Alasdair MacIntyre is a Scottish born, British educated, moral and political philosopher who has worked in the United States since 1970. His work in ethics and politics reaches across disciplines, drawing on sociology and philosophy of the social sciences as well as Greek and Latin classical literature.
MacIntyre began his career as a Marxist, but in the late 1950s, he started working to develop a Marxist ethics that could rationally justify the moral condemnation of Stalinism. That project eventually led him to reject Marxism along with every other form of “modern liberal individualism” and to propose Aristotle’s ethics as a more effective way to renew moral agency and practical rationality through small-scale moral formation within communities.
MacIntyre’s best known book, After Virtue (1981), is the product of this long ethical project. After Virtue diagnoses contemporary society as a “culture of emotivism” in which moral language is used pragmatically to manipulate attitudes, choices, and decisions, so that contemporary moral culture is a theater of illusions in which objective moral rhetoric masks arbitrary choices. MacIntyre followed After Virtue with two books examining the role that traditions play in judgments about truth and falsity, Whose Justice? Which Rationality? (1988) and Three Rival Versions of Moral Enquiry (1990). MacIntyre’s next major work, Dependent Rational Animals: Why Human Beings Need the Virtues (1999), investigates the social needs and social debts of human agents, and the role that a community plays in the formation of an independent practical reasoner. The remainder of MacIntyre’s mature work extends and supplements the arguments of these four major works.
MacIntyre’s philosophy is important to the fields of virtue ethics and communitarian politics, but MacIntyre has denied belonging to either school of thought. MacIntyre has identified himself as a Thomist since 1984, but some Thomists question his Thomism because he emphasizes Thomas Aquinas’s treatment of human agency but rejects the neo-Thomist project of a creating a Thomist moral epistemology based on the metaphysics of human nature. MacIntyre continues to point out the irrelevance of conventional business ethics, conceived as an application of modern moral theories to business decision making, but some scholars in the field of business ethics have begun to apply MacIntyre’s Aristotelian account of agency and virtue to the study of organizational systems, to develop ways of renewing moral agency and practical rationality within companies. MacIntyre has played an important role in the renewal of Aristotelian ethics and politics in the last three decades, and has made a valued contribution to the advancement of Thomistic philosophy.
Alasdair MacIntyre was born January 12, 1929 in Glasgow, Scotland. His parents, both of which were physicians, were born and raised in the West of Scotland. Though Educated in England, he learned Scots Gaelic from one of his aunts. MacIntyre grew up in and around the city of London. He earned a bachelor’s degree in classics from Queen Mary College in the University of London in the city’s East End in 1949. MacIntyre attended graduate school at Manchester University, a provincial “red brick” university in the North West of England, earning his MA in Philosophy in 1951.
MacIntyre’s family had distant ties to County Donegal, in the North of Ireland, and his knowledge of Gaelic helped MacIntyre to make connections to the people there. He has remained close to the cultural and political concerns of Ireland for many years. MacIntyre “has an intimate and extensive knowledge of Irish literature, both in English and in Irish” (O’Rourke, p. 3). An academic conference celebrating MacIntyre’s eightieth birthday, held at the University College Dublin in 2009, acknowledged and celebrated his ties to the Irish community.
Alasdair MacIntyre’s philosophy builds on an unusual foundation. His early life was shaped by two conflicting systems of values. One was “a Gaelic oral culture of farmers and fishermen, poets and storytellers.” The other was modernity, “The modern world was a culture of theories rather than stories” (MacIntyre Reader, p. 255). MacIntyre embraced both value systems, and carried those divergent worldviews into his undergraduate education.
As a classics major at Queen Mary College in the University of London (1945-1949), MacIntyre read the Greek texts of Plato and Aristotle, but his studies were not limited to the grammars of ancient languages. He also examined the ethical theories of Immanuel Kant and John Stuart Mill. He attended the lectures of analytic philosopher A. J. Ayer and of philosopher of science Karl Popper. He read Ludwig Wittgenstein’s Tractatus Logico Philosophicus, Jean-Paul Sartre’s L'existentialisme est un humanisme, and Marx’s Eighteenth Brumaire of Napoleon Bonaparte (What happened, pp. 17-18). MacIntyre met the sociologist Franz Steiner, who helped direct him toward approaching moralities substantively (interview with Giovanna Borradori, p. 259). MacIntyre’s mature work continues to bridge across conventional disciplinary borders.
MacIntyre’s mature writings also continue to criticize the social and economic orders of modern life. This work also began during his time at Queen Mary College, growing out of his solidarity with the poor and working classes who filled the East End of London where Queen Mary College is located. MacIntyre’s first encounter with the Marxist critiques of liberalism and capitalism (Kinesis Interview, p. 48) drew MacIntyre into two decades of participation in Marxist organizations (Alasdair MacIntyre's Engagement with Marxism, pp. xiii-l). MacIntyre’s first encounter with the Thomist critique of English social and political life made a strong impression on MacIntyre, but he would not identify himself as a Thomist until 1984 (What happened, p. 17).
From Marxism, MacIntyre learned to see liberalism as a destructive ideology that undermines communities in the name of individual liberty and consequently undermines the moral formation of human agents (interview with Giovanna Borradori, p. 258; Kinesis Interview , p. 47). MacIntyre still acknowledges the insights of The Eighteenth Brumaire of Napoleon Bonaparte (What happened, pp. 20, 483), a book that strips the ideological pretensions from mid-nineteenth century French political rhetoric. For MacIntyre, Marx’s way of seeing through the empty justifications of arbitrary choices to consider the real goals and consequences of political actions in economic and social terms would remain the principal insight of Marxism. MacIntyre found the predictive theories of Marxist social science less convincing. His first book, Marxism: An Interpretation, (1953), criticizes Marx’s turn to social science; similar critiques appear in nearly all of MacIntyre’s major works.
MacIntyre began his teaching career at the University of Manchester as a Lecturer in the Philosophy of Religion in 1951, and held that post until 1957. In a 1956 essay, “Manchester: The Modern University and the English Tradition,” MacIntyre writes with pride about the role of the provincial universities as centers of professional education that are tied in service to the people of their cities, as places that had traditionally been homes to radical politics and non-conformist and minority (Agnostic, Roman Catholic, and Jewish) religion. Marxism: An Interpretation, is similarly an expression of radical politics and non-conformist religion directed to the service of people’s needs. After Manchester, MacIntyre became a member of Britain’s New Left (Alasdair MacIntyre's Engagement with Marxism, pp. xxii-xxxii, 86-93) and moved through teaching, research, and administrative positions at other British universities before emigrating from Britain to the United States in 1970, where his research interests drew him to teaching posts at Brandeis, Boston University, Vanderbilt, Notre Dame, and Duke. MacIntyre returned to Notre Dame in 2000 as the Senior Research Professor in the Notre Dame Center for Ethics and Culture until his retirement in 2010.
MacIntyre began his career as a Marxist Protestant Christian philosopher of religion, basing his work on the fideism of Karl Barth and Wittgenstein’s concept of a form of life (interview with Giovanna Borradori, p. 257). By 1960 he had stopped writing on that subject, and he wrote as an atheist through the sixties and seventies. MacIntyre’s emigration from Great Britain roughly coincides with his break from organized Marxism. In 1968, MacIntyre published a heavily revised version of Marxism: An Interpretation as Marxism and Christianity, and noted in the preface to the new book that he had become skeptical of both. That skepticism remains in Against the Self-Images of the Age (1971).
During the years 1977 through 1984 MacIntyre transitioned to an Aristotelian worldview, returned to the Christian faith and turned from Aristotle to Thomas Aquinas. MacIntyre explains in the preface to The Tasks of Philosophy (2006) that the article “Epistemological Crises, Dramatic Narrative, and the Philosophy of Science” (hereafter EC, 1977) marks the beginning of this transition.
After his retirement from teaching, MacIntyre has continued his work of promoting a renewal of human agency through an examination of the virtues demanded by practices, integrated human lives, and responsible engagement with community life. He is currently affiliated with the Centre for Contemporary Aristotelian Studies in Ethics and Politics (CASEP) at London Metropolitan University.
Alasdair MacIntyre has authored 19 books and edited five others. His most important book, After Virtue (hereafter AV, 1981), has been called one of the most influential works of moral philosophy of the late 20th century. AV and his other major works, including Marxism: An Interpretation (hereafter MI, 1953), A Short History of Ethics (hereafter SHE, 1966), Marxism and Christianity (hereafter M&C, 1968), Against the Self-Images of the Age (hereafter ASIA, 1971), Whose Justice? Which Rationality? (hereafter WJWR, 1988), Three Rival Versions of Moral Enquiry (hereafter 3RV, 1990), and Dependent Rational Animals (Hereafter DRA, 1999) have shaped academic moral philosophy for six decades. SHE served as a standard text for college courses in the history of moral philosophy for many years; AV remains a widely used ethics textbook in undergraduate and graduate education. MacIntyre has published about two hundred journal articles and roughly one hundred book reviews, addressing concerns in ethics, politics, the philosophy of the social sciences, Marxist theory, Marxist political practice, the Aristotelian notion of excellence or virtue in human agency, and the interpretation of Thomistic metaphysics, epistemology, and ethics.
MacIntyre’s mature work, initiated by the 1977 essay, “Epistemological Crises, Dramatic Narrative, and the Philosophy of Science” (hereafter EC), draws upon the study of traditions, and the examination of the narratives that inform traditions of scientific, philosophical, and social practice, as a philosophical method. AV and the whole body of work that follows it employ this philosophical method in the study of moral and political philosophy.
AV rejects the view of “modern liberal individualism” in which autonomous individuals use abstract moral principles to determine what they ought to do. The critique of modern normative ethics in the first half of AV rejects modern moral reasoning for its failure to justify its premises, and criticizes the frequent use of the rhetoric of objective morality and scientific necessity to manipulate people to accept arbitrary decisions. The critical argument gives examples of such manipulative moral rhetoric in ordinary speech, in philosophical ethics, and in the political use of the social sciences. The second half of AV proposes a conception of practice and practical reasoning and the notion of excellence as a human agent as an alternative to modern moral philosophy, presenting what MacIntyre has called “an historicist defense of Aristotle” (AV, p. 277).
MacIntyre’s use of the term “modern liberal individualism” in philosophy is not equivalent to “liberalism” in contemporary politics. Some readers interpreted MacIntyre’s rejection of “modern liberal individualism” to mean that he is a political conservative (AV, 3rd ed., p. xv), but MacIntyre uses “modern liberal individualism” to name a much broader category that includes both liberals and conservatives in contemporary American political parlance, as well as some Marxists and anarchists (See ASIA, pp. 280-284). Conservatism, liberalism, Marxism, and anarchism all present the autonomous individual as the unit of civil society (see “The Theses on Feuerbach: A Road Not Taken.”); none of these political theories can provide a well-developed conception of the common good; and none of them can adequately explain or justify any shared pursuit of any common good.
The sources of modern liberal individualism—Hobbes, Locke, and Rousseau—assert that human life is solitary by nature and social by habituation and convention. MacIntyre’s Aristotelian tradition holds, on the contrary, that human life is social by nature. Modern liberal individualism seeks to justify the moral authority of various universal, impersonal moral principles to enable autonomous individuals to make morally correct decisions. But modern moral philosophers use those principles to establish the authority of universal moral norms, and modern autonomous individuals set aside the pursuit of their own goods and goals when they obey these principles and norms in order to judge and act morally. MacIntyre rejects this modern project as incoherent. MacIntyre identifies moral excellence with effective human agency, and seeks a political environment that will help to liberate human agents to recognize and seek their own goods, as components of the common goods of their communities, more effectively. For MacIntyre therefore, ethics and politics are bound together.
Alasdair MacIntyre’s career in moral and political philosophy has passed through many changes, but two themes have remained constant. The first is his critique of modern normative ethics. The second is his approach to moral philosophy as a study of moral formation that strengthens rational human agency and helps to develop a political community of rational agents. The critique of modern normative ethics draws on two sources, the philosophy of Karl Marx, and the emotivism of early twentieth-century logical positivists, including A. J. Ayer and C. L. Stevenson. The search for a truthful ethics and politics of agents in communities draws on action theory, sociology, the philosophy of science and the theme of “revolutionary practice” drawn from Karl Marx’s Theses on Feuerbach.
MacIntyre has cited the third of Marx’s Theses on Feuerbach, throughout his career (See MI, p. 61; M&C, p. 59, AV, p. 84); he explains the significance of the Theses on Feuerbach in detail in “The Theses on Feuerbach: A Road Not Taken” (hereafter ToF:RNT), published in 1994. Macintyre reads The Theses on Feuerbach as “a genuinely transitional text” (ToF:RNT, p. 224),” marking the end of Marx’s philosophical work with Hegel and Feuerbach, but “pointing in a direction which Marx did not in fact take” (ToF:RNT, p. 226). Hegel and Feuerbach had been critics of “the standpoint of civil society”; which is effectively the standpoint of “modern liberal individualism.” Feuerbach had criticized objects of religious belief as projections of human thought. But Marx found that the theoretical objects of Feuerbach’s philosophy were susceptible to the same critique. In the Theses on Feuerbach, Marx proposed a philosophy that sets aside the contemplation of theoretical objects in order to examine and transform human activity and practice (ToF:RNT, pp. 227-8; see Marx, fourth and first theses).
In the third thesis, Marx complained that Feuerbach and other materialist social theorists invented a determinist theory of human behavior, but applied it as if it did not encompass their own free agency, as if they were superior to society (ToF:RNT, p. 229-30; see also AV, p. 84). Rejecting this implicit distinction between society and those superior to it, Marx insisted that the leaders and followers of the revolution can only act together, discovering together the ends and methods of the revolution (ToF:RNT, p. 230-1). Marx made this proposal, but did not pursue it. Later Marxist revivals of philosophy have followed two main roads of research, “the dialectical and historical materialism of Plekhanov . . . or . . . the rational voluntarism of the young Lukács” (ToF:RNT, p. 232). For MacIntyre, even at the beginning of his career, The Theses on Feuerbach offered a less traveled road for the recovery of Marxist philosophy that would become essential to MacIntyre’s contributions to moral and political philosophy.
Discussing his career in an interview for the journal Cogito in 1991, MacIntyre identified three distinct phases in his development. During the first period, from 1949 to 1971, MacIntyre published in the philosophy of religion, ethics, the philosophy of the social sciences, and Marxist political and ethical theory without integrating these studies into a unified world view. During the second period, from 1971 to 1977, MacIntyre worked toward the integration of his philosophy. In the third period, from 1977 forward, MacIntyre has been working on “a single project, to which AV, WJWR and 3RV are all central” (Interview for Cogito, in The MacIntyre Reader, p. 269)
In his early career, MacIntyre investigated the rational justification of theories and beliefs, and published books and articles in the philosophy of religion, the philosophy of the social sciences, and moral theory. This survey of his early career will take each of these fields in turn.
In the philosophy of religion, the young MacIntyre did not try to justify religious belief rationally; rather he tried to show that religious belief should be exempted from rational examination. The theory he developed in the 1950s was a defensive structure devised to separate MacIntyre’s religious beliefs from the rest of his academic work. MacIntyre’s early fideist philosophy of religion was influenced by the philosophy of Ludwig Wittgenstein and the theology of Karl Barth. For the fideist, religious belief is not, and cannot be rational; its only basis is the acceptance of religious authority. MacIntyre’s Barthian-Wittgensteinian philosophy of religion is nothing more than a rational compartmentalization of religious belief.
The key statement of MacIntyre’s early fideist philosophy of religion is his 1957 essay, “The Logical Status of Religious Belief,” published in the book Metaphysical Beliefs. This essay faced strong criticism from the atheist Antony Flew and the Christian theologian Basil Mitchell. In a 1958 book review, Flew pointed out that traditional Christianity had a closer connection to empirical facts than MacIntyre allowed, and that even if facts about the world could not verify religious belief, it was nonetheless possible for internal incoherence to demonstrate the falsehood of doctrine. Mitchell published a fourteen page critique of MacIntyre’s fideism in 1961 entitled, “The Justification of Religious Belief.” When Metaphysical Beliefs was republished in 1970, MacIntyre added a new preface in which he thanked Flew and Mitchell, along with his colleague Ronald Hepburn, for their criticism, and rejected the essay’s “irrationalism as both false and dangerous” (“Preface to the 1970 Edition,” pp. x–xi).
From the early 1960s through the late 1970s, MacIntyre wrote as an avowed atheist. Three publications in the 1960s, “God and the Theologians,” The Religious Significance of Atheism, and Secularization and Moral Change, express MacIntyre’s atheist convictions.
The reasoning behind MacIntyre’s rejection of his early fideism continues to inform his approach to theism. MacIntyre’s 2010 lecture, “On Being a Theistic Philosopher in a Secularized Culture” does not treat theistic belief as an isolable metaphysical doctrine about the origin and fate of human life. For the mature MacIntyre, theism plays a central role in the interpretation of the world. MacIntyre’s mature theism is not a return to his early fideism; it belongs to a rational worldview that challenges “secular fideists” on the same grounds that it challenges religious ones (WJWR, p. 5).
MacIntyre’s early work in the philosophy of the social sciences is related to the rational justification of Marxist theory, and to distinguishing the more promising elements of Marx’s early philosophical work from the more pseudoscientific elements of later Marxist and Stalinist theory. Within Marxism, which presented itself through most of the twentieth century as a social science, MacIntyre directed his critique against the crude determinism of Stalinism. More broadly, MacIntyre has questioned the rational justification of any social theory that does not give a central place to the beliefs, intentions, and choices of human agents.
In his unpublished master’s thesis, The Significance of Moral Judgements (hereafter SMJ, 1951), MacIntyre cites Steven Toulmin, “The Logical Status of Psycho-Analysis,” Antony Flew, “Psycho-Analytic Explanation,” and Richard Peters, “Cause, Cure, and Motive,” to criticize Sigmund Freud’s apparent reduction of the moral account of a person’s actions to a causal account of that person’s psychological condition.
MacIntyre remained an outspoken critic of determinist social science throughout the early period of his career. Marxism: An Interpretation criticizes Marx’s turn to determinist social science in The German Ideology (MI, pp. 68-78). M&C, revises this criticism, directing the blame toward Friedrich Engels (M&C, pp.70-74). In the article, “Determinism,” MacIntyre admitted that successful predictions about human behavior from the social sciences made it difficult to dismiss determinism, but given the kinds of interpretative choices required to defend determinism, he found “it difficult to see how determinism could ever be verified or falsified” (pp. 39-40).
MacIntyre’s critique of modern normative ethics, if understood as a critique of the normative ethics characteristic of liberal modernity, is rooted partly in the work of Karl Marx. While still a student, MacIntyre had accepted much of the Marxist critique of modern liberal politics as an ideology that sets the individual against the interests of the community. Marx dismissed the notion of “natural rights” as a residue of feudal society in the book review, “On The Jewish Question.” For Marx, “rights” could arise only from laws made by governments. Marx held that “natural rights” or the “rights of man,” as used in nineteenth century liberal politics, served only to protect the individual from the society to which he belonged, and thus threatened both the society and the individual.
MacIntyre’s early Marxism led him to reject every form of modern liberal individualism, “including the liberalism of contemporary American and English conservatives, as well as that of American and European radicals, and even the liberalism of the self-proclaimed liberals.” For these ideological stances, by their constructions of civil society as a response of the individual to universal standards of reason and behavior, “impose a certain kind of unacknowledged domination, and one which in the long run tends to dissolve traditional human ties and to impoverish social and cultural relationships” (Borradori interview, p. 258)
MacIntyre’s critique of modern normative ethics is also influenced by the theory of emotivism. C. L. Stevenson and other emotivists held that moral judgments signify only the subjective interests of their authors, rather than any objective characteristic of the agents and actions they judge. SMJ takes issue with the reductivism of Stevenson’s theory of the meaning of moral judgments, but MacIntyre agrees with most points of Stevenson’s emotivist critique of modern normative ethics, and in this way MacIntyre joins Stevenson’s critique of the intuitionism of G. E. Moore.
Moore had argued in Principia Ethica (1903) that the fundamental task of philosophical ethics was to investigate “assertions about that property of things which is denoted by the term ‘good,’ and the converse property denoted by the term ‘bad’” (Principia Ethica, §23) Moore asserted that “good” must name some specific quality that all good things share, but he found it impossible to define “good” in any adequate way (Principia Ethica, §10). Moore therefore described “good” as a simple, indefinable, non-natural quality.
Logical positivists, including A. J. Ayer (Language Truth and Logic, ch. 6) and C. L. Stevenson could find nothing objective in the “good” that Moore described, and concluded that “good” and “bad” are not objective qualities. Stevenson held that valuations, like “this is a good car” or “that is a good house,” and moral valuations, like “he is a good man,” or “theft is wrong,” are not statements of fact. For Stevenson, evaluative words like “good” and “evil” carry, “emotive meaning” which Stevenson defines as “a tendency of a word, arising through the history of its usage, to produce (result from) affective responses to people” (“The Emotive Meaning of Ethical Terms” p. 23) Emotive terms are used to influence people. Thus the true meaning of any valuation, and particularly of any moral valuation—the significance of moral judgments—is either the speaker’s subjective approval and recommendation, or the speaker’s subjective rejection and proscription. In short, the emotivists held that moral judgments communicate neither facts nor beliefs; they communicate only the emotional interests of their authors.
MacIntyre criticized the reductivism of Stevenson’s conclusions in his MA thesis, but MacIntyre did not criticize Stevenson’s rejection of Moore. MacIntyre explains, “This is not to deny the emotive character of the moral judgment: it is to suggest that when we have said of moral judgments that they are emotive we have left a great deal unsaid—and even the emotive may have a logic to be mapped” (SMJ, p. 89.) MacIntyre’s 1951 assessment of emotivism accepts Stevenson’s critique of the referential meaning of moral judgments (SMJ, p. 74), and with it, the general rejection of “traditional moral philosophy” as a study that uses principles to assess facts (SMJ, p. 81).
For MacIntyre ethics is not an application of principles to facts, but a study of moral action. Moral action, free human action, involves decisions to do things in pursuit of goals, and it involves the understanding of the implications of one’s actions for the whole variety of goals that human agents seek. In this sense, “To act morally is to know how to act” (SMJ, p. 56). “Morality is not a ‘knowing that’ but a ‘knowing how’” (SMJ, p. 89). If human action is a ‘knowing how,’ then ethics must also consider how one learns ‘how.’ Like other forms of ‘knowing how,’ MacIntyre finds that one learns how to act morally within a community whose language and shared standards shape our judgment (SMJ, pp. 68-72). MacIntyre had concluded that ethics is not an abstract exercise in the assessment of facts; it is a study of free human action and of the conditions that enable rational human agency.
Human agency remains a central theme in MacIntyre’s first published book, Marxism: An Interpretation (1953). The book praises those forms of M&C that enable human agency, and criticizes those that inhibit human agency. MacIntyre traces a history from Protestant theology and practice, through the philosophies of Hegel and Feuerbach, to the work of Marx to argue that Marxism is a transformation of Christianity. MacIntyre gives Marx credit for concluding in the third of the Theses on Feuerbach, that the only way to change society is to change ourselves, and that “The coincidence of the changing of human activity or self-changing can only be comprehended and rationally understood as revolutionary practice” (Marx, Theses on Feuerbach, quoted in MI, p. 61). MacIntyre criticizes Marx’s subsequent turn to determinist social science and concludes that “Marx’s transition from prophecy to prediction” transforms Marxism into an alienating myth that divides human beings between “the good who accept Marxism, [and] the wicked who reject it” (MI, p. 89).
The book also examines some shortcomings of Protestant theology and practice, showing how the demands of the gospel inform the ideals of Feuerbach and, through Feuerbach, Marx. MacIntyre distinguishes “religion which is an opiate for the people from religion which is not” (MI, p. 83). He condemns forms of religion that justify social inequities and encourage passivity. He argues that authentic Christian teaching criticizes social structures and encourages action (MI, pp. 119-22).
The MA thesis and MI combine to chart MacIntyre’s initial reply to the emotivist critique of modern normative ethics. They also prefigure MacIntyre’s conflict with R. M. Hare’s response to emotivism. Hare sought to defend modern normative ethics from the emotivist challenge with an alternative account of the meaning of moral judgments. A central claim of Hare’s The Language of Morals (1952), renewed in Freedom and Reason (1963), is that moral judgments are descriptive—not merely emotive—because they are both universalizable and prescriptive. For Hare, universalizability stems from an agent’s commitment to use terms and judgments consistently. For example, “If a person says that a thing is red, he is committed to the view that anything which was like it in the relevant respects would likewise be red” (Freedom and Reason, I 2.2). Thus the prescriptive judgments that agents make are universalizable, insofar as those agents are committed to judging similar things similarly; and it is the universalizability of these prescriptive judgments that gives them descriptive meaning. In short, moral judgments are descriptive because they describe the values chosen by their authors.
MacIntyre rejected Hare’s defense of modern normative ethics in his 1957 essay, “What Morality Is Not.” MacIntyre focuses on Hare’s theory: “It is widely held that it is of the essence of moral valuations that they are universalizable and prescriptive. This is the contention which I wish to deny.” “What Morality is Not” explores the variety of meanings and intentions carried by moral judgments. MacIntyre lists six kinds of moral valuations that are neither universalizable nor prescriptive and concludes that the theory of universal prescriptivism is inadequate for the same reason that emotivism is inadequate; it is reductive. Universal prescriptivism simply fails to give a complete account of the meaning of moral judgments.
“What Morality is Not” also argues that the procedures of modern moral philosophy are superfluous to real moral practice. Where “moral philosophy textbooks” discuss the kinds of maxims that should guide “promise-keeping, truth-telling, and the like,” moral maxims do not guide real agents in real life at all. “They do not guide us because we do not need to be guided. We know what to do” (ASIA, p. 106). Sometimes we do this without any maxims at all, or even against all the maxims we know. MacIntyre Illustrates his point with Huckleberry Finn’s decision to help Jim, Miss Watson’s escaped slave, to make his way to freedom (ASIA, p. 107). Once again, morality is not a “knowing that” but a “knowing how,” and the use of this “knowing how” cannot be reduced to making universalizable prescriptive judgments. MacIntyre’s rejection of Hare’s universal prescriptivism renewed his critique of modern normative ethics, and carried lasting consequences for the Marxist MacIntyre’s response to the moral challenge of Stalinism.
In the late 1950s Marxists throughout the world discovered the hidden atrocities of the Stalinist regime in the Soviet Union, and witnessed the violent suppression of the Hungarian revolution of 1956 (See Virtue and Politics, pp. 134-151). The crimes of the Stalinist regime, including mass murder, mass deportation, and the execution of the intellectual, political, cultural, and ecclesial leadership of subject national communities, demanded condemnation. Yet the moral criticism of Stalinist policies presented a problem to committed Marxist atheists, including MacIntyre, who had rejected theistic notions of divine law as well as modern secular notions of “natural rights.”
MacIntyre discussed the moral condemnation of Stalinism in “Notes from the Moral Wilderness” I & II, (1958 and 59). For MacIntyre, it appeared difficult to condemn Stalinism with any real authority, because any appeal to modern secular liberal moral principle seems to be essentially arbitrary. The ex-communist, liberal critic of Stalinism “can only condemn in the name of his own choice” (The MacIntyre Reader, p. 34). MacIntyre’s description of the moral perplexity of these critics of Stalinism resembles his description of Huck Finn a year earlier (ASIA, p. 106); they judged the crimes of Stalin well, but lacked any adequate way to justify their judgments rationally. In “Notes From the Moral Wilderness II,” MacIntyre proposed a new Marxist ethics of human action. Rather than divorcing “the ‘ought’ of morality” from “the ‘is’ of desire” (The MacIntyre Reader, p. 41), MacIntyre’s Marxist ethics would look to “the fact of human solidarity which comes to light in the discovery of what we want” (The MacIntyre Reader, p. 48).
MacIntyre’s Marxist writings of the early 1960s develop his ethical project. “Communism and British Intellectuals” (1960) argues that the Communist Party of Great Britain is no longer Marxist because it has abandoned Marx’s insight from the third of the Theses on Feuerbach. “Classical Marxism . . . wants to transform the vast mass of mankind from victims and puppets into agents who are masters of their own lives,” but Stalinism had transformed Marxism into the doctrine that scientists should use “the objective and unchangeable laws of history” to manage the behavior of society (Alasdair MacIntyre’s Engagement with Marxism, p. 119). “Freedom and Revolution” (1960) discusses “human initiative” in terms of “desire, intention, and choice” (Alasdair MacIntyre’s Engagement with Marxism, p. 124), and sees the full development of human freedom to require participation in the life of a community: “The problem of freedom is not the problem of the individual against society but the problem of what sort of society we want, and what sort of individuals we want to be” (Alasdair MacIntyre’s Engagement with Marxism, p. 129). The individual should not seek liberation from society, but through society. Morality has to do with one’s participation in the life of one’s community.
MacIntyre develops the ideas that morality emerges from history, and that morality organizes the common life of a community in SHE (1966). The book concludes that the concepts of morality are neither timeless nor ahistorical, and that understanding the historical development of ethical concepts can liberate us “from any false absolutist claims” (SHE, p. 269). Yet this conclusion need not imply that morality is essentially arbitrary or that one could achieve freedom by liberating oneself from the morality of one’s society. In his comments on Plato’s Gorgias in chapter 4, MacIntyre rejects Callicles’ claims that breaking social rules can be liberating. “For a man whose behavior was not rule-governed in any way would have ceased to participate as an intelligible agent in human society” (SHE, p. 32). Elements of SHE return in the histories of AV (1981) and WJWR (1988).
The publication of ASIA in 1971 marks the end of the “heterogeneous, badly organized, sometimes fragmented and often frustrating and messy enquiries” (The MacIntyre Reader, p. 268) that made up the first part of MacIntyre’s career, and the beginning of “an interim period of sometimes painfully self-critical reflection” that would end with the publication of EC in 1977.
ASIA is a collection of short essays criticizing ideology, contemporary religious practice, Marxist theory and hagiography, modern moral philosophy, reductive approaches to the social sciences, and modern liberal individualism. The essays in the book address most of the issues that would appear a decade later in AV, but they are not synthesized into a single coherent narrative “because,” MacIntyre explains in the preface, “to rescue them from their form as reviews or essays written at a particular time or place would require that I should know how to tie these arguments together into a substantive whole. This I do not yet know how to do. . .” (ASIA, p. x). As MacIntyre himself reports, he spent the interim period from 1971 to 1977 working to bring unity to his philosophical writing (The MacIntyre Reader, p. 268-9). ASIA is a valuable companion to AV because some issues that are treated obscurely in the latter, for example Trotsky’s assessment of the Russian Revolution, are treated in detail in the former (AV, p. 262; ASIA, pp. 52-59).
ASIA’s final essay, “Political and Philosophical Epilogue: A View of The Poverty of Liberalism by Robert Paul Wolff,” introduces some of the most characteristic claims of AV: Various forms of modern liberalism appeal to different theories and principles for their justification. The theories that are used to justify liberal principles may serve as ideological masks that enable “those who profess the principles to deceive not only others but also themselves as to the character of their political action” (ASIA, p. 282). “American conservatism,” “American liberalism,” and “American radicalism” are all forms of modern liberalism, thus “To free ourselves from liberalism, radicalism is the wrong remedy.” Marxism cannot fulfill its promise to teach us how to transform society, but “we can at least learn from it where not to begin” (ASIA, p. 284).
In the Cogito interview, MacIntyre says that by 1971 he had begun to look to Aristotle as the right place to begin to study society in order to understand it and transform it. He “set out to rethink the problems of ethics in a systematic way, taking seriously for the first time the possibility that the history both of modern morality and of modern moral philosophy could only be written adequately from an Aristotelian point of view” (The MacIntyre Reader, p. 268).
For MacIntyre, “an Aristotelian point of view” sees teleology inherent in the natures of things, interprets deliberate human activity as voluntary action—not as caused behavior, and finds the human person to be naturally social. From this “Aristotelian point of view,” “modern morality” begins to go awry when moral norms are separated from the pursuit of human goods and moral behavior is treated as an end in itself. This separation characterizes Christian divine command ethics since the fourteenth century and has remained essential to secularized modern morality since the eighteenth century. From MacIntyre’s “Aristotelian point of view,” the autonomy granted to the human agent by modern moral philosophy breaks down natural human communities and isolates the individual from the kinds of formative relationships that are necessary to shape the agent into an independent practical reasoner.
In the Preface to The Tasks of Philosophy (2006), MacIntyre explains that the discontinuities of ASIA left him with the question, “How then was I to proceed philosophically?” MacIntyre’s answer came in the 1977 essay “Epistemological Crises, Dramatic Narrative, and the Philosophy of Science” (Hereafter EC). This essay, MacIntyre reports, “marks a major turning-point in my thought in the 1970s” (The Tasks of Philosophy, p. vii) EC may be described fairly as MacIntyre’s discourse on method, and as the title suggests, it presents three general points on the method for philosophy.
First, Philosophy makes progress through the resolution of problems. These problems arise when the theories, histories, doctrines and other narratives that help us to organize our experience of the world fail us, leaving us in “epistemological crises.” Epistemological crises are the aftermath of events that undermine the ways that we interpret our world. Epistemological crises may be deeply personal, triggered by unexpected betrayal or by the loss of religious faith or ideological commitment, or they may be highly speculative, brought on by the failure of trusted theories to explain our experience. To live in an epistemological crisis is to be aware that one does not know what one thought one knew about some particular subject and to be anxious to recover certainty about that subject.
To resolve an epistemological crisis it is not enough to impose some new way of interpreting our experience, we also need to understand why we were wrong before: “When an epistemological crisis is resolved, it is by the construction of a new narrative which enables the agent to understand both how he or she could intelligibly have held his or her original beliefs and how he or she could have been so drastically misled by them” (EC, in The Tasks of Philosophy, p. 5). The resolution of the crisis may lead one to recognize that human understanding is always incomplete and that progress in enquiry is therefore open ended. For MacIntyre, the resolution of an epistemological crisis cannot promise the neat clarity of a shift from a failed body of theory to a truthful one.
To illustrate his position on the open-endedness of enquiry, MacIntyre compares the title characters of Shakespeare’s Hamlet and Jane Austen’s Emma. When Emma finds that she is deeply misled in her beliefs about the other characters in her story, Mr. Knightly helps her to learn the truth and the story comes to a happy ending (p. 6). Hamlet, by contrast, finds no pat answers to his questions; rival interpretations remain throughout the play, so that directors who would stage the play have to impose their own interpretations on the script (p. 5). MacIntyre notes, “Philosophers have customarily been Emmas and not Hamlets” (p. 6); that is, philosophers have treated their conclusions as accomplished truths, rather than as “more adequate narratives” (p. 7) that remain open to further improvement.
The second point of EC addresses the relationship between narratives, truth, and education. The traditional education of children begins in myth, and as children mature they learn to distinguish the lessons of these stories from the fictional events, the truths from the myths. In the course of this education, however, the student grows to respect the myths as bearers of truth. The student who grows through this kind of education to become a scholar “may become . . . a Vico or a Hamann” (p. 8. Johann Georg Hamaan (1730-1788), Giambattista Vico (1668-1744)). Another approach to education is the method of Descartes, who begins by rejecting everything that is not clearly and distinctly true as unreliable and false in order to rebuild his understanding of the world on a foundation of undeniable truth.
Ironically, in the process of rejecting myth, Descartes creates a narrative that is not only mythical but profoundly false. Rather than identifying specific areas of crisis in which he had lost confidence in his understanding of the world and situating himself within the tradition that has formed his understanding and his enquiry, Descartes presents himself as willfully rejecting everything he had believed, and ignores his obvious debts to the Scholastic tradition, even as he argues his case in French and Latin. For MacIntyre, seeking epistemological certainty through universal doubt as a precondition for enquiry is a mistake: “it is an invitation not to philosophy but to mental breakdown, or rather to philosophy as a means of mental breakdown.” David Hume’s cry of pain in his Treatise of Human Nature is the outcome of this kind of philosophical practice (EC, pp. 10-11). MacIntyre contrasts Descartes’ descent into mythical isolation with Galileo, who was able to make progress in astronomy and physics by struggling with the apparently insoluble questions of late medieval astronomy and physics, and radically reinterpreting the issues that constituted those questions.
To make progress in philosophy one must sort through the narratives that inform one’s understanding, struggle with the questions that those narratives raise, and on occasion, reject, replace, or reinterpret portions of those narratives and propose those changes to the rest of one’s community for assessment. Human enquiry is always situated within the history and life of a community. There is no alternative ahistorical, non-traditional way to make progress in human enquiry. MacIntyre returns to this theme in WJWR (chapters 17, 18, 19), in 3RV, and in his Aquinas Lecture, “First Principles, Final Ends, and Contemporary Philosophical Issues” (1990).
The third point of EC is that we can learn about progress in philosophy from the philosophy of science. In particular, “Kuhn’s work criticized provides an illuminating application for the ideas which I have been defending” (EC, p. 15) Kuhn’s The Structure of Scientific Revolutions had argued that scientists practice normal science according to the norms of paradigms or “disciplinary matrices.” Scientific revolutions occur when scientists abandon one paradigm for another. Kuhn’s “paradigm shifts,” however, are unlike MacIntyre’s resolutions of epistemological crises in two ways. First they are not rational responses to specific problems. Kuhn compares paradigm shifts to religious conversions (pp. 150, 151, 158), stressing that they are not guided by rational norms and he claims that the “mopping up” phase of a paradigm shift is a matter of convention in the training of new scientists and attrition among the holdouts of the previous paradigm (Kuhn, pp. 152, 159). Second, the new paradigm is treated as a closed system of belief that regulates a new period of “normal science”; Kuhn’s revolutionary scientists are Emmas, not Hamlets.
MacIntyre takes Kuhn’s position as a restatement of Michael Polyani’s theory that “reason operates only within traditions and communities,” so that transitions between traditions or reconstructions of failed traditions must be irrational (EC, p. 16). On Kuhn’s account, “scientific revolutions are epistemological crises understood in a Cartesian way. Everything is put in question simultaneously” (EC, p. 17).
MacIntyre proposes elements of Imre Lakatos’ philosophy of science as correctives to Kuhn’s. While Lakatos has his own shortcomings, his general account of the methodologies of scientific research programs recognizes the role of reason in the transitions between theories and between research programs (Lakatos’ analog to Kuhn’s paradigms or disciplinary matrices). Lakatos presents science as an open ended enquiry, in which every theory may eventually be replaced by more adequate theories. For Lakatos, unlike Kuhn, rational scientific progress occurs when a new theory can account both for the apparent promise and for the actual failure of the theory it replaces. The third conclusion of MacIntyre’s essay is that decisions to support some theories over others may be justified rationally to the extent that those theories allow us to understand our experience and our history, including the history of the failures of inadequate theories. EC answers the question that arose from ASIA of how to proceed philosophically. All of MacIntyre’s mature work uses and develops the methodology presented in this essay.
AV (1981, 2nd ed. 1984, 3rd ed. 2007) applies the methodology of EC to many of the same issues addressed in ASIA and in SHE, but interprets the history of ethics and the failure of modern moral philosophy in Aristotelian terms. For Aristotle, moral philosophy is a study of practical reasoning, and the excellences or virtues that Aristotle recommends in the Nicomachean Ethics are the intellectual and moral excellences that make a moral agent effective as an independent practical reasoner. AV criticizes modern liberal individualism and scientific determinism for separating practical reasoning from morality and political life; it proposes instead a return to Aristotelian ethics and politics.
The critical argument of AV, which makes up the first half of the book, begins by examining the current condition of secular moral and political discourse. MacIntyre finds contending parties defending their decisions by appealing to abstract moral principles, but he finds their appeals eclectic, inconsistent, and incoherent. MacIntyre also finds that the contending parties have little interest in the rational justification of the principles they use. The language of moral philosophy has become a kind of moral rhetoric to be used to manipulate others in defense of the arbitrary choices of its users. What Stevenson had said incorrectly about the meaning of moral judgments has come to be true of the use of moral judgments. MacIntyre reinterprets “emotivism,” Stevenson’s “false theory of meaning” as a “cogent theory of use,” and he names the culture that uses moral rhetoric pragmatically and syncretically “the culture of emotivism.”
MacIntyre traces the lineage of the culture of emotivism to the secularized Protestant cultures of northern Europe (AV, p. 37). These cultures had abandoned any connection between an agent’s natural telos, personal desires, or pursuit of goods and that same agent’s moral duties when they had adopted the divine command moralities of fourteenth, fifteenth, and sixteenth century Christian moral theology. The secular moral philosophers of the eighteenth and nineteenth centuries shared strong and extensive agreements about the content of morality (AV, p. 51) and believed that their moral philosophy could justify the demands of their morality rationally, free from religious authority.
Modern moral philosophy had thus set for itself an incoherent goal. It was to vindicate both the moral autonomy of the individual and the objectivity, necessity, and categorical character of the rules of morality (AV, p. 62). MacIntyre surveys the best efforts to achieve the goals of modern moral philosophy but dismisses each one as a moral fiction.
Given the failure of modern moral philosophy, MacIntyre turns to an apparent alternative, the pragmatic expertise of professional managers. Managers are expected to appeal to the facts to make their decisions on the objective basis of effectiveness, and their authority to do this is based on their knowledge of the social sciences. An examination of the social sciences reveals, however, that many of the facts to which managers appeal depend on sociological theories that lack scientific status. Thus, the predictions and demands of bureaucratic managers are no less liable to ideological manipulation than the determinations of modern moral philosophers.
If modern morality has been revealed to be “a theater of illusions,” then we must reject it, and this rejection can take two forms. Either we follow Nietzsche and defend the autonomy of the individual against the arbitrary demands of conventional moral reasoning, or we reject both moral autonomy and arbitrary conventional moral reasoning to follow Aristotle and investigate practical reason and the role of moral formation in preparing the human agent to succeed as an independent practical reasoner.
The critical argument of AV raises serious questions about the rational justification of modern moral philosophy, and it also proposes an explanation for the rational failure of modern moral philosophy: Modern moral philosophy separates moral reasoning about duties and obligations from practical reasoning about ends and practical deliberation about the means to one’s ends, and in doing so it separates morality from practice. Kant separates moral and practical reasoning explicitly in The Critique of Pure Reason (Critique of Pure Reason, A800/B828–A819/B847) and in The Foundations of the Metaphysics of Morals (First Section, pp. 393-405.); Mill makes the same separation in Utilitarianism (chapter 2).
MacIntyre compares the separation of morality from practice or the separation of moral reasoning from practical reasoning in modern moral philosophy to the separation of morality from practice in Polynesian taboo. The Polynesians had lost the practical justifications for their well-established moral customs by the time they first made contact with European explorers; so when they told these visitors that certain practices were forbidden because those practices were “taboo,” they were unable to explain why these practices were forbidden or what, precisely, “taboo” meant. Many Europeans also lost the practical justifications for their moral norms as they approached modernity; for these Europeans, claiming that certain practices are “immoral,” and invoking Kant’s categorical imperative or Mill’s principle of utility to explain why those practices are immoral, seems no more adequate than the Polynesian appeal to taboo. The comparison between modern morality and taboo is a recurring theme in MacIntyre’s ethical work.
MacIntyre’s critique of the separation of morality from practice also draws on his criticism of determinist social science. Practice involves free and deliberate human action, while morality divorced from practice regulates only outward human behavior. Determinist social scientists, notably Stalinists but also behaviorists like W.V. Quine, viewed human behaviors as determined responses to various kinds of causal factors, and refused to examine the things people do in terms of “intentions, purposes, and reasons for action” (Quine, quoted in AV, p. 83). Instead, determinist social scientists sought “law-like generalizations” about the connections of these causes to their behavioral effects, which would enable them to predict human behavior, and bring scientific understanding to the work of organizational management (AV, pp. 88–91).
In the second half of AV, MacIntyre explores the moral tradition that examines human judgment, human weakness, and excellence in human action. The constructive argument of the second half of the book begins with traditional accounts of the excellences or virtues of practical reasoning and practical rationality rather than virtues of moral reasoning or morality. These traditional accounts define virtue as arête, as excellence, and all of the definitions offered in the second half of AV describe the excellence of the human agent who judges well and acts effectively in pursuit of desired ends. MacIntyre sifts these definitions and then gives his own definition of virtue, as excellence in human agency, in terms of practices, whole human lives, and traditions in chapters 14 and 15 of AV.
In the most often quoted sentence of AV, MacIntyre defines a practice as (1) a complex social activity that (2) enables participants to gain goods internal to the practice. (3) Participants achieve excellence in practices by gaining the internal goods. When participants achieve excellence, (4) the social understandings of excellence in the practice, of the goods of the practice, and of the possibility of achieving excellence in the practice “are systematically extended” (AV, p. 187).
Practices, like chess, medicine, architecture, mechanical engineering, football, or politics, offer their practitioners a variety of goods both internal and external to these practices. The goods internal to practices include forms of understanding or physical abilities that can be acquired only by pursuing excellence in the associated practice. Goods external to practices include wealth, fame, prestige, and power; there are many ways to gain these external goods. They can be earned or purchased, either honestly or through deception; thus the pursuit of these external goods may conflict with the pursuit of the goods internal to practices.
MacIntyre illustrates the conflict between the pursuits of internal and external goods in the parable of the chess playing child. An intelligent child is given the opportunity to win candy by learning to play chess. As long as the child plays chess only to win candy, he has every reason to cheat if by doing so he can win more candy. If the child begins to desire and pursue the goods internal to chess, however, cheating becomes irrational, because it is impossible to gain the goods internal to chess or any other practice except through an honest pursuit of excellence. Goods external to practices may nevertheless remain tempting to the practitioner.
Practices are supported by institutions like chess clubs, hospitals, universities, industrial corporations, sports leagues, and political organizations. Practices exist in tension with these institutions, since the institutions tend to be oriented to goods external to practices. Universities, hospitals, and scholarly societies may value prestige, profitability, or relations with political interest groups above excellence in the practices they are said to support.
Personal desires and institutional pressures to pursue external goods may threaten to derail practitioners’ pursuits of the goods internal to practices. MacIntyre defines virtue initially as the quality of character that enables an agent to overcome these temptations: “A virtue is an acquired human quality the possession and exercise of which tends to enable us to achieve those goods which are internal to practices and the lack of which effectively prevents us from achieving any such goods” (AV, p. 191).
MacIntyre finds that this first level definition is inadequate to describe an excellent human agent. It is not enough to be an excellent navigator, physician, or builder; the excellent human agent lives an excellent life. Excellence as a human agent cannot be reduced to excellence in a particular practice (See AV, pp. 204–205, and Ethics and Politics, pp. 196–7). MacIntyre therefore adds a second level to his definition of virtue.
The virtues therefore are to be understood as those dispositions which will not only sustain practices and enable us to achieve the goods internal to practices, but which will also sustain us in the relevant kind of quest for the good, by enabling us to overcome the harms, dangers, temptations, and distractions which we encounter, and which will furnish us with increasing self-knowledge and increasing knowledge of the good (AV, p. 219).
The excellent human agent has the moral qualities to seek what is good and best both in practices and in life as a whole.
The second level definition is still inadequate, however, because it does not take into account the individual’s response to the life and legacy of her or his community. MacIntyre rejects individualism and insists that we view human beings as members of communities who bear specific debts and responsibilities because of our social identities. The responsibilities one may inherit as a member of a community include debts to one’s forbearers that one can only repay to people in the present and future. These responsibilities also include debts incurred by the unjust actions of ones’ predecessors.
MacIntyre acknowledges that contemporary individualism insists that “the self is detachable from its social and historical roles and statuses” (AV, p. 221), but he illustrates his counterpoint point with three national communities in which contemporary citizens continue to bear the debts of their predecessors. The enslavement and oppression of black Americans, the subjugation of Ireland, and the genocide of the Jews in Europe remained quite relevant to the responsibilities of citizens of the United States, England, and Germany in 1981, as they still do today. Thus an American who said “I never owned any slaves,” “the Englishman who says ‘I never did any wrong to Ireland,’” or “the young German who believes that being born after 1945 means that what Nazis did to Jews has no moral relevance to his relationship to his Jewish contemporaries” all exhibit a kind of intellectual and moral failure. “I am born with a past, and to cut myself off from that past in the individualist mode, is to deform my present relationships” (p. 221). For MacIntyre, there is no moral identity for the abstract individual; “The self has to find its moral identity in and through its membership in communities” (p. 221).
Since MacIntyre finds social identity necessary for the individual, MacIntyre’s definition of the excellence or virtue of the human agent needs a social dimension:
The virtues find their point and purpose not only in sustaining those relationships necessary if the variety of goods internal to practices are to be achieved and not only in sustaining the form of an individual life in which that individual may seek out his or her good as the good of his or her whole life, but also in sustaining those traditions which provide both practices and individual lives with their necessary historical context (AV, p. 223).
This third, social, level completes MacIntyre’s account of the excellence of the human agent in AV.
The remaining chapters of AV contrast MacIntyre’s Aristotelian notion of the virtues as excellences of character from modern notions of virtue as the quality of a person who obeys moral rules. These chapters also lay out some of the practical implications of MacIntyre’s Aristotelian project for contemporary ethics and politics. The loss of teleology makes morality appear arbitrary (AV, p. 236), separates moral reason from practical and political reasoning (AV, p. 236), and removes the notion of what one deserves from modern notions of justice (AV, p. 249). MacIntyre concludes that “modern systematic politics . . . expresses in its institutional forms a systematic rejection” of the Aristotelian tradition of the virtues and therefore “has to be rejected” by those who commit themselves to the tradition of the virtues (AV, p. 255). In other words, those who approach moral and political philosophy in terms of the development of the human agent and the advancement of practical reasoning in the context of the life of a community cannot succeed in their task if they compromise their work by committing themselves to the arbitrary goals, methods, and language of modern politics.
At the end of the argument of AV, MacIntyre returns to the ultimatum of chapter 10, “Nietzsche or Aristotle.” Where Nietzsche intended his work as a critique of modern morality, Nietzsche in fact becomes the ultimate embodiment of the moral isolation and arbitrariness of modern liberal individualism. This fault remains invisible from a modern viewpoint, but when viewed from the perspective of the Aristotelian tradition of the virtues, it is quite clear (AV, pp. 258-259).
Since “goods, and with them the only grounds for the authority of laws and virtues, can only be discovered by entering into those relationships which constitute communities whose central bond is a shared vision of and understanding of goods” (AV, p. 258), any hope for the transformation and renewal of society depends on the development and maintenance of such communities. Revolution cannot be imposed (AV, p. 238), although it may be cultivated. To wait “for another—doubtless very different—St. Benedict,” is to await a person who can unify communities that encourage moral formation in judgment and action.
MacIntyre’s Aristotelian approach to ethics as a study of human action distinguishes him from post-Kantian moral philosophers who approach ethics as a means of determining the demands of objective, impersonal, universal morality. This modern approach may be described as moral epistemology. Modern moral philosophy pretends to free the individual to determine for her- or himself what she or he must do in a given situation, irrespective of her or his own desires; it pretends to give knowledge of universal moral laws. MacIntyre rejects modern ethical theories as deceptive and self-deceiving masks for conventional morality and for arbitrary interventions against traditions. For MacIntyre, the freedom of self-determination is the freedom to recognize and pursue one’s good, and moral philosophy liberates the agent, in part, by helping the human agent to desire what is good and best, and to choose what is good and best.
MacIntyre’s ethics of human action also distinguishes his later Thomistic work from the efforts of some twentieth-century neo-Thomists to craft a moral epistemology out of Thomas Aquinas’s metaphysics and natural law. AV argues that an Aristotelian ethics of virtue may remain possible, without appealing to Aristotle’s metaphysics of nature. This claim remains controversial for two different, but closely related reasons.
Many of those who rejected MacIntyre’s turn to Aristotle define “virtue” primarily along moral lines, as obedience to law or adherence to some kind of natural norm. For these critics, “virtuous” appears synonymous with “morally correct;” their resistance to MacIntyre’s appeal to virtue stems from their difficulties either with what they take to be the shortcomings of MacIntyre’s account of moral correctness or with the notion of moral correctness altogether. Thus one group of critics rejects MacIntyre’s Aristotelianism because they hold that any Aristotelian account of the virtues must first account for the truth about virtue in terms of Aristotle’s philosophy of nature, which MacIntyre had dismissed in AV as “metaphysical biology” (AV, pp. 162, 179). Aristotelian metaphysicians, particularly Thomists who define virtue in terms of the perfection of nature, rejected MacIntyre’s contention that an adequate Aristotelian account of virtue as excellence in practical reasoning and human action need not appeal to Aristotelian metaphysics. Another group of critics, including materialists, dismissed MacIntyre’s attempt to recover an Aristotelian account of the virtues because they took those virtues to presuppose an indefensible metaphysical doctrine of nature.
A few years after the publication of AV, MacIntyre became a Thomist and accepted that the teleology of human action flowed from a metaphysical foundation in the nature of the human person (WJWR, ch. 10; AV, 3rd ed., p. xi). Nonetheless, MacIntyre has the main points of his ethics and politics of human action have remained the same. MacIntyre continues to argue toward an Aristotelian account of practical reasoning through the investigation of practice. Even though he has accepted Thomistic metaphysics, he seldom argues from metaphysical premises, and when pressed to explain the metaphysical foundations of his ethics, he has demurred. MacIntyre continues to argue from the experience of practical reasoning to the demands of moral education. MacIntyre’s work in WJWR, DRA, The Tasks of Philosophy, Ethics and Politics, and God, Philosophy, University continue to exemplify the phenomenological approach to moral education that MacIntyre took in After Virtue.
Contemporary scholars have defended MacIntyre’s unconventional Aristotelianism by challenging the conventions that MacIntyre is said to violate. Christopher Stephen Lutz examined some of the reasons for rejecting “Aristotle’s metaphysical biology” and assessed the compatibility of MacIntyre’s philosophy with that of Thomas Aquinas in Tradition in the Ethics of Alasdair MacIntyre (2004, pp. 133-140). Kelvin Knight took a broader approach in Aristotelian Philosophy: Ethics and Politics from Aristotle to MacIntyre (2007). Knight examined the ethics and politics of human action found in Aristotle and traced the development of that project through medieval and modern thought to MacIntyre. Knight distinguishes Aristotle’s ethics of human action from his metaphysics and shows how it is possible for MacIntyre to retrieve Aristotle’s ethics of human action without first defending Aristotle’s metaphysical account of nature.
For MacIntyre, “rationality” comprises all the intellectual resources, both formal and substantive, that we use to judge truth and falsity in propositions, and to determine choice-worthiness in courses of action. Rationality in this sense is not universal; it differs from community to community and from person to person, and may both develop and regress over the course of a person’s life or a community’s history. MacIntyre describes this culturally relative, even subjective characteristic of rationality in the first chapter of WJWR (1988):
So rationality itself, whether theoretical or practical, is a concept with a history: indeed, since there are also a diversity of traditions of enquiry, with histories, there are, so it will turn out, rationalities rather than rationality, just as it will also turn out that there are justices rather than justice (WJWR, p. 9).
Rationality is the collection of theories, beliefs, principles, and facts that the human subject uses to judge the world, and a person’s rationality is, to a large extent, the product of that person’s education and moral formation.
To the extent that a person accepts what is handed down from the moral and intellectual traditions of her or his community in learning to judge truth and falsity, good and evil, that person’s rationality is “tradition-constituted.” Tradition-constituted rationality provides the schemata by which we interpret, understand, and judge the world we live in. The apparent reasonableness of mythical explanations, religious doctrines, scientific theories, and the conflicting demands of the world’s moral codes all depend on the tradition-constituted rationalities of those who judge them. For this reason, some of MacIntyre’s critics have argued that tradition-constituted rationality entails an absolute relativism in philosophy.
The apparent problem of relativism in MacIntyre’s theory of rationality is much like the problem of relativism in the philosophy of science. Scientific claims develop within larger theoretical frameworks, so that the apparent truth of a scientific claim depends on one’s judgment of the larger framework. The resolution of the problem of relativism therefore appears to hang on the possibility of judging frameworks or rationalities, or judging between frameworks or rationalities from a position that does not presuppose the truth of the framework or rationality, but no such theoretical standpoint is humanly possible. Nonetheless, MacIntyre finds that the world itself provides the criterion for the testing of rationalities, and he finds that there is no criterion except the world itself that can stand as the measure of the truth of any philosophical theory. So MacIntyre balances the relativity of rationality against the objectivity of the world that we investigate. As Popper and Lakatos found in the philosophy of science, MacIntyre concludes that experience can falsify theory, releasing people from the apparent authority of traditional rationalities.
MacIntyre holds that the rationality of individuals is not only tradition-constituted, it is also tradition constitutive, as individuals make their own contributions to their own rationality, and to the rationalities of their communities. Rationality is not fixed, within either the history of a community or the life of a person. Unexplainable events can occur that reveal shortcomings in a person’s rational resources, like the anomalous data that precipitate scientific revolutions in Thomas Kuhn’s The Structure of Scientific Revolutions or demand changes in research programmes in Imre Lakatos’ The Methodology of Scientific Research Programmes. Problems exposed by anomalous data or by conflicts with other traditions, other communities, or other people may prove rationally insoluble under the constraints that a given tradition places on rationality. Such events, when fully recognized, demand creative solutions, and it may happen that some person or group will discover what appears to be a more adequate response to those problems. To the extent that these new solutions are adopted by others and passed on to subsequent generations (for better or for worse), the rationality of those responsible for the new approach becomes “tradition-constitutive.”
The possibility that experience may falsify theory distinguishes MacIntyre’s theory of tradition-constituted and tradition-constitutive rationality from forms of relativism that make rationality entirely tradition-dependent or entirely subjective. Nonetheless, MacIntyre denies that such falsification is common (WJWR, chs. 18 and 19), and history shows us that individuals, communities, and even whole nations may commit themselves militantly over long periods of their histories to doctrines that their ideological adversaries find irrational. This qualified relativism of appearances has troublesome implications for anyone who believes that philosophical enquiry can easily provide certain knowledge of the world. According to MacIntyre, theories govern the ways that we interpret the world and no theory is ever more than “the best standards so far” (3RV, p. 65). Our theories always remain open to improvement, and when our theories change, the appearances of our world—the apparent truths of claims judged within those theoretical frameworks—change with them.
From the subjective standpoint of the human enquirer, MacIntyre finds that theories, concepts, and facts all have histories, and they are all liable to change—for better or for worse. MacIntyre’s philosophy offers a decisive refutation of modern epistemology, even as it maintains philosophy is a quest for truth. MacIntyre’s philosophy is indebted to the philosophy of science, which recognizes the historicism of scientific enquiry even as it seeks a truthful understanding of the world. MacIntyre’s philosophy does not offer a priori certainty about any theory or principle; it examines the ways in which reflection upon experience supports, challenges, or falsifies theories that have appeared to be the best theories so far to the people who have accepted them so far. MacIntyre’s ideal enquirers remain Hamlets, not Emmas.
WJWR presents MacIntyre’s most thorough argument for his theory of rationality. He summarizes the main points of his theory in chapter 1. In chapters 2 through 16, MacIntyre follows the progress of the Western tradition through “three distinct traditions:” from Homer and Aristotle to Thomas Aquinas, from Augustine to Thomas Aquinas and from Augustine through Calvin to Hume (WJWR, p. 326). The inhabitants of these traditions work to deepen, correct, and extend the claims and theories of their predecessors. Chapter 17 examines the modern liberal denial of tradition, and the ironic transformation of liberalism into the fourth tradition to be treated in the book. Chapter 18 reviews MacIntyre’s claims and conclusions concerning the tradition-constituted nature and tradition-constitutive power of human rationality. Chapters 19 and 20 explore the consequences of MacIntyre’s theory for conflicts between traditions.
WJWR fulfills a promise made at the end of AV: “I promised a book in which I should attempt to say both what makes it rational to act in one way rather than another and what makes it rational to advance and defend one conception of practical rationality rather than another. Here it is” (p. 9). To fulfill this promise, MacIntyre opens the book by arguing that “the Enlightenment made us . . . blind to . . . a conception of rational enquiry as embodied in a tradition, a conception according to which the standards of rational justification themselves emerge from and are part of a history.” From the standpoint of human enquiry, no group can arrogate to itself the authority to guide everyone else toward the good. We can only struggle together in our quests for justice and truth and each community consequently frames and revises its own standards of justice and rationality. MacIntyre concludes that neither reason nor justice is universal: “since there are a diversity of traditions of enquiry, with histories, there are, so it will turn out, rationalities rather than rationality, just as it will also turn out that there are justices rather than justice” (p. 9).
The thesis that rationalities and justices arise from the histories and traditions of communities sets MacIntyre squarely at odds with all modern philosophy, and particularly with the unacknowledged imperialism of any form of metaethics that would offer a neutral, third-party forum in which to adjudicate the practical differences between contending moral traditions by the peculiar standards of modern liberal individualism. The same thesis also appears to set MacIntyre at odds with the traditions of Aristotle and Thomas Aquinas—traditions he claims to accept and defend—which make unambiguous claims about the universal nature, true reason, and objective justice. The book therefore has two tasks. On the one hand, the book relates the histories of particular rationalities and justices in a way that undermines the abstract universal notions of reason and justice that provide the foundations for modern moral and political thought. On the other hand, the book provides prima facie evidence
that those who have thought their way through the topics of justice and practical rationality, from the standpoint constructed by and in the direction pointed out first by Aristotle and then by Aquinas, have every reason at least so far to hold that the rationality of their tradition has been confirmed by its encounters with other traditions (p. 403).
In short, the book offers an internal critique of modernity, arguing that it is incoherent by its own standards, and it offers an internal justification of Thomism, holding that Thomism is rationally justified, for Thomists, by Thomist standards. Contrary to initial expectations, MacIntyre’s historicist, particularist critique of modernity is compatible with the historically situated Thomist tradition.
MacIntyre holds that his historicist, particularist critique of modernity is consistent with Thomism because of the way that he understands the acquisition of first principles. In chapter 10 (pp. 164-182), MacIntyre compares Thomas Aquinas’s account of the acquisition of first principles with those of Descartes, Hobbes, Hume, Bentham, and Kant. MacIntyre explains that according to Thomas Aquinas, individuals reach first principles through “a work of dialectical construction” (p. 174). For Thomas Aquinas, by questioning and examining one’s experience, one may eventually arrive at first principles, which one may then apply to the understanding of one’s questions and experience. Descartes and his successors, by contrast, along with certain “notable Thomists of the last hundred years” (p. 175), have proposed that philosophy begins from knowledge of some “set of necessarily true first principles which any truly rational person is able to evaluate as true” (p. 175). Thus for the moderns, philosophy is a technical rather than moral endeavor, while for the Thomist, whether one might recognize first principles or be able to apply them depends in part on one’s moral development (pp. 186-182).
The modern account of first principles justifies an approach to philosophy that rejects tradition. The modern liberal individualist approach is anti-traditional. It denies that our understanding is tradition-constituted and it denies that different cultures may differ in their standards of rationality and justice:
The standpoint of traditions is necessarily at odds with one of the central characteristics of cosmopolitan modernity: the confident belief that all cultural phenomena must be potentially translucent to understanding, that all texts must be capable of being translated into the language which the adherents of modernity speak to one another (p. 327)
Modernity does not see tradition as the key that unlocks moral and political understanding, but as a superfluous accumulation of opinions that tend to prejudice moral and political reasoning.
Although modernity rejects tradition as a method of moral and political enquiry, MacIntyre finds that it nevertheless bears all the characteristics of a moral and political tradition. MacIntyre identifies the peculiar standards of the liberal tradition in the latter part of chapter 17, and summarizes the story of the liberal tradition at the outset of chapter 18:
Liberalism, beginning as a repudiation of tradition in the name of abstract, universal principles of reason, turned itself into a politically embodied power, whose inability to bring its debates on the nature and context of those universal principles to a conclusion has had the unintended effect of transforming liberalism into a tradition (p. 349).
From MacIntyre’s perspective, there is no question of deciding whether or not to work within a tradition; everyone who struggles with practical, moral, and political questions simply does. “There is no standing ground, no place for enquiry . . . apart from that which is provided by some particular tradition or other” (p. 350). MacIntyre calls his position “the rationality of traditions.”
MacIntyre distinguishes two related challenges to his position, the “relativist challenge” and the “perspectivist challenge.” These two challenges both acknowledge that the goals of the Enlightenment cannot be met and that, “the only available standards of rationality are those made available by and within traditions” (p. 252); they conclude that nothing can be known to be true or false. For these post-modern theorists, “if the Enlightenment conceptions of truth and rationality cannot be sustained,” either relativism or perspectivism “is the only possible alternative” (p. 353). MacIntyre rejects both challenges by developing his theory of tradition-constituted and tradition-constitutive rationality on pp. 354-369.
How, then, is one to settle challenges between two traditions? It depends on whether the adherents of either take the challenges of the other tradition seriously. It depends on whether the adherents of either tradition, on seeing a failure in their own tradition are willing to consider an answer offered by their rival (p. 355). There is nothing in MacIntyre’s account of the rationality of traditions that suggest that the superior traditions will vanquish inferior ones, or to provide any analogue to the modern, enlightenment, or Cartesian epistemological first principles that he rejected in his critique of the modern liberal individualist tradition.
MacIntyre emphasizes the role of tradition in the final chapter of the book by asking how a person with no traditional affiliation is to deal with the conflicting claims of rival traditions: “The initial answer is: that will depend upon who you are and how you understand yourself. This is not the kind of answer which we have been educated to expect in philosophy” (p. 393). Such a person might, through some process of reflection on experience and engagement with the claims of one tradition or another, join a tradition whose claims and standards appear compelling, but there is no guarantee of that. MacIntyre’s conclusion is that enquiry is situated within traditions.
WJWR is more than a restatement of the history from AV. AV had argued that an Aristotelian view of moral philosophy as a study of human action could make sense of the failure of modern moral philosophy while modern liberal individualism could not. Aristotelian and Thomist critics complained, however, that MacIntyre’s Aristotelianism, which sought its foundation in teleological activity rather than teleological metaphysics, remained open to the challenge that it was relativistic. WJWR advances the argument of AV in two ways. First, MacIntyre focuses the critique of modernity on the question of rational justification. Modern epistemology stands or falls on the possibility of Cartesian epistemological first principles. MacIntyre’s history exposes that notion of first principle as a fiction, and at the same time demonstrates that rational enquiry advances (or declines) only through tradition. Second, MacIntyre trades the social teleology of AV for a Thomist, metaphysical teleology. MacIntyre justifies this trade in terms acceptable within the Thomist tradition, and acknowledges that those who find Thomism irrational will find little reason to accept it (WJWR P. 403). This general conclusion remained troubling for Aristotelians, and particularly for those Neo-Thomists whose Neo-Scholastic tradition bore debts to the Cartesian tradition.
MacIntyre presented his theory of rationality again in his 1988 Gifford Lectures, published as Three Rival Versions of Moral Enquiry (1990). The central idea of the Gifford Lectures is that philosophers make progress by addressing the shortcomings of traditional narratives about the world, shortcomings that become visible either through the failure of traditional narratives to make sense of experience, or through the introduction of contradictory narratives that prove impossible to dismiss. This vision of progress in philosophy is the same as that of EC, and WJWR, but the presentation is different. In this book, MacIntyre compares three traditions exemplified by three literary works published near the end of Adam Gifford’s life (1820–1887); a bequest of Lord Gifford’s will funds the Gifford Lectures. The Ninth Edition of the Encyclopaedia Britannica (1875–1889) represents the modern tradition of trying to understand the world objectively without the influence of tradition. The Genealogy of Morals (1887), by Friedrich Nietzsche embodies the post-modern tradition of interpreting all traditions as arbitrary impositions of power. The encyclical letter Aeterni Patris (1879) of Pope Leo XIII exemplifies the approach of acknowledging one’s predecessors within one’s own tradition of enquiry and working to advance or improve that tradition in the pursuit of objective truth. Of the three versions of moral enquiry treated in 3RV, only tradition, exemplified in 3RV by the Aristotelian, Thomistic tradition, understands itself as a tradition that looks backward to predecessors in order to understand present questions and move forward. Encyclopaedia, concerns itself only with present facts, and leaves the problems of intellectual history to others. Genealogy defends an historicist interpretation of the past to undermine what it takes to be irrational moral convictions in the present. MacIntyre argues that Encyclopaedists and Genealogists deceive themselves in their rejections of the method of tradition.
Encyclopaedia obscures the role of tradition by presenting the most current conclusions and convictions of a tradition as if they had no history, and as if they represented the final discovery of unalterable truth. In this sense, Encyclopaedia represents the epistemological “Emmas” of MacIntyre’s 1977 essay, EC. Encyclopaedists focus on the present and ignore the past.
Genealogists, on the other hand, focus on the past in order to undermine the claims of the present. The “Nietzschean research program” has three uses for history: (1) to reduce academic history to a projection of the concerns of modern historians, (2) to dissipate the identity of the historian into a collection of inherited cultural influences, and (3) to undermine the notion of “progress towards truth and reason” (3RV, pp. 49-50). In short, Genealogy denies the teleology of human enquiry by denying (1) that historical enquiry has been fruitful, (2) that the enquiring person has a real identity, and (3) that enquiry has a real goal. MacIntyre finds this mode of enquiry incoherent.
To provide an example of the incoherence of the Genealogical mode of enquiry MacIntyre turns to Foucault and begins by describing the “self-endangering paradox” Foucault—or anyone who would maintain and extend the Nietzschean research program—must face: “the insights conferred by this post-Nietzschean understanding of the uses of history are themselves liable to subvert the project of understanding the project” (3RV, p. 50). MacIntyre argues against each of the three Nietzschean uses of history, beginning with the denial of the fruitfulness of the study.
MacIntyre cites Foucault’s 1966 book, Les Mots et les choses (The Order of Things, 1970) as an example of the self-subverting character of Genealogical enquiry. Foucault’s book reduces history to a procession of “incommensurable ordered schemes of classification and representation” none of which has any greater claim to truth than any other, yet this book “is itself organized as a scheme of classification and representation.” In the light of its own account of history, it seems difficult to justify the claims of the book rationally. If historical narratives are only projections of the interests of historians, then it is difficult to see how this historical narrative can claim to be truthful.
Genealogical moral enquiry cannot make sense of its own claims without exempting those claims from its general critique of similar claims. Genealogical moral enquiry must make similar exceptions to its treatments of the unity of the enquiring subject and the teleology of moral enquiry; thus “it seems to be the case that the intelligibility of genealogy requires beliefs and allegiances of a kind precluded by the genealogical stance” (3RV, p. 54-55). Genealogy is self-deceiving insofar as it ignores the traditional and teleological character of its enquiry.
3RV uses Thomism as its example of tradition, but this use should not suggest that MacIntyre identifies “tradition” with Thomism or Thomism-as-a-name-for-the-Western-tradition. As noted above, WJWR distinguished four traditions of enquiry within the Western European world alone (WJWR, p. 349). MacIntyre uses Thomism because it applies the traditional mode of enquiry in a self-conscious manner. Thomistic students learn the work of philosophical enquiry as apprentices in a craft (3RV, p. 61), and maintain the principles of the tradition in their work to extend the understanding of the tradition, even as they remain open to the criticism of those principles.
Tradition differs from both encyclopaedia and genealogy in the way it understands the place of its theories in the history of human enquiry. The adherent of a tradition must understand that “the rationality of a craft is justified by its history so far,” thus it “is inseparable from the tradition through which it was achieved” (3RV, p. 65). To justify the claims of a tradition is to recount how the tradition has developed and understood those claims so far. To master a tradition is also “a matter of knowing how to go further, and especially how to direct others towards going further, using what can be learned from the tradition afforded by the past to move towards the telos of fully perfected work” (3RV, pp. 65-66). Tradition is not merely conservative; it remains open to improvement, and in the 1977 essay EC, it is Hamlet, not Emma, who exemplifies the traditional mode of enquiry.
MacIntyre’s emphasis on the temporality of rationality in traditional enquiry makes tradition incompatible with the epistemological projects of modern philosophy (3RV, pp. 69).
MacIntyre uses Thomas Aquinas to illustrate the revolutionary potential of traditional enquiry. Thomas was educated in Augustinian theology and Aristotelian philosophy, and through this education he began to see not only the contradictions between the two traditions, but also the strengths and weaknesses that each tradition revealed in the other. His education also helped him to discover a host of questions and problems that had to be answered and solved. Many of Thomas Aquinas’ responses to these concerns took the form of disputed questions. “Yet to each question the answer produced by Aquinas as a conclusion is no more than and, given Aquinas’s method, cannot but be no more than, the best answer reached so far. And hence derives the essential incompleteness” (3RV, p. 124). Thomas Aquinas, viewed as practicing the traditional mode of enquiry, is one influential practitioner within a tradition and his writings are contributions to that tradition, rather than collections of unassailable final conclusions. MacIntyre’s Thomistic responses to encyclopedia and genealogy in chapters eight and nine show that MacIntyre does not view the Thomistic tradition in particular, or the traditional mode of enquiry in general, as closed, static, or essentially conservative.
MacIntyre’s Carus Lectures, Dependent Rational Animals: Why Human Beings Need the Virtues (1999), put MacIntyre’s theory of rationality into practice to examine the conditions of human action and to argue that the virtues are essential to the practice of independent practical reason. The book is relentlessly practical; its arguments appeal only to experience and to purposes, and to the logic of practical reasoning.
DRA does not make metaphysical assertions about the human soul, or human dignity, or human rights, or natural law; it treats the human agent as an animal. “Human identity is primarily . . . bodily and therefore animal identity and it is by reference to that identity that the continuities of our relationships to others are partly defined” (DRA, p. 8). Like other intelligent animals, human beings enter life vulnerable, weak, untrained, and unknowing, and face the likelihood of infirmity in sickness and in old age. Like other social animals, humans flourish in groups. We learn to regulate our passions, and to act effectively alone and in concert with others through an education provided within a community. MacIntyre’s position allows him to look to the animal world to find analogies to the role of social relationships in the moral formation of human beings (DRA, pp. 21-28).
In chapter 8, MacIntyre turns to the moral development of the human agent. The task for the human child is to make “the transition from the infantile exercise of animal intelligence to the exercise of independent practical reasoning” (DRA, p. 87). For a child to make this transition is “to redirect and transform her or his desires, and subsequently to direct them consistently towards the goods of different stages of her or his life” (DRA, p. 87). The development of independent practical reason in the human agent requires the moral virtues in at least three ways.
As in his earlier writings, including his MA thesis, DRA presents moral knowledge as a “knowing how,” rather than as a “knowing that.” Knowledge of moral rules is not sufficient for a moral life; prudence is required to enable the agent to apply the rules well. “Knowing how to act virtuously always involves more than rule-following” (DRA, p. 93). The prudent person can judge what must be done in the absence of a rule and can also judge when general norms cannot be applied to particular cases.
Flourishing as an independent practical reasoner requires the virtues in a second way, simply because sometimes we need our friends to tell us who we really are. Independent practical reasoning also requires self-knowledge, but self-knowledge is impossible without the input of others whose judgment provides a reliable touchstone to test our beliefs about ourselves. Self-knowledge therefore requires the virtues that enable an agent to sustain formative relationships and to accept the criticism of trusted friends (DRA, p. 97).
Human flourishing requires the virtues in a third way, by making it possible to participate in social and political action. They enable us to “protect ourselves and others against neglect, defective sympathies, stupidity, acquisitiveness, and malice” (DRA, p. 98) by enabling us to form and sustain social relationships through which we may care for one another in our infirmities, and pursue common goods with and for the other members of our societies.
The book moves from MacIntyre’s assessment of human needs for the virtues to the political implications of that assessment. Social and political institutions that form and enable independent practical reasoning must “satisfy three conditions.” (1) They must enable their members to participate in shared deliberations about the communities’ actions. (2) They must establish norms of justice “consistent with exercise of” the virtue of justice. (3) They must enable the strong “to stand proxy” as advocates for the needs of the weak and the disabled.
The social and political institutions that MacIntyre recommends cannot be identified with the modern nation state or the modern nuclear family. Modern nation states, which MacIntyre characterizes as “giant utility companies” (DRA, p. 132) are organized to provide services, not to pursue a common good. The nuclear family is too small to allow the self-sufficiency required for the political community that pursues a common good (DRA, p. 133-5). The political structures necessary for human flourishing are essentially local. MacIntyre says, “It is . . . a mistake, the communitarian mistake, to attempt to infuse the politics of the state with the values and modes of participation in local community” (DRA, p. 142). Yet local communities support human flourishing only when they actively support “the virtues of just generosity and shared deliberation” (DRA, p. 142). To find examples of the kinds of local communities that support human flourishing, MacIntyre suggests investigations of “fishing communities in New England . . . Welsh mining communities . . . farming cooperatives in Donegal, Mayan towns in Guatemala and Mexico”( DRA, p. 143).
Coming to the conclusion that moral knowledge and understanding develops within, and is partly constituted by social relationships within particular local communities that require their members to commit themselves to the moral narratives and norms of those communities, MacIntyre finds himself compelled to answer what may be called the question of moral provincialism: If one is to seek the truth about morality and justice, it seems necessary to “find a standpoint that is sufficiently external to the evaluative attitudes and practices that are to be put to the question.” If it is impossible for the agent to take such an external standpoint, if the agent’s commitments preclude radical criticism of the virtues of the community, does that leave the agent “a prisoner of shared prejudices” (DRA, p. 154)?
In the final chapter of DRA, MacIntyre argues that it is impossible to find an external standpoint, because rational enquiry is an essentially social work (DRA, p. 156-7). Because it is social, shared rational enquiry requires moral commitment to, and practice of, the virtues to prevent the more complacent members of communities from closing off critical reflection upon “shared politically effective beliefs and concepts” (DRA, p. 161). “Moral commitment to these virtues and to the common good is not an external constraint upon, but a condition of enquiry and criticism” (DRA, p. 162). MacIntyre contrasts this account of social rational enquiry rooted in moral commitment to the standards of a community against Nietzsche’s notion of independence. In the light of the whole argument of DRA, MacIntyre’s conclusion shows, much more clearly than his remarks at the end of AV, why Nietzsche’s ideal of independence provides a poor model and a misleading guide for human flourishing.
In 2006, MacIntyre published two new collections of selected essays. Both volumes include valuable prefaces discussing the origin, importance, and intentions of each of the essays. The first volume, The Tasks of Philosophy, addresses the goals and methods of philosophical enquiry. It opens with EC, and MacIntyre’s remarks in the preface confirm the essay’s place as the starting point of MacIntyre’s mature work. Five more essays in the first part of the book explore the role of culture in our experience of the world, the problem of relativism, the mistake of ignoring the role of history and personal freedom in the development of individual character, the unity of the human person as an embodied mind, and the failure of modern moral philosophy.
The second part of The Tasks of Philosophy, “The Ends of Philosophical Enquiry” discusses the pursuit of truth. Chapter 7, “The Ends of Life, the Ends of Philosophical Writing,” treats philosophy as a professionalized outgrowth of the natural work of plain persons who struggle with ordinary questions about what it means to live well, or how laws have authority, or whether death has meaning (Tasks, p. 125). The literature of philosophy addresses questions like these, but whether philosophy can be fruitful for its reader depends on whether philosophers also engage those questions, or set the questions aside to focus on the literature of philosophy instead.
MacIntyre credits John Stuart Mill and Thomas Aquinas as “two philosophers of the kind who by their writing send us beyond philosophy into immediate encounter with the ends of life” (Tasks, p. 128). From their example, MacIntyre identifies three characteristics of good philosophical writing.
First, both were engaged by questions about the ends of life as questioning human beings and not just as philosophers. . . . Secondly, both Mill and Aquinas understood their speaking and writing as contributing to an ongoing philosophical conversation. . . . Thirdly, it matters that both the end of the conversation and the good of those who participate in it is truth and that the nature of truth, of good, of rational justification, and of meaning therefore have to be central topics of that conversation (Tasks, pp. 130-1).
Without these three characteristics, philosophy is first reduced to “the exercise of a set of analytic and argumentative skills. . . . Secondly, philosophy may thereby become a diversion from asking questions about the ends of life with any seriousness” (Tasks, p. 131). Third, philosophers’ serious professional enquiries into the writings of other philosophers regarding answers to the questions about the ends of human life may divert their attention completely from those same questions in their own lives.
MacIntyre illustrates this problem by reviewing the responses of Franz Rosenzweig and Georg Lukács to the decline of German NeoKantianism in the early twentieth century. Both Rosenzweig and Lukács abandoned the philosophical orthodoxy into which they had been educated, and in both cases, their abandonment of ideological NeoKantianism marked the beginning of their pursuit of the true ends of philosophy. Rosenzweig’s pursuit of the true ends of philosophy led to “dialogue without theorizing,” while Lukács’s work collapsed into Stalinist “theorizing without dialogue” (Tasks, p. 139). Neither Rosenzweig nor Lukács made philosophical progress because both failed to relate “their questions about the ends of life to the ends of their philosophical writing” (Tasks, p. 139).
To avoid the mistakes of Rosenzweig and Lukács, MacIntyre counsels his readers to remain attached to the questions that philosophy attempts to answer, so that their “beliefs about the ends of life” do not become “detached from the questions to which they are the answer” (Tasks, p. 139). MacIntyre’s recognition of the connection between an author’s pursuit of the ends of life and the same author’s work as a philosophical writer prompts him to finish the essay by demanding three things of philosophical historians and biographers. First, any adequate philosophical history or biography must determine whether the authors studied remain engaged with the questions that philosophy studies, or set the questions aside in favor of the answers. Second, any adequate philosophical history or biography must determine whether the authors studied insulated themselves from contact with conflicting worldviews or remained open to learning from every available philosophical approach. Third, any adequate philosophical history or biography must place the authors studied into a broader context that shows what traditions they come from and “whose projects” they are “carrying forward” (Tasks, p. 142).
Philosophy is not just a study; it is a practice. Excellence in this practice demands that an author bring her or his struggles with the questions of the ends of philosophy into dialogue with historic and contemporary texts and authors in the hope of making progress in answering those questions.
The three essays that complete the volume underscore the challenge MacIntyre gives at the end of “The Ends of Life and the Ends of Philosophical Writing.” These three essays approach the work of philosophy from the perspective of Thomism. Thomism, caricatured in one way by its twentieth-century promoters through deficient textbooks, misguided ideological projects, and abuse in Church politics, and in another by its detractors as an atavistic attachment to an obsolete worldview, has been increasingly marginalized since the 1960s. The three Thomistic essays in this book challenge those caricatures by presenting Thomism in a way that people outside of contemporary Thomistic scholarship may find surprisingly flexible and open; for MacIntyre’s Thomas Aquinas is caught up in the difficulties of the questions of the ends of philosophy no less than MacIntyre and other contemporary philosophers. All three essays return to the notion of enquiry as action. Setting aside the epistemological fictions that modern philosophers, including NeoThomists, had invented in a misguided effort to counter skepticism, MacIntyre defends Thomistic realism as rational enquiry directed to the discovery of truth.
Ethics and Politics (Hereafter E&P) is divided into three parts: “Learning from Aristotle and Aquinas,” “Ethics,” and “The Politics of Ethics.” Essays in the first part compare and contrast Aristotle’s philosophy with some renaissance and modern interpretations of it, examine the political context of Thomas Aquinas’s work on the natural law, and defend Thomas’s natural law theory through a critique of moral epistemology. Essays in the second part investigate the apparent problems of moral dilemmas and the real difficulties of determining whether and when it may be more reasonable to deceive or to lie than to tell the truth. Essays in the third part address the ways that rational enquiry can inform social life.
Two of the essays in the third part of E&P are particularly important to the development of MacIntyre’s thought. “Three Perspectives on Marxism” is the preface to the 1995 edition of M&C. The essay assesses both MI (1953) and M&C (1968), along with the economic and political conditions of 1995, and helps to map the consistency of his positions through nearly forty years of development.
“Social Structures and Their Threats to Moral Agency” expands and develops on the theme of compartmentalization that MacIntyre touched upon in AV (AV, p. 204). The essay examines social structures that encourage compartmentalization of one’s life and thus threaten the human agent’s capacity to recognize, judge, and do what is good and best for her- or himself, as a member of a larger community. MacIntyre considers “the case of J” (J, for jemand, the German word for “someone”), a train controller who learned, as a standard for his social role, to take no interest in what his trains carried, even during war time when they carried “munitions and . . . Jews on their way to extermination camps” (E&P, p. 187). J had learned to do his work for the railroad according to one set of standards and to live other parts of his life according to other standards, so that this compliant participant in “the final solution” could contend, “You cannot charge me with moral failure” (E&P, p. 187).
MacIntyre does not accept J’s relativist defense. J’s moral failure has nothing to do with his conscientious obedience to cultural standards; it stems from his failure to stand up as a moral agent. MacIntyre lists three characteristics of the self understanding of a moral agent. To be a moral agent, (1) one must understand one’s individual identity as transcending all the roles that one fills; (2) one must see oneself as a practically rational individual who can judge and reject unjust social standards; and (3) one must understand oneself as “as accountable to others in respect of the human virtues and not just in respect of [one’s] role-performances” (E&P, p. 196). J is guilty, not because he knowingly participated in the final solution; MacIntyre allows that J knew nothing about it and that his claim of innocence was sincere. J is guilty because he complacently accepted social structures that he should have questioned, structures that undermined his moral agency. This essay shows that MacIntyre’s ethics of human agency is not just a descriptive narrative about the manner of moral education; it is a standard laden account of the demands of moral agency.
God, Philosophy, Universities looks at the history of the Catholic philosophical tradition through its sources, its initial development through Thomas Aquinas, its decline into a silence that lasted from 1700 to 1850, its renewal in response to Pope Leo XIII’s encyclical letter Aeterni Patris (1879) and its redevelopment in the twentieth century. This history returns to AV’s account of the relationships between practices and institutions, for the different parts of this history are marked by varying relationships between the practice of philosophy within the Catholic Church and the political, ecclesial, and academic institutions that have supported it. The Catholic practice of philosophy was left moribund when its practitioners bowed to institutional pressures in the transition from late medieval to early modern philosophy (God, Philosophy, Universities, p. 106). But this practice was resuscitated by the authority of the Church in 1879 when Leo XIII promulgated the encyclical Aeterni Patris. MacIntyre credits Pope John Paul II for redefining the Catholic intellectual tradition and its relationship to the teaching authority of the Catholic Church in the 1998 encyclical letter Fides et Ratio, and he recommends new research programs to help the Catholic intellectual tradition to make progress in the future.
What emerges from MacIntyre’s work is an ethics of human agency, in contrast to modern moral normative ethics and metaethics. The best summary of MacIntyre’s ethics of human agency is found in Kelvin Knight’s Aristotelian Philosophy: Ethics and Politics from Aristotle to MacIntyre (Polity Press, 2007).
The epistemological theories of Modern moral philosophy were supposed to provide rational justification for rules, policies, and practical determinations according to abstract universal standards, but MacIntyre has dismissed those theories, not only in AV, but in every major publication of his career. Modern metaethics is supposed to enable its practitioners to step away from the conflicting demands of contending moral traditions and to judge those conflicts from a neutral position, but MacIntyre has rejected this project as well. In his ethical writings, MacIntyre seeks only to understand how to liberate the human agent from blindness and stupidity, to prepare the human agent to recognize what is good and best to do in the concrete circumstances of that agent’s own life, and to strengthen the agent to follow through on that judgment. In his political writings, MacIntyre investigates the role of communities in the formation of effective rational agents, and the impact of political institutions on the lives of communities. This kind of ethics and politics is appropriately named the ethics of human agency.
MacIntyre is sometimes categorized as a “virtue ethicist,” and AV is counted among the principle texts in virtue ethics, but this label may be misleading for MacIntyre. Virtue ethics developed as an alternative to modern moral theories. The purpose of the modern moral philosophy of authors like Kant and Mill was to determine, rationally and universally, what kinds of behavior ought to be performed—not in terms of the agent’s desires or goals, but in terms of universal, rational duties. Those theories purported to let agents know what they ought to do by providing knowledge of duties and obligations, thus they could be described as theories of moral epistemology.
Contemporary virtue ethics proposes an alternative to modern moral theory, but takes for granted that the purpose of ethics is to provide a moral epistemology. Contemporary virtue ethics purports to let agents know what qualities human beings ought to have, and the reasons that we ought to have them, not in terms of our fitness for human agency, but in the same universal, disinterested, non-teleological terms that it inherits from Kant and Mill. MacIntyre’s ethical project examines the virtues, but it is not a branch of moral epistemology.
For MacIntyre, moral knowledge remains a “knowing how” rather than a “knowing that;” MacIntyre seeks to identify those moral and intellectual excellences that make human beings more effective in our pursuit of the human good. MacIntyre’s purpose in his ethics of human agency is to consider what it means to seek one’s good, what it takes to pursue one’s good, and what kind of a person one must become if one wants to pursue that good effectively as a human agent. As a philosophy of human agency, MacIntyre’s work belongs to the traditions of Aristotle and Thomas Aquinas.
Teleology and Metaphysics: From the beginning of his career, MacIntyre has pursued teleological practical reasoning, rather than utilitarian or deontological moral reasoning. The Project proposed in “Notes from the Moral Wilderness” is a teleological project. “Freedom and Revolution” and “Can Medicine Dispense with a Theological Perspective on Human Nature?” are likewise teleological. AV criticized Christian voluntarism and divine command theory because it rejected teleological practical reasoning and adopted an arbitrary, legal model of moral reasoning. AV criticized modernity for secularizing the arbitrary, legalistic moral reasoning of Christian voluntarism.
The purpose of the constructive argument of the second half of AV is to renew teleological practical reasoning, but MacIntyre attempted to renew Aristotelian teleology while rejecting Aristotelian metaphysics. The teleology of AV, like the teleology of MacIntyre’s broader project since “Notes from the Moral Wilderness,” was to be a social teleology, discovered through reflection on experience. The social teleology appeared to have two advantages. First, it forestalled a host of objections that MacIntyre was involved in an arbitrary, atavistic project to return, whole cloth, to the world view of Aristotle including his views on the subjugation of women and “natural slaves.” Second, in keeping with the insight of Marx’s third thesis on Feuerbach, it maintained the common condition of theorists and people as peers in the pursuit of the good life.
MacIntyre grew to reconsider the adequacy of social teleology in the years following AV. In the Prologue to the 3rd edition (2007), MacIntyre reported that he had accepted from Thomas Aquinas that it was necessary to provide a metaphysical grounding for the social teleology:
It is only because human beings have an end toward which they are directed by reason of their specific nature, that practices, traditions, and the like are able to function as they do. So I discovered that I had, without realizing it, presupposed the truth of something very close to the account of the concept of good that Aquinas gives in question 5 of the first part of the Summa Theologiae (p. xi).
In MacIntyre’s subsequent Thomist works, principally WJWR (chapters 10 & 11), 3RV (chapters 5 & 6), his Aquinas Lecture, First Principles, Final Ends, and Contemporary Philosophical Issues, and “On Being a Theistic Philosopher in a Secularized Culture,” MacIntyre explicitly defends a metaphysical foundation for teleology.
In his ethical work, MacIntyre’s nonetheless continues to approach teleology primarily by examining the phenomena by which metaphysical nature manifests itself. DRA is a thoroughly Thomistic work, yet it is relentlessly practical in its argumentation. The book invites its readers to join that work of dialectical construction that might lead them to first principles. DRA does not assert the demands of substantive metaphysics; it invites its readers to discover them, whether they recognize them as such or not.
MacIntyre illustrates the need for a phenomenological approach to teleology in his two lectures on “Rival Aristotles” (in E&P, chapters 1 & 2). In these two lectures, MacIntyre examines two kinds of errors that Aristotle’s interpreters have made regarding knowledge of the human telos, and the role of that knowledge in practical reasoning. Certain renaissance Aristotelians, including Francesco Piccolomini, overstated the role of theoretical knowledge of the human good in practical reasoning (E&P, p. 14), and understated the place of character in Aristotle’s ethics. Certain contemporary Aristotelians, including Sarah Brodie, go to the opposite extreme, denying the need for knowledge of the good. MacIntyre avoids both misinterpretations. He holds that the human good plays a role in our practical reasoning whether we recognize it or not, so that some people may do well without understanding why (E&P, p. 25). He also reads Aristotle as teaching that knowledge of the good can make us better agents (E&P, p. 26).
In the closely connected studies of ethics and politics, MacIntyre’s work is Aristotelian in the sense that it is a study of human action, the goals of human action, and the moral conditions that enable or hinder an agent’s recognition and pursuit of what is good and best. In keeping with his general approach to philosophy, however, MacIntyre’s Aristotelianism is phenomenological and historicist. AV does not define virtue in metaphysical terms as the perfection of nature (AV, pp. 148, 196). AV defines virtue in terms of the practical requirements for excellence in human agency, in an agent’s participation in practices (AV, ch. 14), in an agent’s whole life, and in an agent’s involvement in the life of her or his community (AV, chapter 15). This peculiar form of Aristotelianism, which MacIntyre described in the “Postscript to the 2nd ed.” of AV as “an historicist defense of Aristotle” (AV, p. 277), remains controversial among Aristotelian and Thomistic metaphysicians.
MacIntyre’s Aristotelian concept of “human action” opposes the notion of “human behavior” that prevailed among mid-twentieth-century determinist social scientists. Human actions, as MacIntyre understands them, are acts freely chosen by human agents in order to accomplish goals that those agents pursue. Human behavior, according to mid-twentieth-century determinist social scientists, is the outward activity of a subject, which is said to be caused entirely by environmental influences beyond the control of the subject. Rejecting crude determinism in social science, and approaches to government and public policy rooted in determinism, MacIntyre sees the renewal of human agency and the liberation of the human agent as central goals for ethics and politics.
As an account of human action, MacIntyre’s projects in ethics and politics continue to pursue the goals of early Marxists, who had sought to reverse the processes of individualization and proletarianization that had undermined the solidarity and self-determination of workers during the industrial revolution. William Cobbett emerges as a Quixotic hero in AV because of his opposition to the dividing and conquering influences of individualism and industrialization.
MacIntyre’s Aristotelian account of “human action” examines the habits that an agent must develop in order to judge and act most effectively in the pursuit of truly choice-worthy ends. This examination demands a rich account of deliberate human activity encompassing moral formation and community life. Where modern moral philosophy seeks rational moral criteria to judge individual human acts without considering the subjective ends of the agent, MacIntyre seeks to understand what it takes for the human person to become the kind of agent who has the practical wisdom to recognize what is good and best to do and the moral freedom to act on her or his best judgment. In this way, MacIntyre’s Aristotelian account of human action opposes the late medieval and modern reduction of ethics to the moral assessment of behavior.
MacIntyre rejected the determinism of modern social science early in his career (“Determinism,” 1957), yet he recognizes that the ability to judge well and act freely is not simply given; excellence in judgment and action must be developed, and it is the task of moral philosophy to discover how these excellences or virtues of the human agent are established, maintained, and strengthened. In this sense, MacIntyre’s ethics and politics continues the project of Aristotle, who wrote, “Neither by nature nor contrary to nature do the virtues arise in us; rather we are adapted by nature to receive them, and are made perfect by habit” (Nicomachean Ethics, 2.1 [1103a 23–25], trans. Ross).
MacIntyre’s Aristotelian philosophy investigates the conditions that support free and deliberate human action in order to propose a path to the liberation of the human agent through participation in the life of a political community that seeks its common goods through the shared deliberation and action of its members (DRA, ch. 8).
Christopher Stephen Lutz
Saint Meinrad Seminary and School of Theology
U. S. A.
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