Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Mathematical Structuralism

The theme of mathematical structuralism is that what matters to a mathematical theory is not the internal nature of its objects, such as its numbers, functions, sets, or points, but how those objects relate to each other. In a sense, the thesis is that mathematical objects (if there are such objects) simply have no intrinsic nature. The structuralist theme grew most notably from developments within mathematics toward the end of the nineteenth century and on through to the present, particularly, but not exclusively, in the program of providing a categorical foundation to mathematics.

Philosophically, there are a variety of competing ways to articulate the structuralist theme. These invoke various ontological and epistemic themes. This article begins with an overview of the underlying idea, and then proceeds to the major versions of the view found in the philosophical literature. On the metaphysical front, the most pressing question is whether there are or can be “incomplete” objects that have no intrinsic nature, or whether structuralism requires a rejection of the existence of mathematical objects altogether. Each of these options yields distinctive epistemic questions concerning how mathematics is known.

There are ontologically robust versions of structuralism, philosophical theories that postulate a vast ontology of structures and their places; on the other hand, there are versions of structuralism amenable to those who prefer desert landscapes, denying the existence of distinctively mathematical objects altogether; and also there are versions of structuralism in between those two—postulating an ontology for mathematics, but not a specific realm of structures. The article sketches the various strengths of each option and the challenges posed for them.

Table of Contents

  1. The Main Idea
  2. Taking on the Metaphysics: The Ante Rem Approach
  3. Getting by without Ontology: Structuralism without (Ante Rem) Structures
  4. References and Further Reading

1. The Main Idea

David Hilbert’s Grundlagen der Geometrie [1899] represents the culmination of a trend toward structuralism within mathematics.  That book gives what, with some hindsight, we might call implicit definitions of geometric notions, characterizing them in terms of the relations they bear to each other.  The early pages contain phrases such as “the axioms of this group define the idea expressed by the word ‘between’ . . .” and “the axioms of this group define the notion of congruence or motion.”  The idea is summed up as follows:

We think of . . . points, straight lines, and planes as having certain mutual relations, which we indicate by means of such words as “are situated,” “between,” “parallel,” “congruent,” “continuous,” etc.  The complete and exact description of these relations follows as a consequence of the axioms of geometry.

Hilbert also remarks that the axioms express “certain related fundamental facts of our intuition,” but in the book—in the mathematical development itself—all that remains of the intuitive content are the diagrams that accompany some of the theorems.

Mathematical structuralism is similar, in some ways, to functionalist views in, for example, philosophy of mind.  A functional definition is, in effect, a structural one, since it, too, focuses on relations that the defined items have to each other.  The difference is that mathematical structures are more abstract, and free-standing, in the sense that there are no restrictions on the kind of things that can exemplify them (see Shapiro [1997, Chapter 3, §6]).

There are several different, and mutually incompatible, philosophical ideas that can underlie and motivate mathematical structuralism.  Some philosophers postulate an ontology of structures, and claim that the subject matter of a given branch of mathematics is a particular structure, or a class of structures.  An advocate of a view like this would articulate what a structure is, and then say something about the metaphysical nature of structures, and how they and their properties can become known.  Other structuralist views deny the existence of structures, and develop the underlying theme in other ways.

Let us define a system to be collection of objects together with certain relations on those objects.  For example, an extended family is a system of people under certain blood and marital relations—father, aunt, great niece, son-in-law, and so forth.  A work of music is a collection of notes under certain temporal and other musical relations.  To get closer to mathematics, define a natural number system to be a countably infinite collection of objects with a designated initial object, a one-to-one successor relation that satisfies the principle of mathematical induction and the other axioms of arithmetic.  Examples of natural number systems are the Arabic numerals in their natural order, an infinite sequence of distinct moments of time in temporal order, the strings on a finite (or countable) alphabet arranged in lexical order, and, perhaps, the natural numbers themselves.

To bring Hilbert [1899] into the fold, define a Euclidean system to be three collections of objects, one to be called “points,” a second to be called “lines,” and a third to be called “planes,” along with certain relations between them, such that the axioms are true of those objects and relations, so construed.  Otto Blumenthal reports that in a discussion in a Berlin train station in 1891, Hilbert said that in a proper axiomatization of geometry, “one must always be able to say, instead of ‘points, straight lines, and planes’, ‘tables, chairs, and beer mugs’” (“Lebensgeschichte” in Hilbert [1935, 388-429]; the story is related on p. 403).  In a much-discussed correspondence with Gottlob Frege, Hilbert wrote (see Frege [1976], [1980]):

Every theory is only a scaffolding or schema of concepts together with their necessary relations to one another, and that the basic elements can be thought of in any way one likes.  If in speaking of my points, I think of some system of things, e.g., the system love, law, chimney-sweep . . . and then assume all my axioms as relations between these things, then my propositions, e.g., Pythagoras’ theorem, are also valid for these things . . . [A]ny theory can always be applied to infinitely many systems of basic elements.

A structure is the abstract form of a system, which ignores or abstracts away from any features of the objects that do not bear on the relations.  So, the natural number structure is the form common to all of the natural number systems.  And this structure is the subject matter of arithmetic.  The Euclidean-space-structure is the form common to all Euclidean systems.  The theme of structuralism is that, in general, the subject matter of a branch of mathematics is a given structure or a class of related structures—such as all algebraically closed fields.

A structure is thus a “one over many,” a sort of universal.  The difference between a structure and a more traditional universal, such as a property, is that a property applies to, or holds of, individual objects, while a structure applies to, or holds of, systems.  Structures are thus much like structural universals, whose existence remains subject to debate among metaphysicians (see, for example, Lewis [1986], Armstrong [1986], Pagès [2002])).  Indeed, one might think of a mathematical structure as a sort of free-standing structural universal, one in which the nature of the individual objects that fill the places of the structure, is irrelevant (see Shapiro [2008, §4]).

Any of the usual array of philosophical views on universals can be adapted to structures.  One can be a Platonic ante rem realist, holding that each structure exists and has its properties independent of any systems that have that structure.  On this view, structures exist objectively, and are ontologically prior to any systems that have them (or at least ontologically independent of such systems).  Or one can be an Aristotelian in re realist, holding that structures exist, but insisting that they are ontologically posterior to the systems that instantiate them.  Destroy all the natural number systems and, alas, you have destroyed the natural number structure itself.  A third option is to deny that structures exist at all.  Talk of structures is just a convenient shorthand for talk of systems that have a certain similarity.

In a retrospective article, Paul Bernays [1967, 497] provides a way to articulate the latter sort of view:

A main feature of Hilbert’s axiomatization of geometry is that the axiomatic method is presented and practiced in the spirit of the abstract conception of mathematics that arose at the end of the nineteenth century and which has generally been adopted in modern mathematics.  It consists in abstracting from the intuitive meaning of the terms . . . and in understanding the assertions (theorems) of the axiomatized theory in a hypothetical sense, that is, as holding true for any interpretation . . . for which the axioms are satisfied.  Thus, an axiom system is regarded not as a system of statements about a subject matter but as a system of conditions for what might be called a relational structure . . . [On] this conception of axiomatics, . . . logical reasoning on the basis of the axioms is used not merely as a means of assisting intuition in the study of spatial figures; rather, logical dependencies are considered for their own sake, and it is insisted that in reasoning we should rely only on those properties of a figure that either are explicitly assumed or follow logically from the assumptions and axioms.

Advocates of these different ontological positions concerning structures take different approaches to other central philosophical concerns, such as epistemology, semantics, and methodology.  Each such view has it relatively easy for some issues and finds deep, perhaps intractable problems with others.  The ante rem realist, for example, has a straightforward account of reference and semantics:  the variables of a branch of mathematics, like arithmetic, analysis, and set theory, range over the places in an ante rem structure.  Each singular term denotes one such place.  So the language is understood at face value.  But the ante rem realist must account for how one obtains knowledge of structures, so construed, and she must account for how statements about ante rem structures play a role in scientific theories of the physical world.  As suggested by the above Bernays passage, the nominalistic, eliminative structuralist has it easier on epistemology.  Knowing a truth of, say, real analysis, is knowing what follows from the description of the theory.   But this sort of structuralist must account for the semantics of the reconstrued statements, how they are known, how they figure in science, and so forth.

2. Taking on the Metaphysics: The Ante Rem Approach

To repeat, the ante rem structuralist holds that, say, the natural number structure and the Euclidean space structure exist objectively, independent of the mathematician, her form of life, and so forth, and also independent of whether the structures are exemplified in the non-mathematical realm.  That is what makes them ante rem.  The semantics of the respective languages is straightforward:  The first-order variables range over the places in the respective structure, and a singular term such as ‘0’ denotes a particular place in the structure.

So, on this view, the statements of a mathematical theory are to be read at face value.  The grammatical structure of the mathematical language reflects the underlying logical form of the propositions.  For example, in the arithmetic equation, 3×8=24, the numerals ‘3’, ‘8’, and ‘24’, at least seem to be singular terms—proper names.  On the ante rem view, they are singular terms.  The role of a singular term is to denote an individual object.  On the ante rem view, these numerals denote places in the natural number structure.  And, of course, the equation expresses a truth about that structure.  In this respect, then, ante rem structuralism is a variation on traditional Platonism.

For this perspective to make sense, however, one has to think of a place in a structure as a bona fide object, the sort of thing that can be denoted by a singular term, and the sort of thing that can be in the range of first-order variables.  To pursue the foregoing analogy with universals, a place in a structure is akin to a role or an office, one that can be occupied by different people or things.  So, the idea here is to construe an office as an object in its own right, at least with respect to the structure.

There is, of course, an intuitive difference between an object and a place in a structure, between an office-holder and an office.  Indeed, the ante rem view depends on that very distinction, in order to characterize structures in the first place (in terms of systems).  Yet, we also think of the places in ante rem structures as objects in their own right.

This is made coherent by highlighting and enforcing a distinction in linguistic practice.  It is a matter of keeping track of what we are talking about at any given time.  There are two different orientations involved in discussing structures and their places.  First, a structure, including its places, can be discussed in the context of systems that exemplify the structure.  For example, one might say that the current vice president used to be a senator, or that the white king’s bishop in one game was the white queen’s bishop in another game.  For a more mathematical example, in the system of Arabic numerals, the symbol ‘2’ plays the two-role (if we think of the structure as starting with one), while in the system of roman numerals, the string ‘II’ plays that role.  Call this the places-are-offices perspective.  This office-orientation presupposes a background ontology that supplies objects that fill the places of the structures.  In the case of political systems, the background ontology is people (who have met certain criteria, such as being of a certain age and being duly elected); in the case of chess games, the background ontology is small, moveable objects—pieces with certain colors and shapes.  In the case of arithmetic, anything at all can be used as the background ontology: anything at all can play the two-role in a natural number system.  This is what is meant by saying that mathematical structures, like this one, are “free-standing”.

In contrast to the places-are-offices perspective, there are contexts in which the places of a given structure are treated as objects in their own right.  We say that the vice president presides over the senate, and that a bishop that is on a black square cannot move to a white square, without intending to speak about any particular vice president or chess piece.  Such statements are about the roles themselves.  Call this the places-are-objects perspective.  Here, the statements are about the respective structure as such, independent of any exemplifications it may have.  The ante rem structuralist proposes that we think of typical statements in pure mathematics as made in the places-are-objects mode.  This includes such simple equations as 3×8=24, and more sophisticated statements, for example, that there are infinitely many prime numbers.

To be sure, one can think of statements in the places-are-objects mode as simply generalizations over all systems that exemplify the structure.  This is consonant with the above passage from Bernays [1967], suggesting that we understand “the assertions (theorems) of [an] axiomatized theory in a hypothetical sense, that is, as holding true for any interpretation . . . for which the axioms are satisfied.” However, the ante rem structuralist takes the mathematical statements, in places-are-objects mode, as being about the structure itself.  Indeed, on that view, the structure exists, and so we can talk about its places directly.

So, for the ante rem structuralist, in the places-are-offices mode, singular terms denoting places are bona fide singular terms, and variables ranging over places are bona fide variables, ranging over places.  Places are bona fide objects.

The ante rem structuralist envisions a smooth interplay between places-are-offices statements and places-are-objects statements.  When treating a structure in the places-are-offices mode, the background ontology sometimes includes places from other structures.  We say, for example, that the finite von Neumann ordinals exemplify the natural number structure (under the ordinal successor relation, in which the successor of an ordinal α is α∪{α}).  In the places-are-objects mode, for set theory, the variables range over the places of the iterative hierarchy, such places construed as objects.  The von Neumann ordinals are some of those places-cum-objects.  We think of those objects as forming a system, under the ordinal successor relation.  That system exemplifies the natural number structure.  And in that system, the set-cum-object {φ,{φ}}, is in the two-role (beginning with the empty set, as zero).  We sometimes write {φ,{φ}}=2.  From the ante rem perspective, a symbol denoting {φ,{φ}} is construed in the places-are-objects mode, vis-à-vis the iterative hierarchy, and “2” is in the places-are-offices mode, vis-à-vis the natural number structure.  So construed, “{φ,{φ}}=2” is not actually an identity, but more like a predication.  It says that a certain von Neumann ordinal plays a certain role in a given natural number system.  In the Zermelo system, {{φ}}=2.

Sometimes, the background ontology for the places-are-offices perspective consists of places of the very structure under discussion.  It is commonly noted, for example, that the even natural numbers exemplify the natural number structure.  That is, we consider a system whose objects are the even natural numbers (themselves construed from the places-are-objects mode), under the relation symbolized by “+2”.  That system exemplifies the natural number structure.  In that system, 6 is in the three-role.  Of course, it would be confusing to write 6=3, but if care is taken, it can be properly understood, remembering that it is not an identity.

Trivially, the natural number structure itself, construed from the places-are-objects mode, exemplifies the natural number structure.  In that case, 6 plays the six-role.  Some philosophers might think that this raises a problem analogous to Aristotle’s Third Man argument against Plato.  It depends on the relationship between an ante rem structure and the systems it exemplifies.  In short, the Third Man arguments are problematic if one holds that the reason why a given collection of objects, under certain relations, is a natural number system is that it exemplifies the natural number structure.  This invokes something like the Principle of Sufficient Reason.  If something is so, then there must be a reason why it is so, and the cited reason must be, in some metaphysical sense, prior to the something.  From that perspective, one cannot hold that the natural number structure itself exemplifies the natural number structure because it exemplifies the natural number structure.  That would be a circular reason.  The ante rem structuralist is free to reject this instance of the Principle of Sufficient Reason.  She simply points out that the reason the natural number structure exemplifies the natural number structure is that it has a distinguished initial position and satisfies the relevant principles (for an opposing construal, see Hand [1993]).

The ante rem structuralist should say something about the metaphysical nature of a structure, and how it is that mathematical objects are somehow constituted by a structure.  Consider the following slogan from Shapiro [1997, p. 9]:

Structures are prior to places in the same sense that any organization is prior to the offices that constitute it.  The natural number structure is prior to “6,” just as “baseball defense” is prior to “shortstop” or “U.S. Government” is prior to “Vice President.”

What is this notion of priority? For the non-mathematical examples such as baseball defenses and governments, one might characterize the priority in terms of possible existence.  To say that A is prior to B is to say that B could not exist without A.  No one can be a shortstop independent of a baseball defense; no one can be vice president independent of a government (or organization).  Unfortunately, this articulation of the priority does not make sense of the mathematical cases.  The ante rem structuralist follows most ontological realists in holding that the mathematical structures and their places exist of necessity.  It does not make sense to think of the natural number structure existing without its places, nor for the places to exist without the structure.

The dependence relation in the slogans for ante rem structuralism is that of constitution.  Each ante rem structure consists of some places and some relations.  A structure is constituted by its places and its relations, in the same way that any organization is constituted by its offices and the relations between them.  The constitution is not that of mereology.  It is not the case that a structure is just the sum of its places, since, in general, the places have to be related to each other via the relations of the structure.  An ante rem structure is a whole consisting of, or constituted by, its places and its relations.

3. Getting by without Ontology: Structuralism without (Ante Rem) Structures

Some philosophers find the existence of ante rem structures extravagant.  For such thinkers, there are other ways to preserve the structuralist insights.  One can take structures to exist, but only in the systems that exemplify them.  Metaphysically, the idea is to reverse the priority cited above: structures are posterior to the systems that exemplify them—although, again, it may prove difficult to articulate the relevant notion of priority.  This would be an Aristotelian, in re realism.  On a view like this, the only structures that exist are those that are exemplified.  I do not know of any philosophers of mathematics who articulate such a view in detail.  I mention it, in passing, in light of the connection between structures and traditional universals.

Another, perhaps ontologically cleaner, option is to reject the existence of structures, in any sense of “existence.”  On such a view, apparent talk of structures is only a façon de parler, a way of talking about systems that are structured in a certain way.  The view is sometimes dubbed eliminative structuralism.

The eliminativist can acknowledge the places-are-objects orientation when discussing structures or, to be precise, when discussing structured systems, but he cannot understand such statements literally (without adopting an error theory).  For the eliminativist, the surface grammar of places-are-objects statements does not reflect their underlying logical form, since, from that perspective, there are no structures and there are no places to which one can refer.

The ante rem structuralist and the eliminativist agree that statements in the places-are-objects mode imply generalizations concerning systems that exemplify the structure.  We say, for example, that the vice president presides over the senate, and this entails that all vice presidents preside over their respective senates.  The chess king can move one square in any direction, so long as the move does not result in check.  This entails that all kings are so mobile, and so immobile.  Of course, the generalizations themselves do not entail that there are any vice presidents or chess kings—nor do they entail that there are any structures.

The eliminative structuralist holds that places-are-objects statements are just ways of expressing the relevant generalizations, and he accuses the ante rem structuralist of making too much of their surface grammar, trying to draw deep metaphysical conclusions from that.  The same goes for typical statements in pure mathematics.  Those, too, should be regimented as generalizations over all systems that exemplify the given structure or structures.  For example, the statement “For every natural number n there is a prime p>n” is rendered:

In any natural number system S, for every object x in S, there is another object y in S such that y comes after x in S and y has no divisors in S other than itself and the unit object of S.

In general, any sentence Φ in the language of arithmetic gets regimented as something like:

(Φʹ)      In any natural number system S, Φ[S],

where Φ[S] is obtained from Φ by restricting the quantifiers to the objects in S, and interpreting the non-logical terminology in terms of the relations of S.

In a similar manner, the eliminative structuralist paraphrases or regiments—and deflates—what seem to be substantial metaphysical statements, the very statements made by his philosophical opponents.  For example, “the number 2 exists” becomes “in every natural number system, there is an object in the 2-place”.  Or “real numbers exist” becomes “every real number system has objects in its places.”  These are trivially true, analytic if you will—not the sort of statements that generate heated metaphysical arguments.

The sailing is not completely smooth for the eliminative structuralist, however.  As noted, this view takes the places-are-offices perspective to be primary—paraphrasing places-are-objects statements in those terms.  Places-are-offices statements, recall, presuppose a background of objects to fill the places in the systems.  For mathematics, the nature of these objects is not relevant.  For example, as noted, anything at all can play the two-role in a natural number system.  Nevertheless, for the regimented statements to get their expected truth-values, the background ontology must be quite extensive.

Suppose, for example, that the entire universe consists of no more than 10100,000 objects.  Then there are no natural number systems (since each such system must have infinitely many objects).  So for any sentence Φ in the language of arithmetic, the regimented sentence Φʹ would be vacuously true.  So the eliminativist would be committed to the truth of (the regimented version of) 1+1=0.

In other words, a straightforward, successful eliminative account of arithmetic requires a countably infinite background ontology.  And it gets worse for other branches of mathematics.  An eliminative account of real analysis demands an ontology whose size is that of the continuum; for functional analysis, we’d need the powerset of that many objects.  And on it goes.  The size of some of the structures studied in mathematics is staggering.

Even if the physical universe does exceed 10100,000 objects, and, indeed, even if it is infinite, there is surely some limit to how many physical objects there are (invoking Cantor’s theorem that the powerset of any set is larger than it).  Branches of mathematics that require more objects than the number of physical objects might end up being vacuously trivial, at least by the lights of the straightforward, eliminative structuralist.  This would be bad news for such theorists, as the goal is to make sense of mathematics as practiced.  In any case, no philosophy of mathematics should be hostage to empirical and contingent facts, including features of the size of the physical universe.

In the literature, there are two eliminativist reactions to this threat of vacuity.  First, the philosopher might argue, or assume, that there are enough abstract objects for every mathematical structure to be exemplified.  In other words, we postulate that, for each field of mathematics, there are enough abstract objects to keep the regimented statements from becoming vacuous.

Some mathematicians, and some philosophers, think of the set-theoretic hierarchy as the ontology for all of mathematics.  Mathematical objects—all mathematical objects—are sets in the iterative hierarchy.  Less controversially, it is often thought that the iterative hierarchy is rich enough to recapitulate every mathematical theory.  Penelope Maddy [2007, 354] writes:

Set theory hopes to provide a dependable and perspicuous mathematical theory that is ample enough to include (surrogates for) all the objects of classical mathematics and strong enough to imply all the classical theorems about them.  In this way, set theory aims to provide a court of final appeal for claims of existence and proof in classical mathematics . . . Thus set theory aims to provide a single arena in which the objects of classical mathematics are all included, where they can be compared side-by-side.

One might wonder why it is that a foundational theory only needs “surrogates” for each mathematical object, and not the real things.  For a structuralist, the answer is that in mathematics the individual nature of the objects is irrelevant.  What matters is their relations to each other (see Shapiro [2004]).

An eliminative structuralist might maintain that the theory of the background ontology for mathematics—set theory or some other—is not, after all, the theory of a particular structure.  The foundation is a mathematical theory with an intended ontology in the usual, non-structuralist sense.  In the case of set theory, the intended ontology is the sets.  Set theory is not (merely) about all set-theoretic systems—all systems that satisfy the axioms.  So, the foundational theory is an exception to the theme that mathematics is the science of structure.  But, the argument continues, every other branch of mathematics is to be understood in eliminative structuralist terms.  Arithmetic is the study of all natural number systems—within the iterative hierarchy.  Euclidean geometry is the study of all Euclidean systems, and so forth.  There are thus no structures—ante rem or otherwise—and, with the exception of sets, or whatever the background ontology may be, there are no mathematical objects either.  Øystein Linnebo [2008] articulates and defends a view like this.  Although there is not much discussion of the background ontology, Paul Benacerraf’s classic [1965] can be read in these terms as well.  Benacerraf famously argues that there are no numbers—talk of numbers is only a way to talk about all systems of a certain kind, but he seems to have no similar qualms about sets.

Of course, this ontological version of eliminative structuralism is anathema to a nominalist, who rejects the existence of abstracta altogether.  For the nominalist, sets and ante rem structures are pretty much on a par—neither are wanted.  The other prominent eliminative reaction to the threat of vacuity is to invoke modality.  In effect, one avoids (or attempts to avoid) a commitment to a vast ontology by inserting modal operators into the regimented generalizations.  To reiterate the above example, the modal eliminativist renders the statement “For every natural number n there is a prime p>n” as something like:

In any possible natural number system S, for every object x in S, there is another object y in S such that y comes after x in S and y has no divisors in S other than itself and the unit object of S.

In general, let Φ be any sentence in the language of arithmetic; Φ gets regimented as:

In any possible natural number system S, Φ[S],

or, perhaps,

Necessarily, for any natural number system S, Φ[S],

where, again, Φ[S] is obtained from Φ by restricting the quantifiers to the objects in S, and by interpreting the non-logical terminology in terms of the relations of S.

The difference with the ontological, eliminative program, of course, is that here the variables ranging over systems are inside the scope of a modal operator.  So the modal eliminativist does not require an extensive rich background ontology.  Rather, she needs a large ontology to be possible.  Geoffrey Hellman [1989] develops a modal program in detail.

The central, open problem with this brand of eliminativist structuralism concerns the nature of the invoked modality.  Of course, it won’t do much good to render the modality in terms of possible worlds.  If we do that, and if we take possible worlds, and possibilia, to exist, then modal eliminative structuralism would collapse into the above, ontological version of eliminative structuralism.  Not much would be gained by adding the modal operators.  So the modalist typically takes the modality to be primitive—not defined in terms of anything more fundamental.  But, of course, this move does not relieve the modalist of having to say something about the nature of the indicated modality, and having to say something about how we know propositions about what is possible.

Invoking metaphysical possibility and necessity does not seem appropriate here.  Intuitively, if mathematical objects exist at all, then they exist of necessity.   And perhaps also intuitively, if mathematical objects do not exist, then their non-existence is necessary.  Physical and conceptual modalities are also problematic for present purposes.

Hellman mobilizes the logical modalities for his eliminative structuralism.  Our arithmetic sentence Φ becomes

In any logically possible natural number system S, Φ[S].

It is logically necessary that for any natural number system S, Φ[S].

In contemporary logic textbooks and classes, the logical modalities are understood in terms of sets.  To say that a sentence is logically possible is to say that there is a certain set that satisfies it.  Of course, this will not do here, for the same reason that the modalist cannot define the modality in terms of possible worlds.  It is especially problematic here.  It does no good to render mathematical ‘existence’ in terms of logical possibility if the latter is to be rendered in terms of existence in the set-theoretic hierarchy.  Again, the modalist takes the notion of logical possibility to be a primitive, explicated by the theory as a whole.  For more on this program, see Hellman [1989], [2001], [2005].

To briefly sum up and conclude, the parties to the debate over how to best articulate the structuralist insights agree that each of the major versions has its strengths and, of course, each has its peculiar difficulties.  Negotiating such tradeoffs is, of course, a stock feature of philosophy in general.  The literature has produced an increased understanding of mathematics, of the relevant philosophical issues, and how the issues bear on each other, and the discussion shows no signs of abating. For additional discussion see “The Applicability of Mathematics.”

4. References and Further Reading

  • Armstrong, D. [1986], “In defence of structural universals,” Australasian Journal of Philosophy 64, 85-88.
    • As the title says.
  • Awodey, S. [1996], “Structure in mathematics and logic:  a categorical perspective,” Philosophia Mathematica (3) 4, 209-237.
    • Articulates a connection between structuralism and category theory.
  • Awodey, S. [2004], “An answer to Hellman’s question:  ‘Does category theory provide a framework for mathematical structuralism?’,” Philosophia Mathematica (3) 12, 54-64.
    • Continuation of the above.
  • Awodey, S. [2006], Category theory, Oxford, Oxford University Press.
    • Readable presentation of category theory.
  • Benacerraf, P. [1965], “What numbers could not be,” Philosophical Review 74, 47-73; reprinted in Philosophy of mathematics, edited by P. Benacerraf and H. Putnam, Englewood Cliffs, New Jersey, Prentice-Hall, 1983, 272-294.
    • Classic motivation for the (eliminative) structuralist perspective.
  • Bernays, P. [1967], “Hilbert, David” in The encyclopedia of philosophy, Volume 3, edited by P. Edwards, New York, Macmillan publishing company and The Free Press, 496-504.
  • Chihara, C. [2004], A structural account of mathematics, Oxford, Oxford University Press.
    • Account of the application of mathematics in “structural” terms, but without adopting a structuralist philosophy.
  • Frege, G. [1976], Wissenschaftlicher Briefwechsel, edited by G. Gabriel, H. Hermes, F. Kambartel, and C. Thiel, Hamburg, Felix Meiner.
  • Frege, G. [1980], Philosophical and mathematical correspondence, Oxford, Basil Blackwell.
  • Hale, Bob, [1996], “Structuralism’s unpaid epistemological debts,” Philosophica Mathematica (3) 4, 124-143.
    • Criticism of modal eliminative structuralism.
  • Hand, M. [1993], “Mathematical structuralism and the third man,” Canadian Journal of Philosophy 23, 179-192.
    • Critique of ante rem structuralism, on Aristotelian grounds.
  • Hellman, G. [1989], Mathematics without numbers, Oxford, Oxford University Press.
    • Detailed articulation and defense of modal eliminative structuralism.
  • Hellman, G. [2001], “Three varieties of mathematical structuralism,” Philosophia Mathematica (III) 9, 184-211.
    • Comparison of the varieties of structuralism, favoring the modal eliminative version.
  • Hellman, G. [2005], “Structuralism,” Oxford handbook of philosophy of mathematics and logic, edited by Stewart Shapiro, Oxford, Oxford University Press, 536-562.
    • Comparison of the varieties of structuralism, again favoring the modal eliminative version.
  • Hilbert, D. [1899], Grundlagen der Geometrie, Leipzig, Teubner; Foundations of geometry, translated by E. Townsend, La Salle, Illinois, Open Court, 1959.
  • Hilbert, D. [1935], Gesammelte Abhandlungen, Dritter Band, Berlin, Julius Springer.
  • Lewis, D. [1986], “Against structural universals,” Australasian Journal of Philosophy 64, 25-46.
    • As the title says.
  • Linnebo, Øystein [2008], “Structuralism and the Notion of Dependence,” Philosophical Quarterly 58, 59-79.
    • An ontological eliminative structuralism, using set theory as the (non-structural) background foundation.
  • MacBride, F. [2005], “Structuralism reconsidered,” Oxford Handbook of philosophy of mathematics and logic, edited by Stewart Shapiro, Oxford, Oxford University Press, 563-589.
    • Philosophically based criticism of the varieties of structuralism.
  • Maddy, P. [2007], Second philosophy: a naturalistic method, Oxford, Oxford University Press.
  • McLarty, C. [1993], “Numbers can be just what they have to,” Nous 27, 487-498.
    • Connection between category theory and the philosophical aspects of structuralism.
  • Pagès, J. [2002], “Structural universals and formal relations,” Synthese 131, 215-221.
    • Articulation and defenses of structural universals.
  • Resnik, M. [1981], “Mathematics as a science of patterns: Ontology and reference,” Nous 15, 529-550.
    • Philosophical articulation of structuralism, with focus on metaphysical issues.
  • Resnik, M. [1982], “Mathematics as a science of patterns: Epistemology,” Nous 16, 95-105.
    • Philosophical articulation of structuralism, with focus on epistemological issues.
  • Resnik, M. [1992], “A structuralist’s involvement with modality,” Mind 101, 107-122.
    • Review of Hellman [1989] focusing on issues concerning the invoked notion of modality.
  • Resnik, M. [1997], Mathematics as a science of patterns, Oxford, Oxford University Press.
    • Detailed articulation of a realist version of structuralism.
  • Shapiro, S. [1997], Philosophy of mathematics: structure and ontology, New York, Oxford University Press.
    • Elaborate articulation of structuralism, with focus on the various versions; defense of the ante rem approach.
  • Shapiro, S. [2004], “Foundations of mathematics:  metaphysics, epistemology, structure,” Philosophical Quarterly 54, 16-37.
    • The role of structuralist insights in foundational studies.
  • Shapiro, S. [2008], “Identity, indiscernibility, and ante rem structuralism:  the tale of i and -i,” Philosophia Mathematica (3) 16, 2008, 285-309.
    • Treatment of the identity relation, from an ante rem structuralist perspective, and the metaphysical nature of structures.

Author Information

Stewart Shapiro
Email: shapiro.4@osu.edu
The Ohio State University, U.S.A. and
University of St. Andrews, United Kingdom

Last updated: June 6, 2010 | Originally published: