Maimonides is a medieval Jewish philosopher with considerable influence on Jewish thought, and on philosophy in general. Maimonides also was an important codifier of Jewish law. His views and writings hold a prominent place in Jewish intellectual history.
His works swiftly caused considerable controversy, especially concerning the relations between reason and revelation. Indeed, scholarly debates continue on Maimonides’ commitments to philosophy and to Judaism as a revealed religion. However, there is no question that his philosophical works have had a profound impact extending beyond Jewish philosophy. For instance, Aquinas and Leibniz are among the non-Jewish philosophers influenced by Maimonides.
This discussion of his philosophy focuses on some key features and themes rather than aiming to be a comprehensive survey. In particular, attention is drawn to ways in which Maimonides’ philosophical and religious thought were intertwined, focusing on the role of reason and intellectual perfection. In addition, the article highlights some of the significant ways he departs from Aristotle, while also borrowing from him. Maimonides was influenced by Aristotelian and Neoplatonic thought, and both of them have a significant presence, modified by his own original contributions.
After the destruction of the Second Temple by the Romans in 70 C.E., the Talmud became vitally important to Jewish life, both ritually and intellectually. The continuity and coherence of Jewish national life, their life as a people, was largely grounded in the fact that Jewish law bound them together despite diaspora and lack of political self-rule. Talmud was studied intensively, its contents being elaborated and developed to meet the varied conditions of economic, social, and political life. Talmud constitutes the most central collection of interpretation, explication, and commentary on the commandments in Torah, traditionally held to be six hundred and thirteen in number. Knowledge of Talmud, study of it, commentary upon it, and following its guidance bound Jews together as a people in covenant with God.
In addition to being an expert on scripture and Talmud, Maimonides was an important judge and legal official in the Jewish community in Egypt. He was a physician in the Muslim court in Egypt and had extensive correspondence with Jews far and wide, writing detailed responses to questions of Jewish law and scriptural interpretation. Those of his works that are categorized as ‘philosophy’ reflect interests he had in addition to his religious commitments.
The prospects of medieval Jewish communities often depended upon the disposition of the Christian or Islamic rulers of the areas in which Jews lived. As is the case for several other important medieval Jewish philosophers, the larger intellectual culture in which Maimonides lived and worked was Islamic rather than Christian.
Maimonides (Moses ben Maimon)was born in Cordoba, Spain, and within a few years his family felt the need to flee persecution. They led a wandering life for several years and then settled in North Africa. They had fled the Iberian Peninsula after an especially intolerant Islamic dynasty came to power. Maimonides visited the Holy Land briefly and was distressed at the condition of Jews living there. He then spent much of his adult life in Fostat, the Old City of Cairo, near modern-day Cairo.
Maimonides and others in his family depended to a large extent on his younger brother, a successful merchant. His brother was lost at sea during a journey across the Indian Ocean, and Maimonides wrote that the loss of his brother pained him profoundly, leading him into depression. No longer having the support of his brother’s commercial successes, Maimonides made his living as a physician. In the latter part of his life he was physician to a Grand Vizier who was ruling Egypt for the Sultan Saladin. Though he wrote enormously important works on Jewish law he did not believe that one should be paid for being a teacher of Torah and Talmud.
He also wrote works on medicine and diseases, on various sciences, and other subjects. He conducted extensive correspondence with Jewish communities far and wide on diverse matters, from details of religious observance to how to respond when confronted with a choice between death and conversion. (See, for example, his Epistle to Yemen in Halkin and Hartman.) His codification of Jewish law, Mishneh Torah, remains a much studied and important work in the lives of Orthodox Jewish communities to this day. He led an almost breathlessly busy life as physician, judge, codifier of Jewish law, philosopher, scientist, and teacher. The rigors of his responsibilities are described in a letter to Samuel ben Judah ibn Tibbon, the man who translated Guide of the Perplexed from its original Arabic into Hebrew. Maimonides became quite widely known and respected by Jews and Muslims alike. He died in 1204 and his death was felt as a considerable loss.
Maimonides remains an important philosopher and key figure in Jewish religious tradition, offering extensive guidance on matters of Jewish law and Jewish life. Though there is a longstanding debate within Judaism over whether the central role ascribed to reason by Maimonides is in tension with Judaism as a revelation-based religious tradition it is difficult to imagine Judaism without his influence. Also, as noted above, he was an important influence on non-Jewish philosophers, such as Aquinas, Leibniz, and also on Spinoza, who had his own controversial place in Jewish thought.
Maimonides had encyclopedic knowledge of Jewish law and one of his main projects was to try to organize the massive, complex body of interpretation, argument, and elaboration in a systematic, orderly manner. By doing this, he intended to obviate the need for further codification and interpretation. He sought to provide a normatively authoritative presentation of Jewish law. His aim was to articulate what he took to be the correct interpretation of the law without also including the argumentation that yielded his interpretation. The aim was to make the law accessible, to make it easier to find and follow what the law required. The work that resulted, the Mishneh Torah, was a formidable achievement. While it did not bring interpretation and codification of Jewish law to closure, it has remained throughout the centuries a vitally important guide to Jewish law for large numbers of Orthodox Jews. In that respect, it has more than just historical importance.
Maimonides’ most famous philosophical work, Guide of the Perplexed, was written to a former student as a series of letters. The student, a young man named Joseph, had written to ask how to reconcile his commitment to Judaism and Jewish tradition on the one hand with his commitment to reason and demonstrative science on the other. Joseph was himself a very capable and learned individual, and the Guide is the subtle, complex, layered series of letters written by Maimonides in reply.
During the period when Maimonides lived, a small number of Islamic thinkers were attached to sultanates in something like a position of ‘court philosopher,’ to build libraries, increase knowledge, and preserve the ancient inheritance. In the Christian world there were cathedral schools and, by the twelfth and thirteenth centuries, a number of universities. In contrast, Jews were scattered and the Temple in Jerusalem, formerly the locus of priestly ritual, had been destroyed centuries earlier. Following that destruction and the huge wave of killing by the Romans, Judaism survived in large measure through the development of the rabbinic tradition, to which Talmud was crucial. This is relevant to Maimonides as a philosopher because so much of his work was the project of articulating what he took to be the philosophical wisdom in Scripture and Jewish law. There is a powerful rationalistic disposition in Maimonides’ thought, and this included the way he understood religious texts.
In the tenth century Saadia Gaon set much of the agenda of medieval Jewish philosophy in The Book of Beliefs and Opinions. A ‘gaon’ is a head of one of the great Talmudic academies; Saadia was head of the academy in Sura, in present-day Iraq. Saadia’s thought was not clearly Neoplatonic, nor was it clearly Aristotelian. Nonetheless, he was a sophisticated thinker, and one of the main themes of his great work is that Judaism is vindicated by reason. The Book of Beliefs and Opinions opens with an extensive discussion of epistemological issues in which Saadia was anxious to show how Judaism is a religion of reason. He argued that, while revelation is real, much of the substance of what is revealed can be understood in rational terms and is not ultimately a matter of mystery. Saadia was influenced by kalam, (Islamic dialectical theology, and Maimonides criticized him for it. Maimonides regarded kalam as less rationally rigorous than philosophy. Nevertheless, Saadia’s work is important as background and intellectual context. Maimonides saw himself as improving upon the theses Saadia defended and the arguments Saadia developed. In addition, the intellectual context included some important Neoplatonic Jewish thinkers, such as Isaac Israeli and Solomon ibn Gabirol, and some sharp critics of rationalism, such as Judah Halevi.
For a thinker like Maimonides it is very difficult, and in some ways artificial, to separate his philosophical thought from his religious thought. An unhelpful way of looking at this is to believe his religious commitments unduly bias his philosophy or make his philosophical conclusions only valuable to those who share his religious beliefs. It is better to recognize that the sorts of intellectual motivations and presuppositions that influence a thinker’s philosophy can illuminate its claims and commitments. Moreover, many medieval philosophers were very rigorous thinkers, bold in argumentation and in critiquing predecessors, and they departed from predecessors in important ways. Many exhibited a high level of analytical acuity. That is certainly true of Maimonides.
Maimonides did not write purely philosophical works. His works that are regarded as philosophical address issues motivated by religious ideas and concerns. However, Maimonides held that reason and revelation concern one body of truth; each is a mode of access to truth, and he thought there was significant philosophical wisdom in revelation. This is a theme that will run through the rest of this discussion.
Maimonides’ negative theology, his intellectualist conception of human virtue, and his conception of the epistemological role of tradition—to pick just a few examples—are philosophically significant despite the very numerous differences between his time and ours.
As noted above, Maimonides’s great philosophical work, Guide of the Perplexed, was written to a young man who was both a committed Jew and strongly interested in philosophy and the authority of rational understanding. He wrote to Maimonides for guidance on how to reconcile, or not, those two commitments. It is a very challenging work. Maimonides himself notes that it contains obscurities and contradictions, in large part on account of the need to reach different audiences with different levels of philosophical understanding. There is a scholarly debate about whether Maimonides was ultimately ‘loyal’ to philosophy or to Judaism. The debate concerns the degree to which Maimonides’ thought involves an esoteric message threatening to religious orthodoxy but likely not to be grasped by non-philosophers.
The present discussion does not examine that debate directly. Instead, it focuses on what appear to be the chief philosophical conceptions shaping his thought. To be sure, even if the debate about esotericism is not taken up explicitly, the views presented are relevant at least by implication; complete neutrality on the issue is not possible. Still, the main aim here is to survey the content and character of key elements of Maimonides’ philosophy without also examining and evaluating recent scholarly debates about it.
There are many respects in which Maimonides’ philosophy borrows from Aristotle. Maimonides noted that he esteemed Aristotle’s philosophical achievement as the pinnacle of unaided reason. In addition, Islamic philosophers, much of whose thought owed a great deal to Aristotle, influenced Maimonides (see Ibn Rush (Averroes), Avicenna (Ibn Sin)). Their Aristotelianism often involved elements of Platonism, interwoven in often complex ways. Still, it is clear that from metaphysics to logic to philosophical anthropology to ethics, Maimonides used many of Aristotle’s concepts and philosophical categories. However, he often used them in un-Aristotelian ways, ways shaped by Maimonides’ guiding concerns, which were not always shared by Aristotle. For instance, freedom of the will was vitally important to Maimonides because of its significance in regard to following, or not following, the commandments. Maimonides’ conception of the virtues differed from Aristotle’s in many respects on account of Maimonides’ concern with holiness.
Maimonides’ views on creation, revelation, and redemption depart from Aristotle’s views, even though they are joined to Aristotelian conceptions and insights. Tracing out the implications of creation, revelation, and redemption is a way of understanding many of the differences between Maimonides and the ancient inheritance. To a large extent, that inheritance had been modified by commentators on the ancients and by successors to the ancients. As such, the Aristotelianism Maimonides encountered had already been modified to some degree by Arabic commentators. Some of the commentators, Al-Farabi for example, made little distinction between Plato and Aristotle. Much of the philosophy in the few centuries before Maimonides was what we might call ‘Neoplatonic Aristotelianism.’ In Maimonides’ works there are quite evident Platonic, as well as Aristotelian, influences.
Maimonides argued that Torah contained philosophical wisdom and that the most complete understanding of Torah is philosophical understanding. Thus, creation, revelation, and redemption are at the very core of Maimonides’ understanding of all of reality. In The Guide of the Perplexed Maimonides argues that the eternity of the world is not demonstrable. He undertook a detailed analysis of the reasoning in favor of the world’s eternity and concluded that it could be neither proved nor disproved. In that situation, we are to rely on what is made known to us by revelation but not by a simple, dogmatic assertion of faith. Rather, close study of Torah on the basis of epistemically and explanatorily sound principles leads us to belief in a First Cause as creator, which providentially governs the world with concern for the beings created in its image, that is, rational beings. Thus, the relationship between human beings and the First Cause is understood in a significantly different way than in Aristotle’s philosophy.
One of the chief differences is that the world is the result of a free act of creation, rather than a necessary emanation, as in many Neoplatonic conceptions, involving no volitional element. Emanation appears to have a role in Maimonides’ conception of the world order, though he emphasizes the significance of creation ex nihilo by God as bringing the world order into existence. That there is a world is not to be explained by it processing by necessity, from the First Cause. Thus, the very existence of things is seen as reflecting God’s graciousness rather than metaphysical necessitation. The relations between the several intellects ordering the different spheres that constitute the world are sometimes described by Maimonides as being related by a process of overflow, each emanating from the one immediately superior to it. The relations between causality, agency, emanation, and overflow are complex and perplexing. It is very difficult to sort them out definitively in Maimonides’ thought. Nonetheless, he does appear to have held that God is First Cause, God freely created the world, and God sustains the world in existence.
Aristotle understood the existence of the world as necessary, given the essence of the First Cause. According to him, God does not make the world and does not will a created order into existence. The causality of the First Cause is not exercised by, for instance, creating the world ex nihilo or even creating it out of a formless pre-existing material substratum. Aristotle, in contrast to some Neoplatonic Aristotelians, did not regard the world as emanating from the First Cause. He also did not regard the world as existing contingently, based on volition of the First Cause.
For Maimonides creation is so important because the First Cause is understood to have brought the world into existence through benevolence and wisdom, reflected in the created order. Through study of the created order we can enlarge our understanding of God. Revelation is so important because it means that human beings receive help through divine graciousness. Through the giving of Torah human beings are provided with direction to perfection. This includes guidance regarding repentance and how to return to God when one sins. Redemption—understood here as the culmination of providence—is important because it means that the created order is under divine governance. That means that there is what we might call ‘ultimate’ or ‘cosmic’ justice. Human beings may not fully understand the wisdom and goodness of the created order, consider Job for example, but they can be confident that it is indeed governed by divine reason and justice.
Because creation has implications for a great many issues in Maimonides’ philosophy, it is suitable as a starting point for discussing some main elements of Maimonides’ metaphysical views.
Maimonides examined what he took to be the three main approaches to accounting for the world. They are (i) a free act of creation ex nihilo, (ii) imposition of form on pre-existing matter, (iii) eternal emanation. In this last approach the world did not come into being ex nihilo or de novo. Maimonides did not claim to have demonstrative proof that God created the world ex nihilo and de novo. Neither did he claim that he could conclusively refute the second and third approaches. Among Jewish thinkers there were some who accepted a Platonist view that God imposed form on pre-existent matter. However, Maimonides held that we should accept the Biblical story of creation, suitably interpreted in philosophical terms. There is nothing inconsistent or incoherent in it, and we have the authority of the Bible with which to support it.
Maimonides held that God so far exceeds our capacity to have knowledge of the divine nature that we are severely limited in how we are able to describe or comprehend God. Even substance cannot be predicated of God in the sense with which we use the word to express knowledge of entities in the created order. In the terms of Maimonides’ negative theology, we would not describe God as the most powerful, all-knowing, incorruptible substance at the top of a hierarchy of substances. That is a positive conception. However, we can say things about God on the basis of what we can know about the effects of divine activity, not the activity itself. “Every attribute that is found in the books of the deity…is therefore an attribute of His action and not an attribute of His essence” (Guide of the Perplexed, I, 53, p. 121).
We can say that God is gracious or that God is powerful or merciful as long as we remain mindful that these phrases describe attributes of the world and do not directly refer to God. Thus, we can speak of features of God’s actions but not God’s attributes. To speak of attributes would be to speak of properties of God, something God’s transcendence makes impossible. Still, we are not limited to utter silence regarding God. There is much we can say about the created order and about the effects of God’s causal activity though we cannot understand divine activity in its own right. God’s unity, the simplicity of the divine nature, is not a unity of parts, properties, or powers. It is beyond our capacity of positive comprehension though we see the benevolence and wisdom of the created order. Our use of language in speaking of God is equivocal in relation to its use in speaking of other things. That is, it is neither univocal with its use in other contexts, nor is it analogical to use in other contexts. (There is a helpful discussion of approaches to religious language in the article on that topic in this encyclopedia.)
Maimonides’ denial that in talk of God terms are used with meanings that are univocal with or analogous to their use in other contexts may seem to undermine our ability to use language to say anything at all when speaking of God. It may seem to cut us off from any grounding of semantic meaning in that context. Still, Maimonides held that negative theology was needed in order not to misrepresent divine simplicity and that speaking of what God causes is a meaningful way to speak of God.
Maimonides argued that our comprehension of God is limited to negations, for example negations of finitude, ignorance, plurality, corporeal existence, and so forth. Our use of terms such as ‘knowledge,’ ‘justice,’ ‘benevolence,’ and ‘will’ in speaking of God is equivocal. Such terms do not have the same meaning when predicated of human beings as they do when applied to God.
In the Guide, in regard to the application of predicates to God, Maimonides wrote:
[B]etween our knowledge and His knowledge there is nothing in common, as there is nothing in common between our essence and His essence. With regard to this point, only the equivocality of the term “knowledge” occasions the error; for there is a community only in the terms, whereas in the true reality of the things there is a difference. It is from this that incongruities follow necessarily, as we imagine that things that obligatorily pertain to our knowledge pertain also to His knowledge (Guide, III, 20, p. 482).
It is not simply that we lack the concepts with which to represent God’s power, knowledge, benevolence, and so forth; it is that God so completely transcends every created entity and conception available to human reason that in attempting to describe God we are silenced. We know that God exists, is a unity, and is eternal. We know this via revelation. Anything else to be said of God can only be said by describing the effects of God’s activity.
Maimonides wrote, “It has also become clear in metaphysics that by our intellects we are unable to attain perfect comprehension of His existence, may He be exalted. This is due to the perfection of His existence and the deficiency of our intellects. His existence has no causes by which He could be known” (Maimonides, “Eight Chapters,” in Ethical Writings of Maimonides, Ch. VIII, pp. 94-5). Thus, in Maimonides’ view, “It therefore follows that we do not know His knowledge either, nor do we comprehend it in any way, since He is His knowledge and His knowledge is He” (“Eight Chapters,” p. 95).
It would be a serious error to think that God’s knowledge is the same kind of knowledge as human knowledge only more complete. It would also be erroneous to think that God’s volitional power is the same type of power as human volition, only without the limitations to which humans are subject. Maimonides’ negative theology was a strategy for preserving the utter and complete uniqueness of God while also not being rendered utterly silent and inarticulate in regard to God and divine attributes. Through the created order we understand that God is wise, benevolent, all-powerful, eternal, one, and unchanging. However, we must be careful in how we use language about God because the unity of God’s nature implies that predicating multiple attributes of God is already an error unless it is understood through negative theology.
Maimonides’ approach had to come to grips with Scripture’s extensive use of descriptive terms in speaking of God. We are told that God is forgiving and merciful, long-suffering and patient, that God is generous and loving, that God becomes angry, and that God is jealous and insists on being the unique object of worship. For a great many people the understanding of God, the commandments, and human beings’ relationship to God depends heavily on the use of descriptively rich language. Like some other medieval philosophers, Maimonides held that the same truths could be represented and conveyed by different means, in accord with different levels of sophistication of understanding. For those not capable of philosophical understanding metaphysical principles and demonstrative proofs would be inscrutable and uninformative. They needed to hear truths about God in an idiom accessible to them. The same truths could be articulated and explicated in terms of philosophical understanding.
The anthropomorphic language of Scripture is suited to convey important truths to ‘ordinary,’ non-philosophical understanding. Philosophical understanding can interpret the idiom of Scripture in a way that ascertains its metaphysical meaning. Maimonides concurred with many Jewish thinkers in holding that “[t]he Torah speaks in accordance with the language of the children of Man.” That language is sufficiently rich to speak to the ‘plain person’ and the philosopher.
The sort of negation intended by Maimonides’ negative theology reflects the fact that language cannot capture and express God’s nature. Kenneth Seeskin illustrates this:
If I say that this horse does not lack the ability to run, you would be justified in concluding that its running ability is unimpaired….this cannot be what Maimonides says about God because even if God is superlatively powerful, we would still be assigning God to the class of powerful things. Instead what Maimonides means is that God is not in the class of things that are either powerful or weak in the normal sense of the term. God does not lack power, but neither is God’s power comparable with other things (Kenneth Seeskin, p. 89).
As Seeskin puts the point, “God falls under no description” (Seeskin, p.88). How then are we to imitate God by being righteous, showing loving kindness, and exercising judgment? As noted above, Maimonides’ solution is that we can comprehend and describe features of the created order, features of what God has brought about or what God has done. What we predicate of the world is not also to be predicated of God. Rather, we find that the created order reflects graciousness and benevolence, which is something distinct from God, who is the cause of it.
However, it was crucial to show that the language of the Torah did not mean literally that God is corporeal. Indeed, that would be the profoundest error of all. Nor did the fact that the Israelites were commanded to perform sacrifices mean that idolatry was acceptable. Such matters reflect the fact that truths need to be expressed in ways that are accessible to ordinary persons. Moreover, with time and the discipline of practice, it is possible for understanding to be deepened and enlarged. Sacrifice is, as it were, a stage on the way to a religion of prayer, which is a stage on the road to a religion of understanding. The commandments, in their complex wisdom regarding human nature, guide in the direction of increasingly rational religion. Maimonides maintained that there is no distinct religious understanding or faculty of religious knowledge. All cognition is intellectual cognition. That is true of prophecy as well as metaphysics. Moreover, Maimonides interpreted religious practice in a way that highlights God’s wisdom concerning what is needed to help human beings do and understand the things that will perfect them.
An important element of Maimonides’ view is that philosophical wisdom and fundamental truths about reality contained in Scripture and Jewish tradition were known to a much earlier age but have since been lost and need to be retrieved. He held that those parts of Scripture concerning “the account of the beginning” contain fundamental truths about the natural world, or physics, and those concerning “the account of the chariot” in Ezekiel contain fundamental truths of metaphysics. One must master a very difficult process of learning to ascertain those truths. For example, Scripture contains a great deal of anthropomorphism, but Abraham and the patriarchs, Maimonides argued, understood that the existence of an eternal, incorporeal God could be demonstrated.
While we cannot have a positive conception of God’s nature, we can know that metaphysically a First Cause must exist, and through study of the created order, we can have knowledge of the effect of divine activity. Maimonides’ negative theology is a barrier to ascribing anthropomorphisms to God but it is not a barrier to knowledge of God’s existence or knowledge of features of the world God made. This is a strongly philosophical conception of religion. According to it, fulfilling the commandments is the way to develop one’s capacities and dispositions so that it is possible to come to understand the philosophical truths of the Hebrew Bible.
Maimonides’ insistence on the integral place of philosophy in Judaism was highly objectionable to many traditionalists though Maimonides understood his own work as explicating the truths of tradition rather than rejecting tradition or suggesting that it is anachronistic. He did not seek to replace tradition with philosophy but to articulate the rationality of tradition and show the ways in which philosophical depth and truth are present in Jewish thought and tradition. His thought resonated with Platonic and Aristotelian ideas in the respect that he regarded human beings as having a rational nature, most completely realized in intellectual perfection. The intellect in act is the actualization proper to a human being. Scripture and tradition are guides to attaining that actualization. They do not concern some other sort of truth or end.
Maimonides’ negative theology is complemented by other elements of his epistemology. For example, he held that there are significant limitations on what human beings can demonstrate scientifically. We cannot, he thought, have demonstrative knowledge of astronomy though we can have demonstrable knowledge of sublunar physics. Recall that many ancient and medieval thinkers held that there is a real difference between the sublunar and supralunar realms. It was thought that the two realms are intelligible through different principles because the natures of the entities in them are different. Aristotle had held that, though the two realms are different, it is possible to have demonstrative knowledge of each of them.
Maimonides rejected this on the basis of empirical considerations, but the rejection had more than empirical implications. He argued that the motions of several celestial bodies were not in accord with what Aristotelian science held in regard to the motions of the spheres. If indeed there are exceptions to what should be necessities of physics, this shows that there are ‘particularities’ among heavenly phenomena, and that is evidence in favor of God as a creator who has made the heavens such as to show the particularities of the created order. In this way, what may look like an argument within physics is connected in a significant way with the dispute concerning whether the world is eternal and necessary or is the work of a creating God.
Maimonides accepted a great deal of Aristotle’s science, both in regard to its overall epistemology and in regard to many of its specific explanations. In Part II of the Guide Maimonides presented twenty-five postulates of Aristotelian physics, and he went on to argue for their indisputable role in scientific explanation. However, there were respects in which astronomy seemed problematic with regard to Aristotelian physics. The complex systems of motion developed to account for astronomical phenomena and the arrangement of celestial bodies could be shown to make mathematical sense but did not fully cohere with some substantive commitments of Aristotelian-Ptolemaic science. Chief among these is that mathematical astronomy did not consistently show that the earth is the fixed center of the celestial order. Maimonides thus distinguished between mathematical astronomy—which exhibited a systematic, if quite complex, order including eccentric spheres and epicycles—and physical reality, with particular features that cannot be demonstrated.
Overall, a number of scientific issues supplied a basis for Maimonides to claim that neither eternity nor creation is demonstrable. However, we are not forced into a suspension of judgment regarding the matter. As indicated above, there is another source of knowledge, namely, authentic tradition. This would seem very ad hoc and quite unconvincing if Maimonides did not develop a sophisticated conception of tradition as a source of knowledge. Earlier Jewish thinkers made important contributions to this issue. Saadia Gaon’s The Book of Belief and Opinions is especially important in this regard. What is striking about Maimonides’ approach is the manner in which it is related to other elements of his philosophy such as his negative theology.
Negative theology is a basis for an interpretation of Scripture, especially its anthropomorphisms, and is consistent with Maimonides’ conception of demonstrative science, prophecy understood in cognitive terms, and his intellectualist conception of human perfection. The negative theology enabled him to explain Scripture without being confined to literalism. Understanding of the text needs to cohere strongly with scientific and metaphysical—rational—understanding. That is what Maimonides tries to show. The oneness and incorporeality of God are truths of reason, and a sound interpretation of Scripture must preserve those truths. When Genesis (1:26) says that man is created in the likeness of God that does not mean that God has a body. Again, this is not to say that we have a complete comprehension of God, but metaphysical reasoning eliminates the hypothesis that God is a material being. Thus, what Genesis says should be interpreted to mean that man has a rational, indeed intellectual, form. This is a good illustration of how Maimonides interpreted Scripture as containing philosophical content in ways that may not be explicit but can be recognized and elaborated by human reason.
The notion of the world as a created order and an order reflecting, in sometimes very complex, unobvious ways, divine goodness and wisdom is crucial for Maimonides. It is the foundation for the account of human nature, the human predicament, and the help that God gives to human beings. We can gain some additional insight into this by considering Maimonides’ interpretation of the Garden and of Adam and Eve eating of the tree of knowledge of good and evil after having been warned against doing so.
It is essential to Maimonides’ philosophical anthropology that human beings have an intellectual essence, a rational nature capable of comprehending intelligible features of reality. Again, to say that man is created in God’s image is to say that a human being has a rational soul. In Maimonides’ view Adam and Eve could have led untroubled lives guided exclusively by clear intellectual conceptions of the true and the false, without concern with good and evil. Such lives would have been free of frustration, pain, anxiety, and fear. All that was required was that Adam and Eve heed the injunction not to eat of the tree of the knowledge of good and evil. In eating of the tree they yielded to distraction from intellectual activity and sought satisfaction in the lesser objects of the imagination. Good and evil are not, in Maimonides’ view, demonstrable or intuited intelligibles. Our conceptions of good and evil involve the imagination.
In his treatment of Adam and Eve Maimonides is presenting key elements of his anthropology rather than exploring details of a particular episode of human history. His primary concern is to explicate basic features of human nature and the human condition and to make fundamental points about human intellectual capacities and the aspects of human nature as the basis of an ethical life. In the Guide Maimonides writes of Adam:
For the intellect that God made overflow unto man and that is the latter’s ultimate perfection, was that which Adam had been provided with before he disobeyed. It was because of this that it was said of him that that he was created in the image of God and in His likeness. It was likewise on account of it that he was addressed by God and given commandments, as it says: And the Lord God commanded, and so on (Guide, I, 2, p. 24).
Now man in virtue of his intellect knows truth from falsehood; and this holds good for all intelligible things. Accordingly when man was in his most perfect and excellent state, in accordance with his inborn disposition and possessed of his intellectual cognitions—because of which it is said of him: Thou has made him but little lower than Elohim—he had no faculty that was engaged in any way in the consideration of generally accepted things, and he did not apprehend them (Guide, I, 2, p. 25).
In failing to heed the warning not to eat of the tree of knowledge of good and evil, Adam “disobeyed the commandment that was imposed upon him on account of his intellect and, becoming endowed with the faculty of apprehending generally accepted things, he became absorbed in judging things to be bad or fine” (Guide, I, 2, p. 25). It is notable that the view that imagination can be a source of error and can lead us away from clear understanding has ancient roots. The ancient and medieval conceptions of how imagination compares unfavorably with intellect contrast sharply with many modern conceptions of the role and importance of imagination.
Adam’s and Eve’s error persists as a feature of our nature. Human beings are susceptible to distraction from the truth and from contemplation of the intelligible. We concern ourselves with other things and often with an urgency of desire. Maimonides did not interpret the story of Adam and Eve in the Garden in the way it is understood through the Christian notion of ‘The Fall’ or ‘Original Sin.’ According to Christianity only the supernatural agency of Christ, making a human reborn through the grace of Christ’s Passion, can restore the integrity of human nature. Judaism does not include such a conception. Maimonides held that God’s grace is exhibited through the giving of Torah, which is a guide to a virtuous and holy life, and by fulfilling the commandments through both understanding and action, a person can return to God, become close to God. This is explicable in terms of ethical and intellectual virtue without an additional supernatural agency. Judaism does not share the Christian conception of a profoundly wounded human nature, incapable of repairing itself. There is, though, a role for grace in Judaism; the giving of Torah reflects divine graciousness.
To Maimonides Adam’s and Eve’s sin of indulgence indicates that human beings can be distracted from truth. Human beings are creatures with passions and desires, not only intellect. One epistemological implication of this anthropology is that moral judgments are non-demonstrable. Morality reflects the fact that human beings are not purely intellectual beings, something highlighted in Maimonides’ interpretation of the Garden.
Maimonides had a complex view of the rationality of the commandments and the relation between ethical virtue and intellectual virtue. Before going directly into that topic, it is important to comment on some key features of Maimonides’ conception of prophecy. His account of prophecy has deep connections with his metaphysics and epistemology. Maimonides conceptualized revelation and prophecy in rationalistic terms. He explicated prophecy as an emanation, ultimately from God, transmitted to human beings via the causality of the Agent Intellect. In Maimonides’ view there is no role for mystery in prophecy. Like Saadia before him, he did not regard Judaism as involving any fundamentally mysterious doctrines. Prophecy is understood in terms of emanation of intelligible form to an individual especially apt to receive it on account of their strength of rational and imaginative faculties.
The prophet has an ability to receive a more than ordinary extent of intellectual emanation. He also has an imagination of sufficient power to represent concretely what has been intellectually received. The chief point is that prophecy belongs on the same epistemological spectrum as other types of rational knowledge, such as science and metaphysics. In fact, Maimonides was a severe critic of many types of mysticism and was especially harsh in his objections to astrology. In part, that was because he thought that the determinism associated with astrology was in conflict with the compelling case for freedom of the will, an issue discussed below. Knowledge—understood as comprehension of intelligible forms—requires a causal agency to actualize it in an individual with the potentiality to acquire knowledge. The Agent Intellect actualizes knowledge in human beings. This is true in general and prophecy is, in principle, no different.
With respect to the emanation of intelligible form Maimonides held that if a person is such that only the person’s rational faculty is affected, then that is a speculative person. If the rational and imaginative faculties are affected, then that person is a prophet. If only the imagination is affected, the individual is a lawgiver. Imagination is crucial because of how it makes it possible to give concrete representation to intelligible knowledge, a representation by which the prophetic message is accessible to the great majority of people.
This element of Maimonides’ view is similar in some important respects to Alfarabi’s view. The prince needs wisdom and persuasive skill so that the great majority of people—who can be led by persuasion and compulsion but not by demonstration of the relevant truths—can be effectively led in a way that is oriented to the good. In Alfarabi’s view the ruler needs multiple virtues including theoretical virtue, deliberative virtue, moral virtue, and practical art. The ‘elect’ have knowledge that is demonstrated; they have an intellectual grasp of principles, and they can see what follows from them by necessity. They have rational understanding. The vulgar are reached by persuasion, and they have a grasp of things through imaginative representation rather than demonstration.
Maimonides’ view is, in a broad sense, a naturalistic conception of prophecy. The connection between the prophet and the Agent Intellect is not made by an act of God; God can block prophecy but an individual meets the conditions for prophecy on epistemological terms, so to speak, not through divine intervention. In Maimonides’ view the prophet does not have a mysterious experience or an extraordinary faculty. Still, to be effective as a prophet, the person must also be able to apply their higher understanding effectively and that involves the kind of concrete detail that can only come from imagination.In discussing prophecy Maimonides presented three main positions on the issue. They are:
No one lacking virtue can be a prophet. Only a person with the relevant perfections will become a prophet; however, because the performance of divine miracles is possible, God can prevent even a person with the relevant perfections from becoming a prophet. Because Maimonides acknowledges the possibility of miracles, he allows that God can prevent prophecy. Overall, this is a naturalistic conception, though it is couched in language suitable to non-philosophical persons’ beliefs in the importance of miracles.
Also, it should be noted that there is one exception to the typology above. Maimonides held that in Moses’ case, prophecy was entirely intellectual. Moses was capable of a uniquely complete comprehension of intelligibles.
Maimonides’ philosophy shows the influence of Aristotle, Islamic commentaries on Aristotle, kalam, and Neoplatonism. Aristotelianism and Neoplatonism intersect in his view that the further away from the ground and source of being—the further from God in the created order—the less perfect are beings and the more susceptible they are to degeneration, change, and ceasing to be. The more fully a human being actualizes the intellect, the more like God that individual becomes inasmuch as actuated intellect has no tendency to corruption or change. A human being whose intellect is actualized as fully as possible is able to come closer to God. That striving involves the exercise of ethical virtue and intellectual virtue. This is an intellectualized conception of imitatio dei. The created order is a series of levels of reality, each more remote from and less like the ground and source of being, but human beings are capable of being close to God through understanding.
Maimonides says of man that “[h]is ultimate perfection is to become rational in actu, I mean to have an intellect in actu” (Guide, III, 27, p. 511). In addition, , “[i]t is clear that to this ultimate perfection there do not belong either actions or moral qualities and that it consists only of opinions toward which speculation has led and that investigation has rendered compulsory” (Guide, III, 27, p. 511).
The more one’s intellect is actualized, the more one is protected by providence in the metaphysical sense that one is less liable to corruption and ceasing to be. In short, Maimonides held that a person is immortal, capable of surviving bodily death, to the extent that one’s intellect is actualized. There are then, degrees of immortality and degrees of being protected by providence. Prophecy, providence, and immortality are all explicated along these Aristotelian/Neoplatonic lines.
Maimonides was criticized for not clearly and emphatically asserting that resurrection of the dead is a fundamental principle of Judaism. It was really not until the medieval era and the deadly pressures on Jews caught between Islam and Christianity during the Crusades that Jewish thinkers formulated a dogma for Judaism. The formulation of dogma could be helpful to Jews pressured to defend their religion and needing to have ready replies to theological attacks on it. Maimonides formulated Thirteen Fundamental Principles of Jewish Faith, the last of which is belief that the dead will be brought back to life when God wills it. Apart from a small number of passages in the Prophets, the resurrection of the dead does not figure in the Hebrew Bible. Nevertheless, by the thirteenth century it was becoming a more accepted, shared element of Judaism, and Maimonides included it among his Thirteen Principles. The doctrine is in tension with the intellectualistic Aristotelianism of Maimonides’ anthropology, and scholarly debate over whether he genuinely accepted the doctrine continues.
A significant respect in which his anthropology differs from Aristotle’s is connected with creation, revelation, and redemption. Aristotle’s Metaphysics opens with “All men by nature desire to know.” This is not an ordinary empirical claim; it states something Aristotle took to be fundamental to human nature, namely, that our telosis intellectual. A human being’s nature is most completely realized in intellectual activity, and multiple features of human nature are to be understood in terms of how they are related to that telos. Thus far, the agreement between Aristotle and Maimonides is quite close.
However, for Aristotle, a human being’s most fundamental orientation to the world is wonder. That reflects our telos, and it is motivationally important to the activities through which our telos can be realized. Maimonides would agree that wonder is a basic feature of our rational nature but, given the fact of creation and revelation and God’s justice and mercy, it can be said that a human being’s most basic orientation to reality is gratitude or a combination of gratitude and humility. This is because gratitude is owed to God for the very existence of the world and for the wisdom of the created order. Our highest end is a loving cognition of God. The fact that human beings have been given aid through revelation of Torah reshapes the Aristotelian conception of both human beings and the world overall. Creation, revelation, and redemption are not just ‘accessories’ to what is otherwise an unchanged Aristotelian philosophy. Gratitude includes an aspiration to holiness, a resolve to fulfill the commandments so that one imitates God, to the extent possible for a human being, through attaining understanding and acting in ways informed by understanding.
Humility has a place in a person’s fundamental orientation at least in the respect that perhaps the most compelling and evident conception a person can have is the conception of all things being dependent upon God. Even in striving for virtue and perfection of one’s nature through one’s own voluntary activity, humility is appropriate because of the contrast between human beings and God and because of the divine graciousness in giving help to human beings via revelation. We will see below, in the discussion of ethics, how Maimonides’ view of pride and humility is strikingly different from Aristotle’s.
Given the central role of the commandments in regard to human perfection, we are in position now to address some of the specific features of Maimonides’ conception of the relation between the ethical and the intellectual and how they are mutually reinforcing.
As a pathway into Maimonides’ account of the virtues, it will be helpful to begin with the issue of ‘the reasons for the commandments’ (t’amei ha-mitzvot). While there is some disagreement over the precise number of commandments in Torah, Maimonides concurred with the most widely shared view, holding that they number six hundred thirteen. (Three hundred sixty-five are prohibitions and two hundred forty-eight are positive injunctions.) Along with some other medieval Jewish philosophers Maimonides held that fulfilling the commandments is not only a matter of practice but also study. Jews are to enlarge and deepen their understanding by striving to comprehend the reasons for the commandments, which is itself commanded. Jewish thinkers often quoted Deuteronomy as a locus of the commandment to seek understanding by reflecting upon the rational justifications of the commandments. For example, Deuteronomy 4, 5-8, reads, ‘for this is your wisdom and your understanding in the sight of the peoples, that, when they hear all these statutes, shall say: “Surely this great nation is a wise and understanding people.”’
Maimonides held that there are reasons for all of the commandments. None is simply an arbitrary test of obedience. Moreover, he thought it an offense against divine wisdom that any commandment should be without reason. Some philosophers of the period argued for divine voluntarism, often as a way of preserving God’s sovereignty and power. Voluntarism had numerous highly influential Islamic proponents, but very few Jewish philosophers endorsed it. Scotus and Ockham are often described as propounding divine voluntarism, though their views are complex in ways that the ‘voluntarist’ label does not accurately apply.
Numerous Jewish thinkers distinguished between mishpatim and hukkim, that is, between judgments and statutes. The former are those commandments the reasons for which are ascertainable by human beings, and the latter are those commandments whose justifications are more opaque but, in the view of some, still rational. Saadia had distinguished between ‘laws of reason’ and ‘laws of revelation’ as a way of making the distinction. There was debate over whether some mishpatim (judgments) are fully evident to reason. Saadia held that view; Maimonides did not. Saadia’s view was very much like an intuitionist view regarding at least some of the commandments. The chief point here is that, in Maimonides’ view, all commandments are supported by rational justification, though none are rationally self-evident.
[E]very commandment from among these six hundred and thirteen commandments exists either with a view to communicating a correct opinion, or to putting an end to an unhealthy opinion, or to communicating a rule of justice, or to warding off an injustice, or to endowing men with a noble moral quality, or to warning them against an evil moral quality. Thus all [the commandments] are bound up with three things: opinions, moral qualities, and political civic actions (Guide, III, 31, p. 524).
He criticized voluntarism harshly, calling it a “sickness” of soul to think that lacking any rational purpose should be a mark that a law has a divine origin. Maimonides wrote, “It is, however, the doctrine of all of us—both of the multitude and of the elite—that all the Laws have a cause, though we ignore the causes for some of them and we do not know the manner in which they conform to wisdom” (Guide, III, 26, p. 507). In the midst of a discussion of the matter (chapter 31 of the Guide) he quotes the passage from Deuteronomy 4. The ultimate, overall purpose “of the Law as a whole is to put an end to idolatry” (Guide, III, 29, p. 517). The purpose is realized through individuals acquiring good moral habits, seeking and preserving justice, and attaining understanding. Radical voluntarism would leave the commandments without purpose or point, when we can see that “all the commandments are bound up with three things: opinions, moral qualities, and political civic actions” (Guide, III, 31, p. 524). Sometimes he reduces the purpose of the Law overall to two ends, “the welfare of the soul and the welfare of the body” (Guide, III, 27, p. 510).
Maimonides held that fulfilling the commandments could help a person attain more understanding of the reasons for the commandments. He developed a complex, subtle view of the relations between ethical and intellectual virtue while endorsing an intellectualist conception of human perfection. He held that the more fully one understands the rational justifications for the commandments, the more one will be motivated to fulfill them. The motivation is increased by appreciation of the commandments’ wisdom. Thus, it is also part of his view that tradition is important not just as a way of sustaining ancient practices but also as transmitting understanding that can be enlarged and deepened. There are several respects in which Maimonides’ thought has rationalistic tendencies, and this point about tradition as having authority because of its relation to reason and not just the authority of antiquity is a good example.
Maimonides did not acknowledge an intellectual virtue of practical wisdom. One important difference between Maimonides and Aristotle is that Maimonides regarded all virtues, apart from intellectual virtue, as choiceworthy only because they serve intellectual virtue. Preserving health and wellbeing and composing the soul are conditions for intellectual perfection. The virtues, other than intellectual virtue, are not in Maimonides’s view choice-worthy in their own right, independent of their relation to intellectual virtue. As David Shatz writes of Maimonides’ view:
His writings contain extensive discussion of ridding oneself of bad ethical traits and acquiring good ones, and of the attempt to “quell the impulses” of matter that distract people from intellectual pursuits and impede cognition of what is not physical. The quelling of such impulses is associated with the attainment of holiness (GP 3.8, 3.33). Morality is a preparation for contemplation and constitutes no trivial task (Shatz, p. 169).
In Chapter 54, which is the final chapter of the Guide, Maimonides distinguishes four species of perfection relevant to human beings. They are “the perfection of possessions” (material goods and resources), “the perfection of bodily constitution and shape” (such things as corporeal strength and temperament, which “[do] not belong to man qua man, but qua animal”), “the perfection of the moral virtues” (which he says is “preparation for something else and not an end in itself”), and finally, intellectual perfection, “[t]he true human perfection; it consists in the acquisition of the rational virtues… [T]hrough it man is man” (Guide, III, 54, p. 635).
The first three species of human virtue are conditions for the fourth species, which is the virtue by which one’s essence is actualized. Health, strength, and at least a modicum of material means are needed in order to engage in morally virtuous activity. The moral virtues are conditions for the composure and focus of mind required for intellectual virtue. Intellectual virtue is the individual’s true perfection, and it brings with it enduring permanence without corruption. Yet soon after making the pronounced case for human perfection as intellectual perfection, Maimonides concludes the Guide with a statement about how we imitate God to the fullest through loving-kindness, righteousness, and judgment. Unsurprisingly, there is considerable debate among scholars regarding just how Maimonides’ view is to be interpreted. One way to understand his view is that the first three perfections are choiceworthy as conditions and support for intellectual perfection, and to the extent to which one attains intellectual perfection, it will inform and be reflected in how one acts, and the activity mentioned at the conclusion of the Guide is imitation of God insofar as it is care for the created order, and finally, care is inseparable from the understanding of that order. In this view, the first three perfections of a human being are necessary for intellectual perfection, but intellectual perfection is then itself actualized in ethically excellent human action.
This may still seem to be problematically related to Maimonides’ statements about intellectual perfection as the distinctive and highest perfection of a human being. However, it suggests a way in which that notion of perfection can be in agreement with the significance Maimonides attaches to imitatio dei. In any case, the issue is an excellent example of the complexity of Maimonides’ thought and the subtlety and care with which he articulated it. His complex view cannot be dismissed as a clumsy lapse in consistency or the effect of inattention to what he said elsewhere.
Yet the Guide is also the work in which Maimonides explains Job’s suffering on the basis of the fact that, while Job was ethically virtuous, he was not said to excel in intellectual virtue. His imperfect understanding was at the root of Job’s perplexity over what befell him. If he had more perfect understanding, he would have understood that all is ordered for the best by divine providence. Maimonides connected intellectual virtue with providence in just that way; the more perfect one’s understanding, the more complete one’s protection from evil. Human beings mistakenly think that God’s knowledge is like our knowledge and that God’s purposes are like our own. That is, on our part, the error of displacing intellect with our imagination.
If man knows this, every misfortune will be borne lightly by him. And misfortunes will not add to his doubts regarding the deity and whether He does or does not know and whether He exercises providence or manifests neglect, but will, on the contrary, add to his love, as is said in the conclusion of the prophetic revelation in question: Wherefore I abhor myself, and repent of dust and ashes (Guide, III, 23, p. 497).
It is also a crucial part of Maimonides’ view of intellectual perfection that the love of God “is proportionate to apprehension” (Guide, III, 51, p. 621). The intellect emanating from God is the “bond” between God and human beings and “You have the choice: if you wish to strengthen and fortify this bond, you can do so; if, however, you wish gradually to make it weaker and feebler until you cut it, you can also do that” (Guide, III, 51, p. 621). Happiness is ultimately and essentially intellectual, even if in the aspiration to be holy and to imitate God, we act in the world in ways we understand to be God’s ways.
The Law supplies the guidance for virtuous activity. We need to be careful in regard to this point. It is not Maimonides’ view that a person is to follow the law mechanically or without reflection or criticism. We saw above the central importance of seeking to enlarge and deepen understanding of the commandments. That involves questioning, dialectic, elaboration, and extending judgment to new sorts of cases. Thus, even though Maimonides’ ethics lacks a virtue of practical wisdom, reason and reasoning had a vital, extensive role in it.
Recall, also, that Maimonides held that good and evil relate to the imagination rather than the intellect. Again, it is important to be careful; this does not mean that Maimonides thought that good and evil are subjective or that there is no objective difference between being correct and being mistaken about them. He did not think that good and evil were objects of the intellect, but he did think that judgments of good and evil could be, or could fail to be, supported by reasons. The key contrast here is not between the rational and the conventional, or subjective, but between the demonstrable and the not demonstrable. Judgments of good and evil are not demonstrable but neither are they conventional. It is in the sciences that demonstration is possible, but that does not relegate ethical judgment to the sphere of the merely conventional, expressive, or subjective.
We can attain further clarity concerning this matter by considering Maimonides’ use of, what is translated as, the “generally accepted.” Maimonides uses the notion of the “generally accepted” in a number of places in the Guide. (See, for example, I, 2; also III, 29; III, 31; III, 32; and in “Eight Chapters,” Ch. VIII, p. 87) He seems to use it in two ways. In one sense, “generally accepted” refers to beliefs and practices widely held, whether or not they are true or supported by good reasons. For example, we might say that in ancient times it was generally accepted that the stars exercised causal power over the actions of human beings, causing them to do what they do (a view Maimonides opposed). That is a belief that was widely held, though it was false.
In the second sense, something may be said to be generally accepted insofar as it is widely held on the basis of good reasons, though not demonstrable. The matter in question is not known by intuition or demonstration, yet neither is it simply a matter of custom or longstanding convention. There are grounds for it such that it is a reasonable thing to maintain. Moral beliefs are generally accepted in that second sense. Thus, some of what is generally accepted God wishes to efface from our minds, as is the case with idolatrous beliefs, while some of what is generally accepted is important for us to believe and to employ as a basis for action. What is generally accepted, in this sense, is not merely a matter of being commonly believed. It is a matter of being a justified though non-demonstrable belief.
Above we noted that, according to Maimonides, there are reasons for all of the commandments. The reasons for them are not always evident, and in many cases, when we seek after them, will find that their justification remains elusive. For instance, we may be able to see that there is reason to punish certain kinds of conduct; it may be easily understood that certain action-types count as crimes or offenses. It may not be clear why the punishment is forty lashes rather than thirty-nine or forty-one. Perhaps we agree that sixty would be too many and ten would be too few. But why does the commandment tell us forty? In such cases Maimonides tells us that some number had to be chosen so that there would be clarity about what is required, and God had a reason for the degree of severity of the punishment even if it is not rationally evident that it must be forty. In some cases, even God simply has to make a choice within a range determined by his wisdom.
There is an important connection between this issue and the earlier discussion of the reasons for the commandments. Many of the statutes (hukkim) concern ritual, diet, the clean and the unclean, matters of dress, and a great many practices, some of which do not seem to have any easily discernible ethical significance. Maimonides argued that part of the explanation for some of them is that they were needed to orient the Israelites to proper worship of God when they were accustomed to the practices of the pagan peoples surrounding them. Part of the divine wisdom of the commandments is that they did not require a complete, abrupt change in practice, a change so radical that people would have resisted it on account of having no grasp of what they were being required to do. Instead, in a manner reflective of God’s “gracious ruse,” many of the commandments required sacrifice and other practices with which the Israelites were familiar. However, the Law overall, as an integrated, purposeful discipline of perfection, guided people to true belief and genuinely virtuous practice.
On the issue of why the commandments contain many requirements not so different from the practices of people from whom the Israelites were to be distinguished by their covenant with God, Maimonides wrote:
For a sudden transition from one opposite to another is impossible. And therefore man, according to his nature, is not capable of abandoning suddenly all to which he was accustomed. As therefore God sent Moses our Master to make out of us a kingdom of priests and a holy nation—through the knowledge of Him, may He be exalted, according to what he has explained” (Guide, III, 32, p. 526).
Recognizable practices oriented to a new purpose and having new meaning were required.
His wisdom, may He be exalted, and His gracious ruse, which is manifest in regard to all His creatures, did not require that He give us a Law prescribing the rejection, abandonment, and abolition of all these kinds of worship. For one could not then conceive the acceptance of [such a Law], considering the nature of man, which always likes that to which it is accustomed” (Guide, III, 32, p. 526).
This way the people would not reject what was being asked of them as alien and inscrutable. Maimonides, like Aristotle, regarded human beings as creatures of habit in very significant respects. This is one of the respects in which Aristotelian elements of philosophical anthropology and moral psychology are discernible in Maimonides.
These points are also relevant to Maimonides’ treatment of messianism. He argued that when the Messiah reigns there will be no fundamental change in human nature. The world will not be reordered except that it will be a time of universal peace. Israel will have political sovereignty restored to it, and peoples all over the world will engage in study, seeking scientific and philosophical understanding. The ways of the world will not be altered in any fundamental respect except that during the messianic era people will attain and exercise virtue. Moreover, fulfilling the commandments is necessary preparation for that. People need to prepare themselves for rule by the Messiah; until that preparation is done, messianic claims should be severely tested.
Habits and the importance of habituation figure prominently in “Eight Chapters” (Commentary on the Mishnah) and also in “Laws Concerning Character Traits,” (Mishneh Torah). “Eight Chapters” presents much of Maimonides’ moral psychology and the main claims in his conception of free will. In it we find very Aristotelian-sounding philosophical idioms being put to work in the service of some quite un-Aristotelian themes and theses. That the commandments are to be fulfilled has implications for the conception of free will and for the possibility of repentance and character change, and of course, there are many implications for what a human being needs to do in order to realize the perfection proper to humans. Maimonides’ conception of the virtues differs from Aristotle’s in some striking ways, though Maimonides still owes a great deal to Aristotle in respect to the conceptual architecture of virtue.
Like Aristotle, Maimonides emphasized the importance of regular practice, in contrast to any particular episode of decision, in acquiring a virtue. Like Aristotle, he understood virtues and vices as ethically and explanatorily significant states of character. Like Aristotle, he took many virtues to lie in a mean. “The general rule is that he follow the mean for every single character trait, until all his character traits are ordered according to the mean. That is in keeping with what Solomon says: ‘And all your ways will be upright’” (Maimonides, “Laws Concerning Character Traits,” in Ethical Writings of Maimonidess, p. 33).
In addition, Maimonides agreed that there is a vital role for excellent examples, persons of sound judgment and well-ordered dispositions of desire and affect. “It is a positive commandment to cleave to the wise men in order to learn from their actions” (“Laws Concerning Character Traits,” p. 47). Such persons can be important models, shaping the aspirations of others. When one suffers a sickness of the soul, he is to “go to the wise men—who are physicians of the soul—and they will cure their disease by means of the character traits that they shall teach them, until they make them return to the middle way” (“Laws Concerning Character Traits,” p. 31).
Like Aristotle, Maimonides recognizes the significance of the overall character of one’s community and the people by whom one is surrounded. Notwithstanding those and other important points of agreement, Maimonides’ ethics and his account of moral psychology include some elements very different from Aristotle’s views. The differences concern some fundamental, general features of moral psychology as well as the understanding of individual virtues and vices.
With regard to particular virtues Maimonides held that anger and pride are two aspects of our moral psychology that we should do our utmost to minimize. He goes so far as to say that a truly virtuous man will put on a show of anger—because it may be necessary as part of the project of habituating one’s children or making important ethical points to others—while not actually feeling anger. He regarded anger as quite threatening to composure of mind and to attention to God as one’s proper focus. In actually feeling anger the individual is disturbed and is taken over by passion in a way that can misguide judgment and action. That is to be avoided as completely as possible, even when it is appropriate to punish for example.
Because prophecy is ultimately an intellectual phenomenon, one cannot be a prophet if one’s passions are disturbed. Anger and sadness, for example, are impediments to prophecy. In “Laws Concerning Character Traits” Maimonides writes, “the wise men of old said: ‘Anyone who is angry—it is as if he worships idols.’ They said about anyone who is angry: If he is a wise man, his wisdom departs from him, and if he is a prophet, his prophecy departs from him” (“Laws Concerning Character Traits” p. 32). Distractions from intellectual focus and composure are impediments to prophecy.
Pride is another element of moral psychology without proper place in the virtuous person’s character. First of all, we are to be humble before God. We mentioned above the significance of awareness of our finiteness and smallness in contrast to God, and there is also the fact of the radical dependence of all things on God. Scripture says that Moses, the greatest prophet and the leader of the Israelites on their way to becoming a people through his leadership, was very humble. Thus, the sort of humility urged is not inconsistent with courage, resolve, excellent judgment, and the willingness to accept weighty responsibility. Humility concerns restraint of the ego, restraint of self-love in order to remain mindful of the needs and the welfare of others, and guarding against an inflated opinion of oneself and one’s own interests. Torah enjoins again and again to welcome the stranger, to care for the widow, the orphan, and the needy, and for the Israelites not to forget that they were once slaves in Egypt. Humility is a way of registering dependence, showing gratitude for existence and for being sustained, and appreciating the gift of Torah.
Pride and anger are two notable cases regarding which one is to aim for an extreme rather than the mean. “In the case of some character traits, a man is forbidden to accustom himself to the mean. Rather, he shall move to the other extreme. One such [character trait] is a haughty heart, for the good way is not that a man be merely humble, but that he have a lowly spirit, that his spirit be very submissive.” (“Laws Concerning Character Traits,” p. 31)
Every man whose character traits all lie in the mean is called a wise man. Whoever is exceedingly scrupulous with himself and moves a little toward one side or the other, away from the character trait in the mean, is called a pious man. Whoever moves away from a haughty heart to the opposite extreme so that he is exceedingly lowly in spirit is a called a pious man. This is the measure of piety. If he moves only to the mean and is humble, he is called a wise man; this is the measure of wisdom (“Laws Concerning Character Traits,” pp. 29-30).
In general, Maimonides held that the commandments give human beings the discipline to acquire dispositions lying in the mean. “We are commanded to walk in these middle ways, which are the good and right ways. As it is said: ‘And you shall walk in His ways’” (“Laws Concerning Character Traits,” p. 30). He referred to the middle way as “the way of the Lord” (“Laws Concerning Character Traits,” p. 30). Thus, “[t]he Law forbids what it forbids and commands what it commands only for this reason, i.e., that we move away from one side as a means of discipline” (Maimonides, “Eight Chapters,” p. 71). He did, though, include the category of the pious in addition to the wise, noting the appropriateness of certain extremes to the pious.
Maimonides did not encourage severe asceticism and self-punishment. Like many other Jewish thinkers he held that the discipline of the commandments was discipline enough, “Therefore the wise men commanded that a man only abstain from things forbidden by the Torah” (“Eight Chapters,” p. 34). Quoting the sages, he asks, “‘Is what Torah has prohibited not enough for you, that you prohibit other things for yourself?’” (“Eight Chapters,” p. 34).
Maimonides made an important moral-psychological distinction between fulfilling the commandments that concern matters ascertainable by human reason, the things “generally accepted,” and those concerning matters of the “traditional laws,” that is, the hukkim. Those are what Saadia called “the laws of revelation” in contrast to “the laws of reason.” In regard to what is generally accepted, he quotes Talmud, writing, “If they were not written down, they would deserve to be written down.” (“Eight Chapters,” p. 80) The traditional laws make a different sort of demand on inclination and desire. They specify prohibitions that would not, just on the basis of what reason generally accepts, be arrived at. For that reason, there is greater virtue in fulfilling those commandments when it is a struggle to do so, while the person who is temperate with regard to what reason requires is better than the person who struggles to fulfill those commandments. With regard to murder, theft, fraud, repaying a benefactor with evil rather than gratitude, and so forth, it is better to have no desire to do what is prohibited.
With regard to the dietary laws, ritual laws, and so forth, there is greater virtue in successfully battling an inclination to do what is prohibited than in simply having no such desire. Thus, in the case of one type of commandment, virtue is superior to continence; in the case of the other type of commandment, continence, in the face of struggling against desire, is superior. This was Maimonides’ method of resolving what appeared to be a contradiction between what ‘the philosophers’ say and what ‘the sages’ say. It is, he asserts, “a marvelous subtlety and a wonderful reconciliation of the two views” (“Eight Chapters,” p. 80). This approach acknowledges the special difficulty involved with the ritual laws and commandments unique to the Jewish people. Maimonides saw that it would be unreasonable to expect people to be able to fulfill those on the basis of natural tendencies. One might have a natural disposition to be kind and compassionate, but no one has a natural disposition to fulfill say, the laws concerning specific practices associated with holy days, diet or sacrifices of specific types.
Two issues regarding which Maimonides’ views departed significantly from Aristotle’s are freedom of the will and repentance. Both are related in a significant respect. Repentance, as Maimonides understood it, is possible only if persons have free will and Maimonides insisted that the Law and the commandments would be pointless without freedom of the will:
If man’s actions were done under compulsion, the commandments and prohibitions of the Law would be nullified and they would all be absolutely in vain, since man would have no choice in what he does. Similarly, instruction and education, including instruction in all the productive arts, would necessarily be in vain an would all be futile (“Eight Chapters,” pp. 84-5).
He maintained that “[r]eward and punishment would also be sheer injustice, not be be [sic] meted out by some of us to others nor by God to us (“Eight Chapters,” p. 85).
There is no question that humans have free will. “The truth about which there is no doubt at all is that all of man’s actions are given over to him (“Eight Chapters,” p. 85). This is a robust version of ‘ought implies can,’ such that God’s wisdom and justice are at stake. The notion that a human being might lack freedom of the will is simply unsupportable, and Maimonides’ argument concerning the Law has a result that comports with his critique of astrological determinism.
Moreover, despite the weight he put on the importance of habits in shaping a person’s character and in the acquisition of virtues and vices, Maimonides also argued that even a mature individual is able to change his character through repentance. The regularly virtuous person is still able to sin, and the regularly vicious person is able to ethically reorient himself, connecting with the good through changing his dispositions and following the commandments.
Aristotle held that through the process of habituation, including how one habituates oneself, a person acquires a second nature, a developed character, which becomes fixed or very nearly fixed. The plasticity of one’s capacities is largely exhausted as a result of exercising them in specific ways such that certain specific states of character are formed. That’s just what it is to have a character. This does not mean that a person must be either soundly virtuous or profoundly vicious. Most people are continent rather than temperate, and they may never cease to struggle to some extent to do what virtue requires. In Aristotle’s view the chief point is that, whatever the extent of one’s virtues or vices, the individual is very likely to reach a condition in which states of character are firmly established. In having a character, one has dispositions of desire and emotion and engages in patterns and policies of reasoning in quite regular ways. In Aristotle’s view it would not be reasonable to expect of people in general that they should be able to change their mature characters.
Aristotle (especially in the Rhetoric) discusses certain characteristic features of persons at different stages in life—how young men differ from men late in life, and so forth. Still, his view was that one’s second nature, one’s ethically relevant dispositions to choose, to act, and to respond, tends to be stable rather than easily changed. The dispositions into which a person settles shape the person’s judgments, awareness, and deliberations. It is not as though there is rational agency and separate from that are elements of character. One’s character just is the form that one’s rational agency takes on account of how specific dispositions are reflected in one’s choices, actions, and responses. In this view the person established in vice may not even be able to recognize what virtue requires. After all, that person is settled in a (wrong) conception of what is worthwhile and desirable and may see no reason to revise that conception. Even supposing that recognition of what virtue requires is possible, the vicious person may not have any effective desire to change.
For Maimonides it was crucial that a significant revision of a person’s dispositions is possible. That is a necessary condition of genuine repentance, which is something Maimonides held is never practically impossible. Even the person established in profound vices and enjoying vicious activities, can come to see what virtue requires and can achieve ethical reorientation. It should be noted that there are a few instances in the Hebrew Bible in which God prevents a person from repenting and makes it impossible for that agent to do the right thing. The ‘hardening of Pharaoh’s heart’ just before the exodus from Egypt is a notable example. The difficulty of interpreting the morality of such a case made it a fixture of medieval Jewish philosophy. Maimonides addresses the instance explicitly. There is not space here to discuss it in depth. It is indeed a hard case but that is because it is at odds with another view that he held, namely, that people have freedom of the will adequate to repent genuinely.
The Law has a crucial role in helping people to achieve ethical reorientation. First, the Law supplies accessible guidance. Even if the people by whom one is surrounded are poor examples, an individual is not utterly cut off from direction and guidance concerning virtue. The Law provides accessible guidance in a way that is not part of Aristotle’s view. If there are no persons around with practical wisdom, an Aristotelian agent may not be able to ascertain what is virtuous and good. The guidance of actual exemplars is likely to be vitally important to the cultivation and encouragement of virtue given Aristotle’s moral psychology. Maimonides also thought that exemplars and the prevailing norms of the community are crucial. However, the Law provides a measure for who is to count as an exemplar. Its guidance is accessible in a way for which there is no counterpart in Aristotle’s ethical view. In “Laws of Repentance” Maimonides writes, “If one desires to turn towards the good way and be righteous, he has the power to do” (Maimonides, “Laws of Repentance,” V, 1). He says, “Every person turns to the way which he desires, spontaneously and of his own volition” (“Laws of Repentance,” V, 2). In the Guide Maimonides writes, “If then the individual believed that this fracture [the tendency to sin] can never be remedied, he would persist in his error and sometimes perhaps disobey even more because of the fact that no stratagem remains at his disposal” (Guide, III, 36, p. 540).
The Law also includes guidance regarding the practices through which repentance is possible. It shows persons what is involved in the effort to re-orient oneself to virtue. Repentance is not simply a matter of decision. It requires certain kinds of recognition, reflective self-knowledge, knowledge of what is really good, not only apparently good, and knowledge of the practices required to re-turn to God and to attain virtue. Maimonides acknowledged the ‘inertia,’ so to speak, of second nature, while also holding that a person can radically redirect volition. There are many commandments concerning repentance. Thus, the agent who is genuinely motivated to make the effort can know what is needed in order to make an effective effort.
This more libertarian conception of free will, at least in contrast to Aristotle, is connected with moral epistemology and important issues in moral psychology. The ‘ought’ of the commandments implies that we can do what is required, and in order to do what is required, we need to know what is required. In fact, the notion that what the Law requires is not too hard for human beings to grasp is an important principle in Jewish thought. Maimonides agreed with Aristotle in regard to each person being born with a certain temperament and having specific propensities and susceptibilities through no choice or fault of one’s own. However, Maimonides had a more optimistic conception of the depth of change one can bring about in one’s character, made possible by and through fulfilling the commandments.
In Aristotle’s view, happiness is attainable by a human being if the individual is fortunate with respect to external conditions and with respect to habituation by others, and if one habituates oneself in a sound manner. The core of happiness depends upon the self-determined agency of the individual but certain external conditions are also required. For some, something like the happiness of the gods may even be attainable. However, in Aristotle’s view there is not a notion of redemption or providential history as there is in the Abrahamic faith-traditions. There is, however, something like blessedness—the favor of the gods—but it is not a clear counterpart to monotheistic providence. In Judaism, providence and redemption are closely connected with the notion of covenant. Through the covenant they have an enduring relation with God, to whom they answer for their sins and by whom their virtue is to be rewarded.
Many related topics, such as repentance, worship, the aspiration to be holy, and responsibilities with respect to other members of the national community are to be understood through their connections with covenant. Like Aristotle, Maimonides attached considerable importance to the community in which one lives and the ways in which the public, social world can influence character:
A disciple of wise men is not permitted to live in any city that does not have these ten things: a physician, a surgeon, a bathhouse, a bathroom, a fixed source of water such as a river or spring, a synagogue, a teacher of children, a scribe, a collector of charity, and a court that can punish with lashes and imprisonment (“Laws Concerning Character Traits,” p. 41).
These are all needed in order for a person to live well. In addition, “It is a positive commandment to cleave to the wise men in order to learn from their actions” (“Laws Concerning Character Traits,” p. 47). This emphasis on the community is connected with covenant inasmuch as the commandments are a comprehensive guide to life and not just ethical guidance or guidance for worship. Jewish law extends to all sorts of aspects of life, and there are not clear, systematic distinctions between criminal law and torts or between law and religion or ethics and religious life.
The Talmud, which is the written version of the Oral Law, covers everything from agricultural practice, to marriage, to tithing, to criminal procedure and sentences, to contracts, forgiveness, sexuality, and so forth. Some commandments could not be fulfilled because of the destruction of the Temple and the lack of a self-determining political entity. But Maimonides did not therefore maintain that those portions of the Law were irrelevant or ceased to be integral. Rather, they would have to wait upon the restoration of the Temple.
We noted above that Maimonides had an intellectualist conception of human nature. In the final chapters of the Guide he emphasizes this and claims, “Thus it is clear that after apprehension, total devotion to Him and the employment of intellectual thought in constantly loving Him should be aimed at. Mostly this is achieved in solitude and isolation. Hence every excellent man stays frequently in solitude and does not meet anyone unless it is necessary” (Guide, III, 51, p. 621). In “Laws Concerning Character Traits” Maimonides indicates several respects in which a man should be preoccupied with thought of God, even to the extent of feigning attention to more mundane matters. This is not because it is perfectly all right to ignore one’s spouse or children or neighbors but, rather, because this is how a person guards against pride and distraction from the true and the good. Indulging in gossip, bearing a grudge, idol worship, and illicit sexual union are all examples of how one can be led down a bad path of aroused passions and desires, harming oneself and others. Accordingly, “[i]t is proper for a man to overlook all things of the world, for according to those who understand, everything is vain and empty and not worth taking vengeance for” (“Laws Concerning Character Traits,” p. 52).
The question of the relation between philosophy and revealed religion in Maimonides’ thought has motivated considerable debate. The chief point of dispute is whether Maimonides actually held that the claims of revealed religion are untenable and that his works deliberately disguise his true convictions, namely that the claims of reason leave no place for revealed religion. Thus, advocates of the view maintain that there is a deep political purpose to a work such as the Guide; it supports the claims of revealed religion and its tradition by appearance only in order not to undermine and demoralize the many Jews for whom fidelity to the tradition shaped their world and their lives. Critics of the case for Maimonidean esotericism agree that Maimonides’ views are complex, involve apparent contradictions, and that he presents part of a line of reasoning in one place and other parts in other places without clear signals, especially in the Guide. However, they argue that there is a consistent, undisguised theme of explicating religion in philosophical terms because of his genuine commitment to philosophy and tradition.
Maimonides’ thought aroused controversy during and after his life, and it has influenced important philosophers in diverse ways. It is a rationalistic understanding of Judaism and at the same time it ascribes fundamental importance to tradition. It includes many distinctively medieval elements and aspects, yet it manages to remain relevant through the ways it formulates and addresses some of the most fundamental questions concerning philosophy, religion, and the relations between them.
Maimonides’ negative theology and the rationalistic valence of his thought influenced Aquinas, and later, Leibniz and Spinoza. Maimonides and Spinoza are similar in the respect that the relation between philosophy and theism in their thought is complex, controversial, and continues to motivate vigorous debate. In the context of the recently growing interest in more and more figures and periods of the history of philosophy, the medievals are certainly benefiting, being read and studied much more widely than, say, twenty-five or thirty years ago, no less fifty or a hundred years ago. A good deal of fine scholarship on Maimonides, and Spinoza too, has been published in the late twentieth and early twenty-first centuries, and much of it concerns the relations between philosophy and religion. Scholarly debates abound, and in the present discussion I have only hinted at some of the most important of them. One of the benefits of the increased attention to the history of philosophy is that increasing numbers of scholars and students of philosophy are recognizing the profound and ambitious originality of Maimonides’ thought. It is certainly not ‘Aristotle plus Judaism,’ a formulation that barely makes sense.
Maimonides developed an original, important conception of how a tradition anchored in revelation can be understood in philosophically rationalistic terms. As long as we are careful with jargon, we can say that he elaborated a broadly rationalistic conception of revealed religion, wringing out of it mystery, superstition, and any elements inconsistent with truths of reason. It is not difficult to see how his thought could have influenced seventeenth century rationalists.
Among them, Spinoza was a vehement critic of traditional Judaism, and yet there are respects in which his project and Maimonides’ share important features. Spinoza wanted to isolate and separate out from religion whatever rational truths may be embedded in it. In a sense, that is what Maimonides was doing though he argued that a great deal more of the concrete, practical content of the faith-tradition could be shown to be rationally justifiable. His anthropology was, perhaps, less optimistic than Spinoza’s. Maimonides and Spinoza were both centrally concerned with how we are to understand God and God’s relation to everything else. Their views of this matter diverge in decisive ways; after all, Spinoza held that God and nature are one, and Maimonides held that God transcends everything else so completely that we can only attain any understanding of God by way of a negative theology. But in each philosopher’s thought there is a crucial commitment to the notion that happiness depends upon understanding and that a human being’s deepest and most enduring gratifications are attained through disciplined desires and passions along with understanding. There is a deep-seated Stoic-like dimension to Spinoza’s thought, and though the metaphysics is very different from Spinoza’s, Maimonides’ thought also has some Stoic resonances in the way in which it understands relations between reason, freedom, perfection, and the enjoyment of them.
Maimonides was able to influence non-Jewish philosophers because his thought concerns themes and questions that are not ‘local’ to Judaism, even though the way that he pursues those themes and questions is deeply Jewish and attuned to details of Jewish tradition and Jewish life. Still, he understood Judaism as concerned with human perfection. For Maimonides fulfillment of the commandments and fidelity to tradition enable an individual to be perfected as a human being not merely as an excellent Jew. He insisted that no prophecy could exceed Moses’ and that Torah is a perfect instrument for guiding a person to perfection, but the notion of perfection involved in this view includes no element of mystery or an essentialism of a particular people.
In Maimonides’ view, being a Jew is a matter of a person’s ethical and intellectual convictions and commitments, rather than exclusively a matter of ethnicity or lineage. At the same time, the particular history and traditions of the Jewish people had fundamental significance to Maimonides. His philosophy is a powerful, intriguing, and challenging example of the project of finding and articulating universally significant principles, commitments, and ideals in the life and history of a particular people.
This is a selective bibliography. Maimonides himself wrote a great deal, and the number of works on Maimonides is extensive. This list includes Maimonides’ most important works relevant to philosophy and some of the most important scholarly and interpretive literature on Maimonides.
City University of New York
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Last updated: December 17, 2012 | Originally published: