The second wife of King Louis XIV of France, Madame de Maintenon has long fascinated historians and novelists by her improbable life. Born into an impoverished, criminal family, Maintenon conquered salon society as the wife of the poet Paul Scarron. During her salon years, she studied the philosophical currents of the period, notably libertinism and Cartesianism. Maintenon then conquered court society as the governess of the illegitimate children of King Louis XIV and finally as the wife of the widowed King. The controversies surrounding her social ascent have long obscured the contributions of Maintenon to educational and moral philosophy. The founder and director of the celebrated school for women at Saint-Cyr, Maintenon defended her theories of education for women in a series of addresses to the Saint-Cyr faculty. In her pedagogical philosophy, practical moral formation rather than intellectual cultivation emerges as the primary goal of schooling. Her dramatic dialogues and addresses to students developed her distinctive moral philosophy, based on detailed analysis of the moral virtues to be cultivated by the pupils. In her account of the cardinal virtues, temperance holds pride of place. Addressing Saint-Cyr’s student body of aristocratic girls and women, Maintenon devoted particular attention to the virtues of civility essential for polite society. Her philosophy of virtues is a gendered one inasmuch as Maintenon attempted to redefine traditionally masculine virtues in terms of current female experience.
Françoise d’Augbigné was born on November 27-28, 1635, allegedly in the prison of Niort in central France. Her father Constant d’Aubigné was a career criminal who had received jail terms for murder, kidnapping, treason, and debt. Disowned by his father Agrippa d’Aubigné, a prominent Huguenot military officer and poet, Constant d’Aubigné had married Jeanne de Cardhilac, daughter of Niort’s prison warden, in 1627. Françoise’s harrowing childhood included a stay in Martinique (1645-1647) during one of her father’s failed political adventures; a bitter stay with a distant relative who used her as a domestic servant (1648); tempestuous periods at Ursuline convent schools in Niort and Paris (1648); and a painful return to her impoverished mother (1649-1652), during which time the young Françoise was forced to beg in the streets. A personal witness to the religious divisions of the period, she was baptized Catholic by her mother at birth, raised as a Protestant by her kindly aunt, Madame de Villette, and then converted to Catholicism by her Ursuline teachers. The adolescent study of Plutarch introduced her to the period’s vogue for Stoicism and cultivated her lifelong taste for the literature of moral edification.
In 1652 Françoise d’Aubigné married her only suitor: the poet Paul Scarron. The odd match became an object of ridicule in the Parisian salons. Twenty-five years her senior, Scarron was a paralyzed, impotent satirist renowned for the vitriol of his verse burlesques. Despite its unpromising origins, the marriage proved a reasonable success. Madame Scarron patiently nursed a sickly husband who visibly esteemed his beautiful and intelligent young wife. The tiny apartment of the Scarrons quickly became a salon for Parisian authors of a libertine bent. Madame Scarron acquired a philosophical culture from the salon habitués: Benserade, Chapelain, Vivonne, Saint-Aignan, Costar, and Ménage. She was especially influenced by George Brossin, chevalier de Méré, the essayist who argued that the honnête homme, the temperate person who exercised restraint in arriving at judgments, should be the moral ideal of an age exhausted by religious fanaticism. During these salon sessions Madame Scarron also read and debated the works of Descartes.
At the death of her husband in 1660, Madame Scarron faced a precarious future, but her salon contacts permitted her to find some financial support and to continue her pursuit of literary and philosophical culture. In 1669 she accepted a delicate mission: to serve as the governess for the illegitimate children of Louis XIV and her fellow salonnière, Madame de Montespan. Her skillful education of the children impressed the king and his stormy mistress. Her expert nursing of their son, the Duke of Maine, during a serious illness appeared to them miraculous. In 1674, a grateful Louis XIV granted the devoted governess the lands and title of the fief of Maintenon. Newly ennobled and financially secure, Madame de Maintenon now took her own place as a titled aristocrat among the courtiers of Versailles. When the affair between Louis XIV and Madame de Montespan collapsed, Maintenon encouraged the king to reconcile with his estranged wife, Marie-Thérèse of Austria. The successful reconciliation between the spouses enhanced Maintenon’s standing in court but earned her the enmity of her old patron, Madame de Montespan.
After the sudden death of Queen Marie-Thérèse on July 9, 1683, the king drew closer to Maintenon. On October 9, 1683, the archbishop of Paris married the couple in a private ceremony. The bride’s modest social origins raised a problem, since Louis XIV had insisted on dynastic marriages for other members of his family. The marriage was never publicly announced, although the court quickly perceived that Madame de Maintenon had assumed the role and duties of Louis XIV’s legitimate wife. The private marriage was also morganatic; Maintenon would never assume the title of queen and no relative of hers could claim the right to the throne.
In 1684 Maintenon began her life’s work: the construction of a school for the education of daughters of the impoverished nobility. Situated in 1686 at Saint-Cyr, the Institute of Saint Louis was generously subsidized by Louis XIV. Maintenon personally supervised the direction of the school, designed to serve two hundred and fifty students. The school possessed a comparatively sophisticated curriculum, featuring courses in religion, reading, writing, mathematics, Latin, music, painting, dancing, needlework, and home economics. Dissatisfied with the narrowly religious education provided by the convent schools of the period, Maintenon founded her own lay group of teachers, the Dames of Saint-Louis, to provide instruction. Maintenon insisted that dialogue rather than lecture was to be the primary means of education in the Saint-Cyr classroom.
Saint-Cyr underwent three distinct periods in its pedagogical development. In its artistic period (1686-1689), the school emphasized cultural achievement by its students. Sophisticated concerts, plays, debates, and liturgical services soon attracted a prestigious Parisian public. The artistic period achieved its culmination in the world premiere of Jean Racine’s Esther on January 26, 1689. The cultural triumph of the school, however, created educational problems. Dazzled by the applause of the court, students began to neglect their studies; class time began to shrink in favor of rehearsals for the elaborate school performances.
During its mystical period (1690-97), Maintenon sought to combat the worldliness of the earlier artistic phase by promoting piety in the school. The faculty and students soon fell under the influence of Madame de Guyon, a controversial religious leader and friend of Maintenon. The Quietism promoted by Guyon stressed simplicity in prayer, confidence in God, and retirement from the world. Maintenon grew disenchanted with a piety that seemed to undercut the acquisition of virtue and ardor in one’s studies and future work. By the middle of the decade, Maintenon encouraged Louis XIV’s campaign against Quietism and the expulsion of faculty sympathetic to Quietism.
By the end of the seventeenth century, Maintenon had guided Saint-Cyr toward the pedagogical model she would support until her death. This approach to education stressed the acquisition of moral virtues by the students and development of the practical skills these impoverished women would need in their future lives as wives of provincial aristocrats in straitened financial circumstances. This practical mode of education, with its distinctive moralistic coloration, would remain the guiding ethos of Saint-Cyr until its dissolution by revolutionaries in 1793.
Given the secret nature of her marriage, Maintenon’s influence on the court of Louis XIV remained a discreet one. She clearly counseled her husband on religious matters, especially the appointment of bishops and abbots, but her role in the Revocation of the Edict of Nantes and the intensification of anti-Protestant measures by Louis XIV has been exaggerated by later critics. Her primary interest remained the direction of the school at Saint-Cyr, to which she retired in 1715, shortly after the death of Louis XIV.
Madame de Maintenon died at Saint-Cyr on April 17, 1719.
The majority of the works left by Madame de Maintenon originated during her tenure at the Institute of Saint Louis (1686-1719). The Dames of Saint-Louis carefully transcribed the many addresses Maintenon delivered to the faculty and student body. Maintenon would then correct and revise the transcriptions. In addition, she composed dramatic monologues to be performed in class. The Dames collected these various texts of Madame de Maintenon into a series of manuscript collections, the last and largest of which date from 1740. In addition, a massive correspondence of over five thousand letters written by Maintenon has survived. Théophile Lavallée’s multi-volume edition of Maintenon’s writings (1854-66) remains the most thorough print edition of Maintenon, but we remain far from a complete – let alone a critical – edition of her works.
Of particular philosophical importance are the writings where Maintenon treats ethical issues, especially the nature of virtue and vice. Her Entretiens are conferences with the Saint-Cyr faculty in which Maintenon emphasizes the formation in virtue that is the principal end of education at the school. Her Instructions are addresses to the students in which she censures the typical vices and exalts the ideal virtues of the student body. Her Conversations (dialogues) are brief morality plays that define and illustrate the major virtues the student must inculcate. Maintenon’s approach to ethics is gendered inasmuch as she redefines the virtues and vices, originally defined in terms of male experience, in the framework of typical women’s experience. Her approach is also class-conscious, since she attempts to redefine the virtues in the perspective of women who are simultaneously aristocratic and impoverished.
The primary philosophical interest of Maintenon’s works lies in its treatment of two related topics: educational theory and virtue theory. For Maintenon, the primary goal of education is the formation of the moral character of the pupil, interpreted according to the canons of Counter-reformational Catholicism. The secondary goal is vocational formation. In the case of Saint-Cyr, it is the development of the skills and the moral habits of the pupil who faces the future as a member of the impoverished, provincial nobility. Maintenon transforms the nature of moral virtue according to the demands of gender and social class. Traditionally masculine virtues, such as courage, are redefined to serve as the ideal ethical traits of the industrious wife largely confined to the domestic sphere. Virtues typical of the aristocratic class, notably politeness and civility, are raised to the status of primary moral dispositions.
In her addresses to the faculty of Saint-Cyr, Maintenon sketches her philosophy of education. The ends of education are traditional: the formation of moral character for a Catholic member of the provincial aristocracy. But the dialogical methods of pedagogy championed by Maintenon exhibit a distinctive modernity.
Of Solid Education explains the educational end of Saint-Cyr for the faculty: “You [the teachers] apply yourself to developing the piety, the reason, and the morals of your girls. You inspire in them the love and practices of all virtues proper to them now and in the future.” Maintenon insists that the virtue to be cultivated and the means used to achieve this ethical culture must always be “reasonable,” but this reasonableness is of a practical rather than speculative nature. Of the Education of Young Ladies specifies how this practical reasonableness differs from erudition or aesthetic achievement: “You [the teachers] should concern yourself less with furnishing their mind than with forming their reason. Obviously, this approach provides less occasion for the knowledge and skill of the schoolmistress to sparkle. A young woman who has memorized a thousand things impresses her family and friends more than does a girl who simply knows how to exercise her judgment, when to be silent, how to be modest and reserved, how to avoid rushing into showing what she thinks about something.” This pedagogical ideal of practical reasonableness underscores the primacy Maintenon accords the virtues of discretion and restraint for aristocratic women, who are often plunged into dangerous political controversies. It also expresses the mature Maintenon’s disillusionment with the aesthetic and mystical ideals that had earlier served as the educational end of Saint-Cyr.
To maintain the moral atmosphere of the school, Maintenon insists on a strict regime of censorship. In Of the Danger of Profane Books, she condemns the use of all books that lack explicit religious or moral utility. “I call profane all books that are not religious, even if they seem innocent, as soon as it is clear that they have no real usefulness. Teach your pupils to be extremely cautious in their reading. They should always prefer their needlework, housework, or their duties in their state of life to it. If they really want to read, ensure that they use carefully chosen books apt to nourish their faith, to cultivate their judgment, and to guide their morals.” Of the Proper Choice of Theatrical Pieces underlines the risk of heresy as well as of moral corruption run by too lenient a regime of literary surveillance: “Don’t you [the teachers] realize the ease with which you grant entry to these little booklets without preliminary approval exposes your pupils to the greatest dangers? If the Jansenists and the Quietists knew this weakness, they would immediately find the secret in order to spread their errors. They would flood you with pamphlets containing the maxims, phrases, and songs which they sell for practically nothing.” Theoretical instruction in the demands of virtue is insufficient for the actual cultivation of it. The personal moral modeling by the faculty and the strictly moral and religiously orthodox atmosphere maintained by the faculty in the school are essential for the successful maturation of the Saint-Cyr pupil along the lines of Maintenon’s practical reasonableness.
If character formation is the central goal of education, the teacher must engage in regular dialogue with her pupils. In her faculty addresses, Maintenon criticizes the tendency of teachers to use lectures and to overvalue the cultivation of the memory of their pupils. To assist in the perfection of moral character, the schoolmistress should regularly engage in conversation with her pupils. Of the Education of Ladies argues that teacher-pupil dialogue should occur outside as well as inside the classroom: “On occasion you [the teachers] should be ready to chat informally with your pupils. This will help the pupils to love and trust you. You can acquire an influence over them that will prove beneficial.” The pupil is not to remain passive in this dialogue. The teacher can function as an accurate spiritual director only if the pupil discloses her actual moral struggles and achievements: “Sometimes you [the teachers] should let them express their will so that you may understand their basic dispositions. You then more accurately teach them the differences between the good, the evil, and the morally indifferent.” Maintenon’s insistence on a dialogical method of instruction reflects the value placed on refined conversation in the aristocratic circles of the period; it also expresses the conviction that the pedagogy of moral formation cannot succeed if the moral tutor has not gauged the actual moral temperament of the pupil as the tutor guides her to the school’s ideal of ethical maturity.
In several works Maintenon analyzes the four cardinal virtues: justice, fortitude, prudence, and temperance. Strikingly, whereas most philosophers would name justice as the most important virtue, Maintenon prizes temperance as the central virtue in a moral character. Without the restraining hand of temperance, the other virtues would quickly deteriorate into rigorism, foolhardiness, or fearfulness.
In the dialogue On the Cardinal Virtues, Maintenon defends this primacy of temperance in the ensemble of virtues. At the beginning of the dialogue, Justice presents its traditional claim as the preeminent virtue: “There is nothing as beautiful as Justice. It always has truth beside it. It judges without bias. It puts everything into order. It knows how to condemn its friends and to honor the rights of its enemies. It can even condemn itself. It only honors what is worthy of honor.” But the other cardinal virtues soon manifest their eminence over justice by demonstrating why and how the virtue of justice must be subordinated to them in order for justice to actually achieve its social ends. Prudence prevents justice from acting in too brusque a manner. “I [prudence] regulate its [justice’s] operations, prevent it from precipitation, make it take its time.” Similarly, fortitude strengthens justice when justice hesitates to execute proper punishment on a friend. “You [justice] need me [fortitude] because your sense of affection makes you find it difficult to inflict any pain on a friend.” While justice can determine where to assign just dessert, the execution of this determination requires the conjugated virtues of prudence and fortitude to avoid the distortions of severity or pusillanimity.
Standing above prudence and fortitude is the virtue of temperance. It imposes itself as the central virtue inasmuch as it prevents the other virtues from deteriorating into their customary excesses. “I destroy gluttony and excess. I tolerate no outbursts. Not only am I opposed to all evil; I moderate all good. Without me, Justice would be intolerable to human weakness, Fortitude would drive us to despair, Prudence would often prevent us from taking the actions we should and make waste our time weighing every option. But with me, Justice acquires a capacity for circumspection, Fortitude acquires suppleness, and Prudence continues to provide advice, but now without undue hesitation, without too much or too little haste. In a word, I am the remedy to all forms of extremism.” The primacy accorded temperance in the hierarchy of virtue parallels the emphasis accorded the values of discretion and good reputation in the education provided at Saint-Cyr.
Even the virtues of religion must subordinate themselves to the empire of temperance. Exercises of piety are to be commended only to the extent that they reflect the moderation and sobriety typical of the virtue of temperance. “I [temperance] must temper a religious zeal that is too busy, too emotional, and indiscreet. I have to encourage conduct that avoids extremes. I moderate both the inclination to give alms and the inclination to hoard money. I moderate the length of prayer, ascetical practices, recollection, silence, and good works. I shorten a sermon, a spiritual dialogue, or an examination of conscience.” Echoing Méré’s portrait of the honnête homme, Maintenon’s moral ideal of the student is the woman who subjects all thought and action to the moderating influence of temperance. Neither the mystic nor the activist represents Maintenon’s ideal of the moral agent who distinguishes herself through the modesty and emotional restraint with which she serves her neighbor.
Given her exclusively feminine public of students and faculty, Maintenon often transforms the nature of the virtues in order to accommodate the sex-specific experience of women of the period. Her gendered transformation of virtue is apparent in her analysis of three particular virtues: courage, glory, and eminence.
The dramatic dialogue On Courage demonstrates how women as well as men are required to cultivate the virtue of courage. At the beginning of the dialogue, Faustine insists that courage is not proper for women. “Courage is not having any fear. This type of achievement is not for our sex.” Victoria counters that, although women are not called to cultivate the martial courage proper to men, there are other types of courage necessary to women. “Certainly courage is opposed to fear. But there is more than one kind of fear. It is not necessary for us to cultivate the courage that makes someone go to war or be willing to risk his life.” It is precisely the pupils and alumnae of Saint-Cyr who illustrate the type of courage proper to women. Courage within the school manifests itself in the diligence with which one executes the duties of the school day. “There are those who joyfully fulfill all their duties and who are first in everything. They love work, they want to please their teachers, and they want to do even more than one asks of them.” Saint-Cyr alumnae express this gendered courage by enduring the constraints of the impoverished life of the provincial aristocracy. Emily muses about “the poverty we may find in the future and the foul character of those with whom we will have to deal. They very well might criticize without the moderation we are accustomed to here [at Saint-Cyr].” Distinct from the courage of the warrior, the courage of women presents itself as the capacity to endure academic and domestic obstacles in the patient pursuit of one’s personal vocation as student or mistress of the manor.
Similarly, glory is redefined away from its traditionally masculine framework of military prowess or political preeminence. For Maintenon, glory is a matter of personal integrity that could manifest itself as easily in domestic work as in military or political achievement. The address On True Glory defines glory as a species of personal honor: “I believe that true glory consists in loving one’s honor and in never performing any base action.” Maintenonian glory is clearly gendered. It not only includes the refusal of any major sin; it encompasses the refusal of typical female indiscretions, such as flirtation, receiving gifts from men, or accepting letters from men unknown to the addressee. The address insists that glory is not a biological category, reposing on one’s familial descent; it is a type of integrity and self-reliance allied to hard work. “There is much more nobility in living from one’s work and from one’s savings than in being a burden to one’s friends….I wouldn’t tell rich people to sell their needlework, but I would tell those who aren’t so rich to do so.” Rather than being tied to distinguished public achievement, glory emerges as a simple preeminence in the practice of sacrificial virtues of service. “We ordinarily recognize glory by its honesty and even by its humility, by its concern to give pleasure to others, to relieve pain, to avoid giving offense, and to render service.” Freed from its traditional accoutrements of wealth, military valor, and social prominence, the redefined virtue of glory can now be cultivated as easily by impoverished women as it is by others.
In the dialogue On Eminence, Maintenon redefines the aristocratic virtue of eminence to include the experience of impoverished but industrious women. The dialogue denies that eminence consists in social rank or economic fortune; on the contrary, authentic eminence consists in an unusual degree of self-mastery. “True eminence consists in esteeming virtue alone, in knowing how to distance ourselves from fortune when it turns against us and how to avoid being intoxicated by fortune when it turns our way. It consists in sharing the destiny of the unfortunate and in never holding them in contempt.” In this fusion of neo-Stoic and Christian theories of virtue, eminence denotes both volitional equilibrium and sacrificial love of the suffering neighbor. The dialogue also insists that authentic eminence must be acquired through personal merit and struggle, not conferred by family descent or inherited wealth. “There are different types of nobility. We have to see ourselves as we are. We should only raise ourselves up through our own merit. That is where we find true eminence.” Paralleling her own controversial career in the French court, Maintenonian eminence subverts a social hierarchy of rank based on biological inheritance and exalts moral and social distinction acquired through tenacious personal endeavor.
Addressing an aristocratic public, Maintenon devotes particular attention to two virtues prized by court society: politeness and civility.
The address On Politeness insists on the central value of good manners to be cultivated by the pupils at Saint-Cyr. “Since God has made you ladies by birth, have a lady’s manners. May those of you who have been properly raised by your parents retain these manners and may the others soon acquire them.” Maintenon details the components of noble comportment: refined language, upright posture, discreet gestures. But Maintenon politeness does not limit itself to a code of external conduct; it is ultimately an interior disposition of respect toward all persons whom the mature aristocrat encounters: “Whatever you say or do, be careful to avoid giving offense or embarrassment to anyone.” The purpose of external polite conduct is to express sensitivity toward the feelings and dignity of others. Maintenon repeatedly reminds her pupils that this posture of reverence includes one’s servants and social inferiors as well as one’s peers and social superiors.
Complementing the virtue of politeness, the virtue of civility entails a spirit of sacrificial service toward all those with whom one interacts. The address On Civility presents this virtue as an ascetical attention to the interests and needs of others. “Civility involves freeing oneself in order to be busy about the needs of other people, in paying attention to what can help or hinder them, in order to do the former and to avoid the latter. Civility entails not talking about oneself, not making others listen too long to oneself, listening carefully to others, avoiding making conversation focus on oneself and one’s tastes, and permitting the conversation to move naturally toward the accommodation of other people’s interests.” Although civility includes the salon art of refined conversation, Maintenon presents the virtue as a refined species of humility, in which the concerns of others trump one’s own.
To clarify the nature of authentic civility, Maintenon appeals to the evangelical golden rule. “The Gospel firmly accords with the duties of a civil life. You know that Our Lord tells us that we should not do to others what we do not want others to do to us. This must be our great rule, which does not rule out certain customs traditional in our native lands.” Civility entails reciprocity, a recognition of the other persons one meets as one’s equal in dignity and in need. Although On Civility admits that the fluctuating customs of a particular culture may require one to show special deference toward those considered socially superior, Maintenonian civility is built on an egalitarian ethics of mutual respect.
The immediate posthumous reputation of Madame de Maintenon was a largely negative one. The memoirs of the courtier Louis de Rouvroy, duc de Saint-Simon (1675-1755), and the letters of Charlotte-Elisabeth of Bavaria, duchesse d’ Orléans (1652-1722), depicted Maintenon as a schemer who manipulated Louis XIV’s emotions of grief to achiever her power and then used that power to intensify the anti-Protestant policies of the throne. The publication of Maintenon’s alleged letters (1752) by the Huguenot writer Laurent Angliviel de La Beaumelle presented Maintenon as the hidden architect of Louis XIV’s Revocation of the Edict of Nantes and other persecutory measures. Subsequent discovery of the forged nature of the most incriminating letters in La Beaumelle’s collection did little to soften the image of Maintenon as a manipulative bigot, an image still present in Patricia Mazuy’s film Saint-Cyr (2000).
In the nineteenth-century, Théophile Lavallée’s multi-volume edition of the works of Maintenon (1854-66) presented the breadth and complexity of Maintenon’s extensive writings. Commentators began to note Maintenon’s skill as a moraliste, an analyst of the conflicting interplay of virtue and vice in the human constitution. In the late nineteenth-century, educational officials of the French Third Republic attempted to foster public high school education for women through the new institution of the lycée. Maintenon’s addresses and dialogues seemed perfectly suited for an adolescent female public cultivating the virtues necessary for citizenship. The anthologies of Maintenon’s texts assembled by Cadet (1885), Faguet (1885), Geoffroy (1887), and Jacquinet (1888) were textbooks designed for the new lycée. But these anthologies presented an oddly areligious Maintenon, carefully denatured by the anti-clerical Third Republic. References to God, religion, and piety were often censored out of her texts; only the more secular virtues survived.
Recent studies of Maintenon have attempted to present a more positive evaluation of Maintenon as a philosopher. Madeleine Daniélou’s study of Maintenon’s educational theories and practices (1948) underscores her innovations as an educational philosopher and the theological foundations of that philosophy. John Conley’s English translation of and commentary on Maintenon (2004) describes the complexity of her moral psychology, especially in her account of virtue and freedom. Other commentators, however, notably Carolyn Lougee (1976) and Carlo François (1987), lament that Maintenon’s educational experiments and theories still confined women to the spheres of the household and of the convent.
All French to English translations were made by the author of this article.
John J. Conley
Loyola University of Maryland
Last updated: September 12, 2009 | Originally published: