 1821: 36). By contrast, a central feature of the moral education view is that those who commit crimes are moral agents, capable of reflecting on and responding to moral reasons. Thus moral education theorists view punishment not as a means of conditioning people to behave in certain ways, but rather of “teaching the wrongdoer that the action she did (or wants to do) is forbidden because it is morally wrong and should not be done for that reason” (Hampton, 1984).

Another way to express this difference between the education view and standard consequentialist views is that consequentialist views focus entirely on whether punishment promotes some goal. The education view, however, holds that only certain means are appropriate for pursuing this goal: namely, punishment aims to engage with the offender as a moral agent, to teach her that (and why) her behavior was morally wrong, so that she will reform herself. Thus we can even distinguish the education view from consequentialist accounts that aim at crime reduction through offender reform. For such consequentialist accounts, punishment’s justification is solely a matter of whether, on balance, it promotes these ends. The education view sets offender reform as an end, but it also grounds certain constraints on how we may appropriately pursue this end.

The education view, like the retributive censure view discussed earlier, views punishment as a communicative enterprise. Punishment communicates to offenders (indeed, to the community more generally) that what they have done is wrong. Thus on both accounts, punishment aims to encourage offenders to reform themselves. But whereas the retributive censure theorists view the message conveyed by punishment as justified insofar as it is deserved, education theorists contend that punishment is justified in virtue of what it aims to accomplish. In this respect, the education view sits more comfortably with standard consequentialist accounts than with retributivist views.

The education view conceives of punishment as aiming to confer a benefit on the offender, the benefit of moral education. This is not to say that punishment is not burdensome; as we have seen, its burdensomeness is an essential feature of punishment. But the burdens of punishment are intended to be ultimately beneficial. Thus education theorists roundly reject accounts according to which it is permissible (or even required) to inflict harm on those guilty of wrongdoing. Instead, education theorists hold, following Plato, that we should never do harm to anyone, even those who have wronged us.

Critics have raised various objections to the moral education view. Some are skeptical about whether punishment is the most effective means of moral education. Others point out that many (perhaps most) offenders are not apparently in need of moral education: many offenders realize they are doing something wrong but do so anyway. Even those who do not realize this as they are acting may recognize it soon afterward. Thus they do not seem to need moral education. Finally, some object that the education view is inappropriately paternalistic. According to the education view, after all, the state is justified in coercively restricting offenders’ liberties as a means to conferring a benefit (moral education) on them. Many liberal theorists are uncomfortable, however, with the idea that the state may coerce a person for her own benefit.

e. Hybrid Approaches

Finally, some theorists have responded to seemingly intractable disputes between consequentialists and retributivists by contending that the question of punishment’s permissibility is not actually a single question at all. Instead, establishing punishment’s permissibility involves answering a number of questions: questions about the aim of the practice, about its limits, and so on. Once we distinguish different questions that bear on punishment’s permissibility, we can then recognize that these questions may be answered by appeal to different moral considerations. What emerges is a hybrid account of punishment’s permissibility.

The most famous articulation of a hybrid view comes from H. L. A. Hart (1968), although there have been numerous attempts to develop such accounts both before and after Hart. The specifics of these accounts vary somewhat, but in general the point has been to distinguish the question of punishment’s aim (Hart called this the “general justifying aim”) from the question of how we must constrain our pursuit of that aim. The first question, about punishment’s aim, is usually answered according to consequentialist considerations, whereas the second question, about appropriate constraints, is typically answered by appeal to retributivist principles. In other words, if we are asking what reason could justify society in maintaining a system of punishment, the answer will appeal to punishment’s role in reducing crime, and thereby protecting the safety and security of community members. But if we ask how we may punish in particular cases, the answer will appeal to retributivist principles about proportionality and desert. Some have distinguished these questions in terms of the proper (consequentialist) rationale of legislators in criminalizing certain types of behaviors and the proper (retributivist) rationale of judges in imposing sentences on those who violate the criminal laws.

Although such views are sometimes described as “two-question” or “two-level” views, with the focus on consequentialist aims and retributivist constraints, there is no reason in principle why we should distinguish only two questions. As we saw earlier, punishment actually raises a host of specific normative questions, and so if we accept the general strategy of distinguishing questions and answering them by appeal to different considerations, then there is no reason in principle to stop with only a two-level hybrid theory. A hybrid view might offer distinct considerations in answer to a variety of questions: what is the positive aim of punishment? Does punishment violate offenders’ rights? How severely may we punish in particular cases? What mode of punishment is permissible in particular cases? And so on.

Also, although hybrid theories typically follow the pattern of aims and constraints, so that consequentialism provides the reason to have an institution of punishment and retributivism provides constraints on how we punish, there is no reason in principle why this could not be reversed. A hybrid theory might hold that suffering is an intrinsically appropriate (deserved) response to wrongdoing, but then endorse as a constraint, for example, that such retributive punishment should never tend to undermine offender reform.

Critics have charged hybrid accounts with being ad hoc and unstable. Although we can distinguish different questions related to punishment’s permissibility, it is a mistake to think that the answers to these questions are entirely independent of each other, so that we can answer each by appeal to entirely distinct considerations. For example, if we accept the consequentialist view that punishment’s general justifying aim is that it helps to deter crime, then why would considerations of deterrence not also play a role (even a decisive role) in how severely we punish in particular cases? Why should retributivist proportionality considerations govern in sentencing if these conflict with the pursuit of crime reduction through deterrence?

Retributivists, for their part, often argue that hybrid theories such as Hart’s, on which consequentialism supplies the justifying aim of punishment, relegate retributivism to a peripheral role. Retributivists, after all, tend to regard consequentialism as providing inappropriate reasons to punish. Characterizing retributivism’s role as providing constraints on the pursuit of consequentialist aims is thus unsatisfying to many retributivists.

6. Abolitionism

Some scholars are unpersuaded by any of the standardly articulated justifications of punishment. In fact, they conclude that punishment is morally unjustified, and thus that the practice should be abolished. An obvious question for abolitionists, of course, is what (if anything) should take the place of punishment. That is, how should society respond to those who behave in ways (committing tax fraud, burglary, assault, and so on) that currently are subject to punishment?

One option would be to endorse a model of treatment rather than punishment. On this model, an offender is viewed as manifesting some form of disease or pathology, and the appropriate response is thus to try to treat and cure the person rather than to punish her. Treatment differs from punishment, first, because it need not be burdensome. At least in principle, treatment could be pleasant. In practice, of course, treatment may often be burdensome—indeed, it may involve many of the same sorts of restrictions and burdens as we find with punishment. But even though courses of treatment may be burdensome, treatment does not typically convey the condemnation that is characteristic of punishment. After all, we generally think of those who are sick as warranting sympathy or concern, not condemnation.

Other options for abolitionists would be to endorse some model of restitutive or restorative, rather than criminal, justice. We might require that offenders make restitution to their victims, as defendants in civil lawsuits are often required to make restitution to plaintiffs (Boonin, 2008: 213-75). Or offenders might engage with victims in a process of restorative justice, one in which both offenders and victims play an active role, with aims of repairing the harms done and restoring the relationships that have been damaged (Braithwaite, 1999). Neither the restitutive nor the restorative models are centrally concerned with imposing intended, censuring burdens on offenders.

Not surprisingly, these alternative accounts are themselves subject to various objections. Critics of the treatment model, for instance, charge that it provides insufficient limits on what sort of treatment of offenders is permissible. The aim of “curing” diseased individuals might warrant quite severe treatment, both in scope and duration. Similarly, scholars have argued that the treatment model fails properly to respect offenders, as it treats them merely as patients rather than as moral agents who are responsible, and should be held responsible, for their actions (Morris, 1968).

Critics of the restitutive and restorative models may point out that some crimes do not clearly lend themselves to restitution or restoration: some crimes may seem so heinous that no victim restitution or restoration of relationships is possible. Other crimes do not have clearly specifiable victims. In addition, consequentialists may worry that practices of restitution or restoration may be inadequate as means of crime reduction if, for example, they are less effective than punishment at deterring potential offenders. Retributivists also may argue that something important is lost when we respond to wrongdoing solely with restitutive or restorative practices. Particularly for those who hold that an important function of punishment is to convey societal censure, restitution or restoration may seem inadequate as responses to crime insofar as they are not essentially concerned with censuring offenders. Alternatively, some retributivists argue that the restorative ideals can best be served by a system of retributive punishment (Duff, 2001; Bennett, 2008).

7. References and Further Reading

  • Alexander, Larry (1986). “Consent, Punishment, and Proportionality.” Philosophy & Public Affairs 15:2, 178-82.
  • Bennett, Christopher (2008). The Apology Ritual: A Philosophical Theory of Punishment. Cambridge, Cambridge University Press.
  • Bentham, Jeremy (1789). An Introduction to the Principles of Morals and Legislation. Reprinted in J. H. Burns and H. L. A. Hart (eds.), The Collected Works of Jeremy Bentham: An Introduction to the Principles of Morals and Legislation. Oxford, Clarendon Press, 1996.
  • Boonin, David (2008). The Problem of Punishment. New York, Cambridge University Press.
  • Braithwaite, John (1999). “Restorative Justice: Assessing Optimistic and Pessimistic Accounts.” Crime and Justice 25, 1-127.
  • Cullen, Francis T. (2013). “Rehabilitation: Beyond Nothing Works.” Crime and Justice 42:1, 299-376.
  • Dagger, Richard (1993). “Playing Fair with Punishment.” Ethics 103, 473-88.
  • Dimock, Susan (1997). “Retributivism and Trust.” Law and Philosophy 16:1, 37-62.
  • Dolovich, Sharon (2009). “Cruelty, Prison Conditions, and the Eighth Amendment.” New York University Law Review 84:4, 881-979.
  • Duff, R. A. (2001). Punishment, Communication, and Community. Oxford, Oxford University Press.
  • Duff, R. A. (1986). Trials and Punishments. Cambridge, Cambridge University Press.
  • Falls, M. Margaret (1987). “Retribution, Reciprocity, and Respect for Persons.” Law and Philosophy 6, 25-51.
  • Feinberg, Joel (1965). “The Expressive Function of Punishment.” Monist 49:3, 397-423.
  • Goldman, Alan (1979). “The Paradox of Punishment.” Philosophy & Public Affairs 9:1, 42-58.
  • Hampton, Jean (1984). “The Moral Education Theory of Punishment.” Philosophy & Public Affairs 13, 208-38.
  • Hart, H. L. A. (1968). Punishment and Responsibility: Essays in the Philosophy of Law. New York, Oxford University Press.
  • Hegel, G. W. F. (1821). Philosophy of Right. Trans. S. W. Dyde. Reprinted by Dover Philosophical Classics, 2005.
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Author Information

Zachary Hoskins
University of Nottingham
United Kingdom

Categories: Ethics