The Dvaita or “dualist” school of Hindu Vedanta philosophy originated in 13th-century South India with Sri Madhvacarya (Madhva). Madhva, who considered himself an avatara of the wind-god Vayu, argued that a body of canonical texts called the “Vedanta” or “end of the Veda” taught the fundamental difference between the individual self or atman and the ultimate reality, brahman. According to Madhva there are two orders of reality: 1. svatantra, independent reality, which consists of Brahman alone and 2. paratantra, dependent reality, which consists of jivas (souls) and jada (lifeless objects). Although dependent reality would not exist apart from brahman’s will, this very dependence creates a fundamental distinction between brahman and all else, implying a dualist view. By interpreting the Vedanta materials (especially the Upanisads, the Bhagavadgita and the Brahmasutras) along these lines, Madhva deliberately challenged the non-dualist reading in which the atman was identified with brahman. Madhva argued that the scriptures could not teach the identity of all beings because this would contradict ordinary perception, which tells us that we are different both from one another and from God. Madhva and his followers call their system tattvavada, “the realist viewpoint”.
The main tenet of Madhva’s Dvaita Vedanta is that the Vedic tradition teaches a fundamental difference between the human soul or atman and the ultimate reality, brahman. This is markedly different from the earlier Advaita Vedanta, which Madhva often vociferously attacked. Sankara’s A-dvaita or “non-dualist” Vedanta (9th century) argued that the atman is completely identical with brahman. According to Sankara, the atman experiences a false sense of plurality and individuality when under the influence of the delusive power of maya. While maya has the ambiguous ontological status of being neither real nor unreal, the only true reality is brahman. A soul becomes liberated from the cycle of rebirth (punar-janma) by realizing that its very experience of samsara is an illusion; its true identity is the singular objectless consciousness that constitutes pure being or brahman.
While Ramanuja’s system of Visistadvaita Vedanta or “qualified non-dualism” modifies Sankara’s position on the soul’s identity with brahman, Madhva also rejected it. Ramanuja assumes a plurality of individual souls whose identity remains intact even after liberation but maintains that the souls share the essential nature of brahma. The souls are eternal particles issuing from brahman, who as their source retains its transcendence. Ramanuja maintains Visnu’s distinct difference from the human soul and his supremacy as creator and redeemer. Ramanuja identifies brahman with Visnu, holding that brahman is saguna, i.e. possesses attributes, in contrast to Sankara’s attributeless or “nirguna” brahman.
Like Ramanuja, Madhva identifies brahman with Visnu. However, he argues that any system that allows for any identification of the atman with brahman undermines Visnu’s supremacy, compromises His status, and strips devotional acts of their meaning. Madhva’s insistence on the modal distinction between the atman and brahman, wherein the former is inalterably dependent upon–and therefore, fundamentally different from–the latter, insures Visnu-as-brahman‘s complete and utter transcendence of the human soul. For Madhva, this view alone makes devotion [bhakti] an essential component of religious belief and practice. Attaining Visnu’s grace is the soul’s only hope of achieving liberation [moksa] from the cycle of rebirth (samsara).
Like Ramanuja, Madhva opposes Sankara’s conception of Brahman as nirguna or without qualities and as a pure self- consciousness. Madhva views Visnu as preeminent above all other deities on the basis of His unique characteristics. This emphasis on Visnu’s particular collocation of attributes that renders Him distinct from all other gods, human souls, and the material world reveals another critical component of Madhva’s philosophy which is his acceptance of an ontological plurality as a fundamental facet of being. Indeed, Madhva rejects the notion that brahman is the only truly existent entity (tattva) and he maintains that, even though living beings and inert matter are dependent upon Brahman, such dependence differentiates them from Him and makes them discrete entities (tattvas). Thus, reality in Madhva’s system consists of three basic elements: God, the souls (jivasi), and insentient matter (jada).
Madhva’s pluralistic ontology is founded on his realist epistemology, which in turn affects his Vedic hermeneutics. He argues that God and the human soul are separate because our daily experience of separateness from God and of plurality in general is presented to us as an undeniable fact, fundamental to our knowledge of all things. Madhva’s emphasis on the validity of experience as a means of knowledge is intended to refute the nondualist position that the differences we experience in daily life are ultimately a shared illusion with the ambiguous ontological status of being neither real nor unreal. In Madhva’s view, Advaita’s denial of the innate validity of knowledge acquired through sense perception completely undermines our ability to know anything since we must always question the content of our knowledge. This questioning would encompass our knowledge of the sacred canon, which is accessible to us only through our ability to perceive it and to draw inferences from it. Madhva argues that perception and inference must be innately valid and the reality they present us with must be actually and ultimately real since such a position is the only one that allows us to know the content of the Vedas. The Vedas alone are responsible for teaching us about the nature of the self and brahman.
This aspect of Madhva’s realist epistemology is important not only because it bolsters Madhva’s claim that the atman and brahman are permanently distinct as revealed to us by experience, but because it means that the sacred texts must be read in consonance with the data we receive from our everyday experience, even though the Vedas present us with knowledge of a supra-sensible realm. Madhva argues that the Vedas cannot teach non-difference between the atman and brahman or a lack of true plurality since this would directly contradict our experience. In Madhva’s view the sacred texts teach pancabheda, the five-fold difference between 1. Visnu and jivas 2. Visnu and jada 3. jiva and jada 4. one jiva and another and 5. one form of jada and another.
Madhva’s belief in the innate difference of one soul from another led to some interesting doctrines in his system. He believed in a hierarchy of jivas, based upon their innate configurations of virtues (gunas) and faults (dosas). For example, Visnu is supreme because He possesses all qualities in their most fulfilled and perfect form. Furthermore, because Madhva believed that souls possess innate characteristics and capacities, he also maintained that they were predestined to achieve certain ends. This perspective put Madhva at odds with traditional Hindu views of the karma theory wherein differences in social and religious status are explained via past moral or immoral acts. For Madhva, each individual being possesses an innate moral propensity and karma is merely the mechanism by which a given soul is propelled towards his or her destiny.
Madhva’s attempts to locate his controversial views in the canonical Vedanta texts often proved difficult. He is perhaps most famous for his idiosyncratic rendering of the Chandogya Upanisad’s statement tat tvam asi or “you (the atman) are that (brahman).” By carrying over the ‘a’ from the preceding word, Madhva rendered the phrase atat tvam asi or “you are not that.” Some scholars have speculated on “foreign,” particularly Christian, influences on Madhva’s thought but current scholarly consensus maintains that political and social changes in Madhva’s region prompted a new approach to old religious convictions.
Madhva’s Dvaita Vedanta is recognized as one of the three major schools of Vedanta (besides Sankara’s Advaita and Ramanuja’s Visistadvaita Vedanta). It has been further developed by such major figures as Jayatirtha (1356-1388) and Vyasaraya (1478-1589) and is kept alive by a still flourishing community [Madhva sampradaya] in India with its main center at Udipi (Karnataka).
Wright State University
U. S. A.
Last updated: May 4, 2005 | Originally published: