Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Nicolas Malebranche: Religion

MalebrancheNicolas Malebranche (1638-1715) was a French philosopher and a rationalist in the Cartesian tradition. But he was also an Oratorian priest in the Catholic Church. Religious themes pervade his works, and in several places he clearly affirms his intention to write philosophy as a Catholic. These religious themes are important for understanding his philosophy. As a rationalist, Malebranche places great emphasis on the importance of Reason. However, because he identifies Reason with the Divine Word, that is, with the Son or Second Person of the Trinity, his rationalism has features that are not common among other forms of rationalism. For example, Reason is a divine person and therefore capable of a wide range of action. In tracing out some of the consequences of this identification of Reason with the Divine Word, the student of Malebranche is quickly immersed in a wide range of his favorite theological and philosophical ideas. The present article will explore three theological ideas which play a special role in Malebranche’s philosophical thought: the Trinity, Original Sin, and the Incarnation.

Table of Contents

  1. A Trinitarian Account of Reason
  2. Love and Order
  3. Original Sin
  4. Universal Reason as External Teacher
  5. Conclusion
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Reference Format
    2. Further Reading

1. A Trinitarian Account of Reason

The features of the doctrine of the Trinity that are of the greatest importance for understanding Malebranche’s philosophical views are the following:

(1) There are three persons of the Godhead, usually known as the Father, the Son, and the Holy Spirit. Malebranche, however, follows the opening verses of the Gospel of John, which calls the Son the Logos. The usual translation of this into English is ‘Word,’ but it can also be translated as ‘Reason,’ and this is how Malebranche understands it. Likewise, Malebranche preferred the Augustinian tradition of giving the name ‘Love’ to the Holy Spirit.

(2) The three persons are consubstantial and coeternal; that is, they are not three distinct Gods but one God and are inseparable. (3) Human beings are created in some way in the image of God, so that there is a sort of analogy, however loose, indirect, or approximate, between the human mind and the Trinity.

The influence of these ideas is recognizable in Malebranche’s account of ideas. Rather than holding ideas to be innate, Malebranche claims that they are found in God. In fact, he identifies them with divine ideas in the traditional theological sense. Theologians attributed ideas to God by drawing an analogy to artistic design. Just as the artisan who makes a product knows his product independently of that product’s actual existence, since the product’s actual existence presupposes the plan or idea by which the artisan makes it in the first place, so God knows His creation by means of productive ideas. Since these ideas cannot be something independent of God Himself, they are simply the divine substance itself insofar as God’s perfections are participable or imitable by creatures: each creature in its own limited way imitates or ‘partitions’ the infinite unlimited perfection of God. By knowing His own unlimited perfection, then, God knows all things He could possibly make, and thus all things that could possibly come to exist. It is this conception of ideas that makes up the primary background for Malebranche’s account of ideas and, pressed by critics, Malebranche through the course of his career placed greater and greater emphasis on this element of his thought that derived from tradition. Malebranche’s place in this tradition is most explicitly developed in the 1696 Preface to the Dialogues, where he quotes a number of passages from Augustine and Thomas Aquinas in order to extract a general description of divine ideas, which he then directly applies to ideas in his account.

Malebranche goes farther than this, into territory that might well have made traditional theologians uncomfortable. Ideas are not merely in God in the sense that they are the divine substance understood in a certain way; they are somehow a manifestation of God’s Reason, which is “coeternal and consubstantial with Him” (LO 614; OC 3:131). The use of the term “consubstantial,” a traditional theological term applied to the Word or Son, that is, the second Person of the Trinity, marks out the direction in which the Oratorian wants to take this line of reasoning. Drawing on, and modifying, the Augustinian tradition, Malebranche suggests that a proper account of the reason to which we regularly appeal must be rooted in the Christian doctrine of the Trinity. God’s Reason is the Word, and we are rational because the Word, the Logos, is our Interior Teacher (an Augustinian phrase). When we attend to various ideas we are learning from the Divine Word, universal Reason; thus Malebranche’s thesis that all things are seen in God is a way of putting the Word at the center of epistemology. Ideas are the province of the second Person of the Trinity; to attribute ideas to ourselves is to commit the serious mistake of attributing to ourselves what only belongs to God. It is to fail to see (to use another Augustinian phrase that is one of the Oratorian’s favorite sayings) that we are not our own light. This Trinitarian move is the foundation for Malebranche’s version of rationalism; Reason is infallible because Reason is quite literally God.

In a Trinitarian account of Reason there is necessarily more to Reason than an account of our rational ideas can cover on its own. As the Interior Teacher, Reason not only illuminates us with ideas, but also guides us in inquiry through interior sentiments, particularly pleasures and pains. Some background explaining Malebranche’s view of the role of freedom in inquiry will help to clarify this unusual twist in his epistemology.

The understanding is “that passive faculty of the soul by means of which it receives all the modifications of which it is capable” (LO 3; OC 1:43). On the other hand, the will is “the impression or natural impulse that carries us toward general and indeterminate good” (LO 5; OC 1:46). The will is both active, although Malebranche is careful to qualify this by the phrase “in a sense” (LO 4; OC 1:46), and free, where freedom is “the force that the mind has of turning this impression toward objects that please us, and making it so that our natural inclinations are directed to some particular object” (OC 1:46; cf. LO 5). When we believe something necessary, it is because “there is in these things no further relation to be considered that the understanding has not already perceived” (LO 9; OC 1:53). We need freedom because there are many cases in which this has not yet occurred, requiring us to direct our attention (another act of the will) in other directions, and, more importantly, because everything the intellect receives has some appearance of truth (we seem to perceive it, after all), so “if the will were not free and if it were infallibly and necessarily led to everything having the appearance of truth and goodness, it would almost always be deceived” (LO 10; OC 1:54). At first glance, this would force us to say that God, as Author of our natures, is the source of our errors. To avoid this premise, Malebranche concludes that God gives us freedom in order that we may under these circumstances avoid falling into error. In particular, we are given freedom so that we may refrain from accepting the merely probable, by continuing to investigate “until everything to be investigated is unraveled and brought to light” (LO 10; OC 1:54).

Therefore, we have an epistemic duty to use our freedom as much as we can, as long as we do not use it to avoid yielding to “the clear and distinct perception of all the constituents and relations of the object necessary to support a well-founded judgment” (LO 10; OC 1:55). How do we know we have reached clear and distinct perception? Malebranche does not appeal to anything intrinsic to the clear and distinct perception itself. Rather, he suggests that we know it through the “inward reproaches of our reason” (LO 10; OC 1:55), “the powerful voice of the Author of Nature,” which he also calls “the reproaches of our reason and the remorse of our conscience” (LO 11; OC 1:57). That is, we know we clearly and distinctly perceive something because when we try to doubt the perception, Reason reproaches us with pangs of intellectual conscience. In addition to these pangs of intellectual conscience, we are led by “a certain inward conviction” and “the impulses felt while meditating” (LO 13; OC 1:60).

It is in the context of discussing these sentiments, in fact, that Reason first appears in the main body of his major work, the Search after Truth, and, since similar sentiments about “the replies He gives to all those who know how to question Him properly” arise in the conclusion to the work, these epistemic sentiments may perhaps be said to frame the entire work. They play an important role in the Dialogues on Metaphysics and on Religion as well. We are told by the character Theodore early in the Dialogues that Reason guides inquiry by dispensing convictions and reproaches (JS 33; OC 12:194), and the point recurs throughout the Dialogues. Malebranche admits that distinguishing this guidance from prejudice can be difficult, but this is perhaps the point of the Search as a manual for avoiding error: by giving us rules and guidelines by which to avoid error, it helps us listen to the voice of Reason (cf. LO xlii-xliii, 529; OC 1:25-26, 2:453-454).

2. Love and Order

Malebranche extends this Trinitarian rationalism in order to give his own take on the claim that human minds are in the image of God, suggesting in the Treatise on Morals that our lives are structured by the Trinity itself:

The Father, to whom power is attributed, makes them to partake of His power, having established them as occasional causes of all the effects that they produce. The Son communicates His wisdom to them and discloses all truths to them through the direct union they have with the intelligible substance that He contains as universal Reason. The Holy Spirit animates them and sanctifies them through the invincible impression they have for the good, and through the charity or love of Order which He infuses into all hearts (OC 11:186; W 163).

This short passage on the way we are in the image of God gives a succinct summary of a number of claims that Malebranche regards as important; it also shows how intimately related to his Trinitarian concerns many of his most distinctive philosophical positions are. First, there is occasionalism, the view that only God is a true cause. Second, there is the union with universal Reason, according to which we are rational only by union with the Divine Word. Third, there is the will understood as the “invincible impression for the good,” which is attributed to the Holy Spirit.

The Holy Spirit is not invoked by Malebranche as often as the Father and the Son are, but there are several passages that hint at the Spirit’s importance; for example, in Elucidation Ten: “For since God cannot act without knowledge and in spite of Himself, He made the world according to wisdom and through the impulse of His love—He made all things through His Son and in the Holy Spirit as Scripture teaches” (OC 3:141; cf. LO 620). Despite receiving less emphasis, this third element, the theory of love that is associated with the Spirit as the theory of Reason is associated with the Son, plays an important role in the account of how we are related to Reason. Recognizing this requires recognizing Reason’s role in morality; Reason is (moral) Order.

The notion of Order is the core of Malebranche’s ethical theory, since "what makes a man righteous is that he loves order and that he conforms his will to it in all things; likewise the sinner is such only because order does not please him in everything and because he would rather have order conform to his own wishes" (OC 3:137; cf. LO 618). Order, in turn, is explained in Augustinian fashion in terms of the divine ideas. Having argued that ideas do not represent things equally noble or perfect, Malebranche goes on to explain the importance of this inequality:

If it is true, then, that God, who is the universal Being, contains all beings within Himself in an intelligible fashion, and that all these intelligible beings that have a necessary existence in God are not in every sense equally perfect, it is clear that there will be a necessary and immutable order among them, and that just as there are necessary and eternal truths because there are relations of magnitude among intelligible beings, there must also be a necessary and immutable order because of the relations of perfection among these same beings. An immutable order has it, then, that minds are more noble than bodies, as it is a necessary truth that twice two is four, or that twice two is not five (LO 618; OC 3:137-138).

We know ideas are not all equal because we judge the perfections of things by means of their ideas, and it is certain that things themselves are not all equal in perfection; some things are distinguished from others in that they have “more intelligence or mark of wisdom” (LO 618; OC 3:137). Because of this inequality, which is effectively an inequality in the moral salience of the things we know by way of ideas, the eternal, immutable intelligible world of ideas is also an eternal, immutable order. This order, however, is not a merely descriptive order. Were there nothing more to divine Order than the theory of ideas, it would be “more of a speculative truth than a necessary law” (LO 618; OC 3:138). Malebranche wants to go farther. This ordering of perfections among the divine ideas has a necessity that constrains even God. To take this system of divine ideas and make it “necessary law,” the Oratorian introduces his theory of love.

This theory, like the theory of ideas, is rooted in an understanding of the divine nature. Just as the theory of ideas is rooted in God as being in general, so the theory of love is rooted in God as good in general. God's goodness is a universal or sovereign goodness; God is "a good that contains all other goods within itself" (LO 269; OC 2:16). As such, God is the only perfect or completely adequate object for love, and, accordingly, God loves Himself perfectly. In loving Himself, He necessarily loves what in Himself represents Himself perfectly, namely, His own self-image, divine Wisdom or universal Reason, which contains the order of all things; and because of this, God always acts according to divine Order. The Father, the Son, and the Holy Spirit are inseparable, and therefore God necessarily has a Love for Order. Malebranche goes so far as to say that "it is a contradiction that God should not love and will order" (LO 594; OC 3:97). It is because of this necessary love that order has a normative aspect; because of this love, order has "the force of law" for all minds (LO 620; OC 3:140), both created and uncreated.

Since God loves Himself, and in so doing operates according to Order, God creates us with an impulse to the most perfect good, namely Himself. This is our will. As Malebranche states,

Only because God loves Himself do we love anything, and if God did not love Himself, or if He did not continuously impress upon man's soul a love like His own, i.e., the impulse of love that we feel toward the good in general, we would love nothing, we would will nothing, and as a result, we would be without a will, since the will is only the impression of nature that leads us toward the good in general… (LO 337; OC 2:126-127)

Because order has the force of law, God makes us according to Order; part of this involves making us to love God alone as our sovereign good. This leaves us with the question of other goods besides God. Malebranche sometimes says that God loves only Himself (for example, LO 364; OC 2:169). However, this is never taken to mean that God does not love other things; in fact, "He loves all His works" (LO 330, 666; OC 2:113, 3:220). The reason is that, as sovereign good, God loves other things in loving Himself. As he notes, "God loves only Himself—He loves His creations only because they are related to His perfections, and He loves them to the extent to which they have this relation—in the final analysis God loves Himself and the things He has created with the same love" (LO 364; OC 2:169-170). On the other hand, not all things bear the same type of relation to Himself; there are, as we noted above, different relations of perfection in Order. Mind is more perfect than body; and, being more perfect, it is more closely related to God, and therefore more lovable. Because of this God cannot will that the mind be subordinated to the body. This is not a metaphysical or logical necessity, but an ethical necessity (an obligation) that presupposes the metaphysical necessity of divine self-love. Given that He loves Order, He ought to will the right ordering of perfections among creatures; this ‘ought’ is an obligation grounded in love.

God, in loving himself, loves sovereign Reason or Order and, because of this love, Order has normative force. When we see in Reason that the soul is more perfect than the body, for instance, we can recognize this principle as not merely a truth, but a law: “the living law of the Father” (JS 238; OC 12:302). Because it is according to Order that Order be loved, and since God always acts out of love of Order, and therefore always in conformity with it, God directs our own love toward Order. Moreover, the law of Order is sanctioned by divine omnipotence itself. Conformity with Order will, in the long run, be rewarded, while divergence from Order will be punished. In one key respect, however, Order is not like other laws. In a case of human law, we can evaluate a law, and perhaps reject it, by considering higher principles than those embodied in the law itself. Because it is the highest law, this can never be the case with Order; when we evaluate the goodness or rationality of any law, we can only do so by comparing it to Order. As divine, Order is the good in general; as Reason, Order is what makes anything rational. Order, in short, is authoritative in every significant way. This authority is essential to Malebranche’s discussion of human nature in its natural, 'prelapsarian' state, that is, its state prior to the Fall.

3. Original Sin

We know that God acts according to Order, and that, therefore, everything God creates is originally in conformity with Order. Because Reason shows us the divine ideas, we have cognitive access to Order, and therefore know the original, natural state of human beings (what God created human beings to be) despite not being in it ourselves:

But to speak accurately of innocent man, created in the image of God, we must consult the divine ideas of immutable order. It is there that we find the model of a perfect man such as our father was before his sin (JS 65; OC 12:103).

On this view, our natural state is nothing other than our ideal ethical state; we are most natural when we are perfect. What we find in “the model of the perfect man” is in some ways like us, but in some ways not. Like us, Adam in his original state was made in such a way as to be constituted by two relations, one to sensible goods and one to Reason. This twofold union, of mind to God and mind to body, looms large in Malebranche’s thought, and he sees it in terms borrowed from St. Augustine. Our union to God is what elevates us, and from it “the mind receives its life, its light, and its entire felicity”; however, our excessive attachment to our body “infinitely debases man and is today the main cause of all his errors and miseries” (LO xxxiii; OC 1:9). This intimate union of ethical, epistemological, metaphysical, and theological themes is characteristic of Malebranche’s thinking; a deviation from ethical perfection entails a corruption of nature and an obscuring of our cognitive abilities, and this deviation from ideal is nothing other than distraction from divine Reason.

However, if this is so, Adam (man as God originally created him) must differ from us in not being able to enjoy sensible goods in a way that ever conflicted with, or distracted from, the good of sovereign Reason. God works according to general laws, as Order requires, but as the general laws now stand, it is very easy for our union with bodies to interfere with our union with Reason. Therefore, there must have been some special characteristic in Adam’s situation that gave him greater control over his sensory union with the body. Because Adam was created to be subject only to God, he merited a special ability to maintain his relationship with divine Reason (JS 233; OC 12:296). Since God always acts according to Order, He cannot subject the mind to the body because this would violate Order by subjecting the more noble to the less noble. Malebranche interprets this to mean that something must have been in place to make it possible for Adam not to be distracted from Reason by bodies. In the Dialogues Theodore tells Aristes precisely what this something must have been:

And conclude from all this that prior to sin there were exceptions favoring human beings in the laws of the union of the soul and the body. Or, rather, conclude from it that there was a law which has been abolished, by which the human will was the occasional cause of that disposition of the brain by which the soul is shielded from the action of objects though the body is struck by them, and that thus despite this action it was never interrupted in its meditations and ecstasy. Do you not sense some vestige of this power in yourself when you are deeply absorbed in thought and the light of truth penetrates and delights you? (JS 65; OC 12:103)

When we look at what should be natural to us, and therefore what made our original state different from our current state, we may perhaps find it surprising that it involves a special ability to control our brains - an ability we now unnaturally lack. Although, intriguingly, Malebranche thinks we still have traces of it when we are “deeply absorbed in thought.”

Examination of ourselves in light of Reason, therefore, leads us to conclude that we are currently in a state of disorder. As Malebranche illustrates, alluding to the letter of Paul to the Romans, “each of us is sufficiently aware of a law in himself that captures and disorders him, a law not established by God because it is contrary to the immutable order of justice, which is the inviolable rule for all His volitions” (LO 580; OC 3:72). In practice, this disorder is an excessive concern with bodies, a concern so strong that it is a pathological dependence. We treat bodies, rather than God, as our true good of the mind. This makes us exalt our union with bodies over our union with Order, in the process running afoul, of course, of principles of Order (principles like “bodies are not worthy of love” and “all the love that God places in us must end in Him”). Given that this motion of love toward good is the will, and given that the will governs attention, we are driven to attend more to sensible matters than their ethical importance and value for inquiry would merit. While the senses are not corrupt in themselves, then, our excessive dependence on them is an essential feature of the corruption of our cognitive capacities. Malebranche regards these matters, at least at a very general level, as common knowledge.

For Malebranche, original sin is not purely a doctrine known on faith because it is something of which he thinks we can all be conscious of in ourselves, by comparing ourselves, known by interior sentiment, with Order, which is known clearly by ideas but obscurely by the interior sentiments it effects. In other words, we can recognize our disorder through moral principles or, more obscurely, through the feelings of conscience. Through faith we learn important details about this disorder, particularly about its history, some of which we could not otherwise know; the disorder itself, however, is something everyone can recognize. Reason teaches us that there is a way things should be; experience shows us that we are not the way we should be. What is more, experience seems also to suggest that the reason we are not the way we should be is not that we cannot be so, at least in any absolute sense. Malebranche does not develop the idea, but it seems suggested by Theodore’s statement in the Dialogues that we can still experience “some vestige of this power” (JS 65; OC 12:102). In general our minds are clouded and confused, but on rare occasions, we go beyond this.

Furthermore, because it affects the way we interact with sensible goods, the disorder of original sin has serious epistemic consequences. In particular, “the mind constantly spreads itself externally; it forgets itself and Him who enlightens and penetrates it, and it lets itself be so seduced by its body and by those surrounding it that it imagines finding in them its perfection and happiness” (LO 657; OC 3:203). Our primary union is with sovereign Reason, but distracted by our union with sensible things, we treat this latter union as if it were more important; and because “we cannot increase our union with sensible things without diminishing our union with intelligible truths” (LO 415; OC 2:257), we ignore our union with universal Reason to the extent we devote our attention to sensible things. The reason, Malebranche thinks, is that we enjoy making judgments, and therefore try to have this pleasure without first consulting Reason (LO 649; OC 3:189). This trait bodes ill for us if we are interested in avoiding error, as we shall see. For now what is interesting is just how sharply this error-inducing dependence on the body differentiates human nature in its original and ideal state from human nature as we currently find it. There is a sort of inevitability about some aspects of our dependence on the body. Our ideas are clouded, our attention becomes tired (JS 65; OC 12:103), and in practice there is little we can do about this. Malebranche is clear that this was not the case with Adam, due to the special power over the body we have already noted, a power that we (at least beyond a certain degree) conspicuously lack.

Since we have lost the ability to govern our brains properly because its presence in us was linked by principles of Order to our merit, we now must struggle to overcome disturbances Adam in Eden would easily have overcome. There is a sense in which this has been a fall from intelligence, since our thought is now subject to our body’s limitations and thus we are naturally inclined to make stupid mistakes. Prior to sin, Adam was not stupid enough to think that bodies were the real cause of his pleasure (LO 593; OC 3:96). We, however, have become that stupid. This is the root of Malebranche’s diagnosis of the psychological basis for the claim that bodies are true causes, a claim he considers to be the most dangerous philosophical error original sin has spawned. This brings us immediately to the motivation for Malebranche’s occasionalism, his view that God alone is a true cause.

For Malebranche, a pagan worldview follows closely on, and is perhaps the primary consequence of, original sin. It is this recognition that mediates between his arguments against necessary connection and his general views; it is by means of their ethical role, as correctives to the presumptions of the pagan mindset, that the arguments interest him; see Gouhier’s excellent discussion (1926, pp. 108-114). Gouhier’s phrase for this pagan worldview, la philosophie du serpent, the philosophy of the serpent, captures Malebranche’s view perfectly. Occasionalism is an ethical antidote, or at least an ethical treatment, for our tendency to idolatry, and, in particular, for an especially pernicious instance of this idolatry:

If the nature of pagan philosophy is a chimera, if this nature is nothing, we must be advised of it, for there are many people who are mistaken with respect to it. There are more than we might think who thoughtlessly attribute to it the works of God, who busy themselves with this idol or fiction of the human mind, and who render to it the honor due only to the Divinity. (LO 668; OC 3:223-224)

The philosophical superstition of causal powers or efficacious natures is but one more sad example of the terrible failure of human nature to live up to the demands of Order; it is but one more expression of the “secret opposition between God and man” (LO 657; OC 3:204). It has its root in a religious failing, the failure to give God the credit He is due.

4. Universal Reason as External Teacher

Even though original sin puts our cognitive capacities in a wretched state, Malebranche does not throw up his hands in despair, nor does he resort to skepticism. The reasons for Malebranche’s optimism all have to do with the active and personal role played by universal Reason in human life. Without his personal role of sovereign Reason, despair and skepticism would be unavoidable. With it, Malebranche can afford to be optimistic.

The first reason for Malebranche’s optimism is that we are never entirely cut off from the teaching of Reason. However, much of our perverse fascination with bodily goods may obscure the guidance, yet Reason still guides us. Not only does Reason still illuminate us with ideas, He “teaches us inwardly” when we take the trouble to engage in philosophical meditation (LO 13; OC 1:61). Reason still encourages, warns, and rebukes us as our intellectual conscience. Although prejudices resulting from original sin have made it difficult to find truth, knowledge is still possible.

The second reason that Malebranche can be optimistic is that Reason has not been idle in the face of our perversity. This is seen most clearly in the Incarnation. In more secularly-minded times this may be the hardest bit of Malebranche’s system to wrap one’s mind around; even someone willing to allow Reason an active role in guiding inquiry might balk at taking the Incarnation as an essential part of epistemology. It is not, however, an ad hoc addition to the Oratorian’s other claims. It would, indeed, be rather strange if he did not think along these lines, given other claims he makes. Reason is the second Person of the Trinity, the Logos or divine Word; the Word is, in the opening words of the gospel of John, the light of all who come into the world, and also is the Word made flesh. It is Reason that we consult in inquiry; Reason illuminates us with ideas, judges our actions, rebukes us for bad uses of freedom and rewards us for good. Given all this, it is not surprising that Reason takes an active and personal hand in fixing the epistemological and ethical mess in which fallen humanity finds itself; Malebranche has already insisted that Reason takes an active and personal hand in a number of epistemological and ethical areas.

In the Incarnation, therefore, the divine Word has resorted to a new method of teaching in its attempt to counteract our fallen condition:

The Son of God, who is the wisdom of God or eternal truth, was made man and became sensible to make Himself known to crude and carnal men. He wished to instruct them by means of what was blinding them; He wished to lead them to His love, to free them from sensible goods by means of the same things that were enslaving them. Dealing with fools, He used a kind of foolishness to make them wise (LO 367; OC 2:124. Cf. also LO 417-418; OC 2:260-261).

The divine Word took physical form because human beings have an excessive love for sensory things. According to Malebranche, this teaches us several things. First, in our own teaching we should invest intelligible truth with the sort of presentation that would in some way appeal to the senses. This can be overdone, of course. It is being done correctly only when it elevates us to the intelligible rather than flattering the senses, or, more specifically, when it causes people to withdraw inward in order to think and meditate rather than outward in order to be entertained by sensible things (cf. LO 418; OC 2:261).

Malebranche also contemplates about Wisdom becoming sensible “in order to condemn and sacrifice in its person all sensible things.” He does not elaborate much on this phrase, but the Preface to the Search makes it clear enough. He claims that one of the lessons the Incarnation is meant to teach us is “the scorn we should have for all objects of the senses” (LO xxxviii; OC 1:18). By uniting Himself with a body, he exalted to the highest dignity anything could have, namely, union with God; it became “the most estimable of sensible things.” This “most estimable of sensible things,” however, was subjugated to divine truth to the point of suffering and death. The idea is that if even the most estimable sensible thing should be held less important than truth and order, than all sensible things should be regarded as less important than truth and order. From this Malebranche concludes that “we must gradually become accustomed to disbelieving the reports our senses make about all the bodies surrounding us, which they always portray as worthy of our application and respect.” As he asks rhetorically in Treatise on Nature and Grace, “did not Jesus Christ sacrifice and destroy, in his person, all grandeurs and sensible pleasures? Has not his life been for us a continual example of humility and of penitence?” (R 131-132; OC 5:53). In effect, Malebranche advocates others to take Jesus Christ as an epistemological model. It is perhaps not common to appeal to epistemological rather than ethical exemplars, but in Malebranche’s philosophy epistemology and ethics are closely related. In fact, there are passages that suggest that he considers them to be essentially the same thing. Consider, for example, the following passage, which opens

Error is the cause of men’s misery; it is the sinister principle that has produced the evil in the world; it generates and maintains in our soul all the evils that afflict us, and we may hope for sound and genuine happiness only by seriously laboring to avoid it (LO 1; OC 1:39).

The error here is both intellectual and moral. That it is both appears to be necessitated by the role of the will. Every error is a misuse of will contrary to the guidance of Reason, and therefore can be treated as an immoral rebellion against Reason (cf. LO 8-11; OC1:50-54). Since the Incarnation involves the perfect union of body, mind, and divine Word, the incarnate Word is a paradigm case of perfect orderly relation among the three, and therefore in itself serves as part of Reason’s pedagogy, as “the rule of beauty and of perfection” (R 123; OC 5:41) against which we must measure ourselves.

The third way in which Malebranche thinks the incarnate Word extends its work of teaching the human race is the most obvious, through explicit moral teaching, which communicates to us “in a sensible, palpable way the eternal commands of the divine law,” so as to reinforce its too-often-ignored inner promptings (JS 81; OC 3:121). Related to this, Malebranche considers the teaching of the Church to be one form that Reason’s teaching takes. That is, the Church is “a visible authority emanating from incarnate Wisdom,” extending that moral teaching through time (JS 81; OC 3:121). This is in part necessary because Reason is interested in teaching “the poor, the simple, the ignorant, and those who cannot read,” not merely “those who have enough life, as well as mind and knowledge, to discern truth from error” (JS 255-256; OC 12:322-323). Reason’s exercise of visible teaching authority has not ceased, but rather continues in the Church, which continues Reason’s work of compensating for human failings.

It is unsurprising, then, that Malebranche attacks the Protestant notion of sola scriptura as not merely theologically problematic but also philosophically irrational. Even if the author of the Gospel of Matthew were the apostle, and even if we can suppose there was no corruption in the transmission of the text, we cannot base our faith on the words we read there unless we have an infallible authority teaching that the evangelist was inspired by God. The only infallible authority is God Himself, so the Holy Spirit must either reveal the inspiration of Scripture to each person individually or to the church as a trust for all; of this choice, Malebranche says, “the latter is much more simple, more general, more worthy of providence than the former” (JS 256; OC 12:323). Even if we granted that God revealed to each individual that the text was inspired, Malebranche thinks that this is far from adequate; after you recognize the text as inspired you still must come to understand it. Since God wills for all people to arrive at knowledge of the truth, there must be something to help lead us to it, and again the choice is between inspiration of each person individually or the church collectively. But, states Malebranche, it is absurd to attribute to each individual person the divine assistance one denies to the entire church in assembly, given that the church preserves tradition and, more than any individual, deserves that Jesus Christ guarantee its protection. Jesus imitates the Father as much as is possible; therefore “He will never act in a certain person in a particular manner without some particular reason, without some kind of necessity” (JS 258; OC 12:325). Since it is generally sufficient for Christ to preserve the faithful by preserving the Church’s authority and infallibility in matters of faith, it is absurd and presumptuous to expect special enlightenment by reading Scripture on one’s own, just as it is absurd and presumptuous to expect God to make exceptions to natural laws for one’s personal convenience.

The existence of a church or divine society (with authority, scripture, teaching, and rituals) makes it possible for Reason to do the most good to the most people in the simplest way, preparing for the restoration even of those who do not have the leisure or ability to do rigorous philosophical meditation (JS 257-258; OC 12:323-324). The graces of enlightenment and sentiment (R 151; OC 5:97) extend the dual teaching function of Reason discussed previously, namely, enlightenment by ideas and guidance by sentiments. These graces form and guide the Church, making certain aspects of its teaching, for example, preaching on the basis of Scripture, an infallible authority on whose basis arguments almost like demonstrations can be formed. In Malebranche’s view, Reason is therefore the foundation for the infallibility of the Catholic Church in matters of faith and morals. He was quite right in saying that his philosophy was a Catholic philosophy.

5. Conclusion

There are a number of ways in which Malebranche’s religious interests affect his philosophical discussion.

(1) Reason has the features of the Second Person of the Trinity, that is, the Son or Word of God. Reason is a divine person. This allows Malebranche to attribute a wider range of activities to Reason than could be attributed to an impersonal reason.

(2) The Trinitarian influence helps to clarify why Malebranche has no problem with talking as if Reason, in its aspect of Order, constrained even God: he has a Trinitarian account of why God must act according to Order.

(3) Original sin plays an extraordinarily important role in Malebranche’s philosophy, to such an extent that even Malebranche’s discussion of very philosophical topics, like the question of whether there are causal powers, is affected by his understanding of original sin and its tendency to drag us away from attentive meditation on divine ideas in Reason.

(4) There is no question that Malebranche’s philosophy is Catholic throughout. Purely Catholic themes and ideas arise throughout, to such an extent that he does not hesitate to bring Catholic doctrines about the Incarnation or the Church into his philosophical discussions.

These are only a few examples. There are many other ways in which Malebranche’s religious views and practices are reflected in his philosophy: his discussions of grace and providence, his theodicy, his relation to the French School of Spirituality founded by Bérulle, and more. Many of these have only just begun to be studied in any detail. If, however, we were to examine every way in which Malebranche’s philosophy were influenced by his religious views, this would not be any different from a complete examination of every facet of his philosophy.

6. References and Further Reading

a. Reference Format

In this article the following reference format for Malebranche’s works has been used:

(LO 418; OC 2:261; cf. also R 131-132; OC 5:53)

The English translation is given first, with its page number; followed by ‘OC’ to indicate the standard French edition, the Oeuvres Complètes, with the volume and page number; particularly notable analogous references follow the “cf. also.” At times, when reference is intended to two different passages equally, the following format has been used:

(LO 330, 666; OC 2:113, 3:220)

The English translations are listed first, while their corresponding pages in the Oeuvres Complètes are listed in order after the semicolon. Thus “OC 2:113” corresponds to “LO 330” and “OC 3:220” corresponds to “LO 666.” Where the passage as quoted in the article deviates from the English translation, this is noted by the following format:

(OC 12:196; cf. JS 147)

The edition abbreviations that have been used are:

JS: Dialogues on Metaphysics and on Religion, Nicholas Jolley and David Scott, eds. New York: Cambridge University Press, 1997.

LO: The Search after Truth, Thomas Lennon and Paul Olscamp, eds. New York: Cambridge University Press, 1997.

OC: Oeuvres Complètes de Malebranche, 20 vols., André Robinet, ed. Paris: J. Vrin, 1958-84.

R: Treatise on Nature and Grace, Patrick Riley, ed. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1992.

W: Treatise on Ethics, Craig Walton, ed. Dordrecht: Kluwer, 1993.

Current scholarship on the role of religion in Malebranche’s philosophy is fairly limited, and what exists is somewhat uneven. The following are suggested as useful for those who wish to study this topic. Some of them discuss the matter in its own right, while others simply raise important questions and topics for further investigation in the course of discussing other things.

b. Further Reading

  • Arnauld, Antoine. On True and False Ideas, Elmar Kremer, ed. Lewiston: Edwin Mellen Press, 1990. This important work, occasioned by Malebranche’s views on grace, began the long-lasting dispute between Arnauld and Malebranche.
  • Astell, Mary, and Norris, John. Letters Concerning the Love of God, E. Derek Taylor and Melvyn New, eds. London: Ashgate, 2005. John Norris was a British Malebranchean; his correspondence with Mary Astell is an excellent resource for identifying features of Malebranche’s thought that would have been considered especially relevant to religion in the period.
  • Connell, Desmond. The Vision in God: Malebranche’s Scholastic Sources, Paris: Nauwelaerts, 1967. Connell’s book, despite its relatively limited topic, is a good beginning for those interested in looking at the question of how Malebranche’s thought relates to the broader context of Catholic thought out of which it emerges.
  • Gouhier, Henri. La philosophie de Malebranche et son expérience religieuse, 2nd ed., Paris: J. Vrin, 1948.
  • Gouhier, Henri. La vocation de Malebranche, Paris: J. Vrin, 1926. This and the immediately preceding work are still the must-read texts for any study of the relation between Malebranche’s religion and his philosophy.
  • Guéroult, Martial. Malebranche, 3 vols. Paris: Aubier, 1955-59. This rather extensive work discusses a number of religion-related issues in Malebranche, and has some particularly notable discussions of Malebranche’s Augustinianism.
  • Jolley, Nicholas. The Light of the Soul: Theories of Ideas in Leibniz, Malebranche, and Descartes. In the course of his discussion of theories of ideas Jolley raises a number of key questions that have to be considered by anyone interested in the relation between religion and philosophy in Malebranche.
  • Nadler, Steven. Arnauld and the Cartesian Philosophy of Ideas, Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1989. Among other things, Nadler considers the important question of why Arnauld chose to begin his attack on the Treatise on Nature and Grace with a criticism of the philosophy of the Search after Truth.
  • Radner, Ephraim. Spirit and Nature: A Study of 17th Century Jansenism, New York: Crossroad, 2002. Radner is mostly concerned with the theological controversies over Jansenist appellants, but the dispute between Arnauld and Malebranche is treated as important background to this religious question.
  • Reid, Jasper. “Malebranche on Intelligible Extension,” British Journal of the History of Philosophy 11:4 (2003), 581-608. An excellent demonstration of how considering Malebranche’s theological interests can clarify puzzles arising elsewhere in his philosophy.
  • Robinet, André. Système et existence dans l’oeuvre de Malebranche, Paris: J. Vrin, 1965. This work contains good, albeit occasionally short, discussions of various religious issues in Malebranche’s works (notably original sin).
  • Schmaltz, Tad. Malebranche’s Theory of the Soul: A Cartesian Interpretation. New York: Oxford University Press, 1996. This work only obliquely discusses matters relevant to religious themes in Malebranche’s philosophy, but it is currently the best discussion of the diverse roles Malebranche attributes to sentiment.

Author Information

Brandon Watson
Email: bwatson2@autincc.edu
Austin Community College
U. S. A.




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