Bernard Mandeville is primarily remembered for his impact on discussions of morality and economic theory in the early eighteenth century. His most noteworthy and notorious work is The Fable of the Bees, which triggered immense public criticism at the time. He had a particular influence on philosophers of the Scottish Enlightenment, most notably Francis Hutcheson, David Hume, Jean-Jacques Rousseau, and Adam Smith. The Fable’s overall influence on the fields of ethics and economics is, perhaps, one of the greatest and most provocative of all early-eighteenth century English works.
The controversy sparked by the Fable was over Mandeville’s proposal that vices, such as vanity and greed, result in publically beneficial results. Along the same lines, he proposed that many of the actions commonly thought to be virtuous were, instead, self-interested at their core and therefore vicious. He was a critic of moral systems that claimed humans had natural feelings of benevolence toward one another, and he instead focused attention on self-interested passions like pride and vanity that led to apparent acts of benevolence. This caused his readers to imagine him to be a cruder reincarnation of Thomas Hobbes, particularly as a proponent of egoism. What follows is an overview of Mandeville’s life and influence, paying specific attention to his impact on discussions of morality and economic theory.
Mandeville was born in 1670 to a distinguished family in the Netherlands, either in or nearby Rotterdam. His father was a physician, as was his great-grandfather, a factor that, no doubt, influenced his own educational path in medicine at the University of Leyden, receiving his M.D. in 1691. He also held a baccalaureate in philosophy, and wrote his dissertation defending the Cartesian doctrine that animal bodies are mere automata because they lack immaterial souls.
Mandeville moved to England some time after the Glorious Revolution of 1688, and it was here he settled permanently, married, and had at least two children. His first published works in English were anonymous pieces in 1703 entitled The Pamphleteers: A Satyr and Some Fables after the Easie and Familiar Method of Monsieur de la Fontaine. In the first, Mandeville defends against those “pamphleteers” who were criticizing both the Glorious Revolution and the late King William III. In Some Fables, he translated twenty-seven of La Fontaine’s Fables, adding two of his own in the same comic style as employed in his later Grumbling Hive.
Although Dr. Mandeville supported his family through his work as a physician, he was also engaged in many literary-political activities. His political interests were not directly obvious until 1714 when he published a piece of political propaganda, The Mischiefs that Ought Justly to be Apprehended from a Whig-Government, which demonstrates his support for the Whig party. Throughout his life, he published numerous smaller works and essays, most of them containing harsh social criticism. Published in 1720, Free Thoughts on Religion, the Church and National Happiness was his final party political tract in which he endorses the advantages of Whig governance as well as advancing a skeptical view of the religious establishment and priestcraft.
Mandeville still continued to publish other provocative pieces, for example: A Modest Defence of Publick Stews (1724), containing controversial plans which would create public housing for prostitution. Within this piece he argued that the best societal solution was to legalize prostitution and regulate it under strict government supervision. Mandeville’s most notable and notorious work, however, was The Fable of the Bees; it began as an anonymous pamphlet of doggerel verse in 1705, entitled The Grumbling Hive: Or, Knaves Turn’d Honest. More is known of Mandeville’s writings than of his life, and so it is most useful to turn to The Fable for a further examination of his history.
It is rare that a poem finds its way into serious philosophical discussion, as The Grumbling Hive: or, Knaves Turn’d Honest has done. Written in the style of his previous fables, the 433-line poem served as the foundation for Mandeville’s principal work: The Fable of the Bees: or, Private Vices, Publick Benefits. The Fable grew over a period of twenty-four years, eventually reaching its final, sixth edition in 1729. In this work, Mandeville gives his analysis of how private vices result in public benefits like industry, employment and economic flourishing. Interpreted by his contemporaries as actively promoting vice as the singular explanation and precondition for a thriving economic society, this central analysis was the primary reason for Mandeville’s reputation as a scandalous libertine. This was a misreading of Mandeville’s position. Most of the work he later produced was either an expansion or defense of the Fable in the light of contemporary opposition.
The Grumbling Hive poem is a short piece, later published as just a section of the larger Fable, which was mostly comprised as a series of commentaries upon the 1705 poem. It immediately introduces its reader to a spacious and luxurious hive of bees. This hive was full of vice, “Yet the whole mass a paradise” (The Fable, Vol. I, pg. 31). The society flourished in many ways, but no trade was without dishonesty. Oddly, the worst cheats of the hive were those who complained most about this dishonesty and fraud so plaguing their society. Here the poem dramatically turns as “all the rogues cry’d brazenly, Good gods, had we but honesty!” (The Fable, Vol. I, pg. 33) Jove, the bees’ god, angrily rid the hive of all vice, but the results were catastrophic as the newly virtuous bees were no longer driven to compete with one another. As a result, industry collapsed, and the once flourishing society was destroyed in battle, leaving few bees remaining. These bees, to avoid the vices of ease and extravagance, flew into a hollow tree in a contented honesty.
The implication of the poem is clear for the beehive, but perhaps not for humanity: it seems paradoxical to suggest that a society is better when it promotes a culture characterized by private vice. However, it is precisely this paradox on which Mandeville draws to make his larger point. The “Moral” at the end of the poem claims, “Fools only strive To make a Great an’ honest Hive.”(The Fable, Vol. I, pg. 36) Mandeville thought the discontent over moral corruptness, or the private vice of society, was either hypocritical or incoherent, as such vice served an indispensable role in the economy by stimulating trade, industry and upward economic improvement i.e., public benefit. The desire to create a purely virtuous society was based on “a vain EUTOPIA seated in the Brain”: fancying that a nation can, with virtues like honesty, attain great wealth and success, when in fact it is the desire to improve one’s material condition in acts of self-indulgence that lies at the heart of economic productivity (The Fable, Vol. I, pg. 36).
The poem’s humorous ending demonstrates that vice can look surprisingly like virtue if implemented correctly. To Mandeville’s readers this was a deeply offensive conclusion to draw, and yet for almost twenty years his work went largely unnoticed. In 1714, Mandeville published the Fable of the Bees, presented as a series of “Remarks” offering an extended commentary upon the original “The Grumbling Hive”, and intended to explain and elucidate the meaning of the earlier poem. But the Fable initially garnered little attention. It was not until a second edition in 1723, featuring a new addition, “An Essay on Charity and Charity-Schools”, that Mandeville gained the notoriety that would make him infamous amongst his contemporaries. The 1723 edition soon prompted reproach from the public, and was even presented before the Grand Jury of Middlesex and there declared a public nuisance. The presentment of the Jury claimed that the Fable intended to disparage religion and virtue as detrimental to society, and to promote vice as a necessary component of a well-functioning state. Though never censored, the book and author achieved sudden disrepute, and the Fable found itself the subject of conversation amongst clergymen, journalists, and philosophers.
Rather than giving a lengthy argument proving that private vice can be useful, Mandeville illustrates in the Fable that vice can be disguised, and yet is necessary in the attainment of collective goods, thus resulting in a paradox of “private vices, public benefits”. For instance, and to take one of Mandeville’s central examples, pride is a vice, and yet without pride there would be no fashion industry, as individuals would lack the motivation to buy new and expensive clothes with which to try and impress their peers. If pride were eradicated tomorrow, the result would leave hundreds of companies bankrupt, prompt mass unemployment, risk the collapse of industry, and in turn devastate both the economic security and with it the military power of the British commercial state. Similarly, and on a smaller scale, without thieves there would be no locksmiths, without quarrels over property, no lawyers, and so on.
Crucially, however, Mandeville did not claim a paradox of private vice, public virtue. The “benefits” that arose from individually vicious actions were morally compromised due to their being rooted in private self-seeking- one of Mandeville’s starkest challenges to his contemporaries, and a point which makes his fundamental philosophical commitments difficult to interpret. It is still disputed as to what, exactly, Mandeville thought the relation between private vice and public benefit should be: was he merely holding up a mirror to a corrupt society, satirizing those who claimed commercial opulence was straightforwardly compatible with virtue? Or did he seriously believe that modern commercial states should abandon their luxurious comforts for austere self-denial, so as to escape the paradox he alleged? Whatever the case, his notoriety arose from placing the two together, a little too closely for most of his readers’ taste and comfort. Mandeville’s paradox alleged, unapologetically, the tendency of men to hide vices behind socially acceptable forms of behavior, thereby appearing virtuous. On the one hand, Mandeville wished to imply that common sense views are not as reliant on common sense as they first appear: what looks like virtuous behavior may in fact be disguised selfishness. On the other, those who preach virtue may turn out to be deluded hypocrites: real virtue would mean the collapse of all the benefits that supervene on private vice. Chief amongst Mandeville’s targets was Anthony Ashley Cooper, Third Earl of Shaftesbury, who claimed that a large-scale flourishing commercial society was compatible with individuals securing virtue by engaging in rational self-restraint whilst enjoying the benefits of economic advancement. For Mandeville, this was incorrect and preposterous: society could be prosperous and based on private vices, or poor and based on private virtues- but not both.
Mandeville’s psychological examination of humankind, often perceived as cynical, is a large part of his genius and also his infamy. Much in keeping with the physician he was, it is fitting that he took on the task of diagnosing society in order to expose what he believed to be the true motives of humankind. Nonetheless, there was a religious component in Mandeville’s thought. His man was necessarily fallen man: capable only of pleasing himself, the individual human being was a postlapsarian creature, irredeemably selfish and greedy for its own private pleasure, at which it always aimed even if it hid such self-seeking behind more respectable facades (The Fable, Vol. I, pg. 348). Mandeville’s examination showed the ways in which people hid their real thoughts and motives behind a mask in order to fake sociability by not offending the selfish pride of their peers. Ironically, Mandeville’s own honesty led him into trouble: he boldly claimed vice was inevitably the foundation of a thriving society, insofar as all human beings had to act viciously because their status as selfish fallen men ensured that whatever displays they affected, at bottom selfishness always dictated their actions. All social virtues are evolved from self-love, which is at the core irredeemably vicious. Mandeville also challenged conventional moral terminology by taking a term like “vice” and showing that, despite its negative connotations, it was beneficial to society at large.
In its time, most responses to the Fable were designed as refutations (and understandably so, as few desired association with Mandeville’s central thesis) mainly focused on its analysis of the foundations of morality. To many, Mandeville was on par with Thomas Hobbes in promoting a doctrine of egoism which threatened to render all putative morality a function of morally-compromised selfishness. This accusation comes, in part, from “An Enquiry into the Origin of Moral Virtue” (1723) where Mandeville first proposes his theory of the skillful politician. Whether genuine theory, or more of Mandeville’s playful satirizing, the “Enquiry” was a provocative analysis designed to call into question contemporary notions of virtue. According to Mandeville, skillful politicians originally flattered the masses into believing that actions were vicious when done in order to gratify selfish passions, and virtuous when they were performed in contrast with immediate impulse of nature to acquire private pleasure, by instead suppressing this urge temporarily so as not to offend or harm others. But Mandeville’s central contention was that that no action was virtuous when inspired by selfish emotions. When men learned to temporarily suppress their urges for pleasure, they did not act from virtue. What they really did was find innovative ways to better secure their private pleasures, by engaging in forms of socially-sanctioned behavior they were flattered for- thus securing a more advanced form of pleasure than would be had by simply glorying over their peers in immediate displays of selfishness. Because he considered all natural human passions to be selfish, no action could be virtuous if it was done from a natural impulse which would itself be necessarily selfish. Accordingly, a human could not perform a virtuous act without some form of self-denial. Skillful politicians invented a sort of quasi-morality by which to control naturally selfish men- but because this involved the redirection of natural passion, not active self-denial, at root this was vice. The upshot of Mandeville’s vision was that excepting acts of Christian virtue assisted directly by God, all human actions were vicious and thus morally compromised. Unsurprisingly, this view of human nature was thought to be cynical and degrading, which is why he was often categorized with Hobbes, usually by critics of both, as a proponent of the serious egoist system denying the reality of moral distinctions.
Many critical reactions followed Mandeville’s depiction of humankind as selfish and unruly. He was often understood to deny the reality of virtue, with morality being merely the invention of skillful politicians in order to tame human passions. As Mandeville’s analysis of human nature developed throughout his life, he increasingly placed more emphasis on the peculiarity of human passions. His central estimation is that humankind is filled and predominantly governed by the passion of pride, and even when one seems to be acting contrarily, he or she is doing so out of some form of self-interest. He spends a considerable amount of time satirizing “polite” societies whose members imagine their actions to be entirely benevolent. Statements like “Pride and Vanity have built more Hospitals than all the Virtues together” are used to point out the real motives behind seemingly charitable actions (The Fable, Vol. 1, pg. 294). Pride is central to Mandeville’s analysis because it accounts for human actions performed in order to appear selfless to gain public honor, but which can be made into public benefits. It takes the central role in the skillful politician’s plan to socialize humanity through flattery, offering honor as an ever-renewable prize to anyone who would deny his or her immediate self-interest for the sake of another.
For Mandeville, one problem that arose from this account was over the exact role of skillful politicians in mankind’s societal development. How could it be, if men were only able to please themselves, that some (these skillful politicians) could know enough to control others by instigating a system of social virtues? The second volume of the Fable was written to elucidate difficulties such as these and to explain several things “that were obscure and only hinted at in the First.” (The Fable, Vol. II, pg. vi) To accomplish this task, he fashioned six dialogues between interlocutors Cleomenes, who was an advocate for the Fable, and Horatio, described as one who found great delight in Lord Shaftesbury’s writings. These dialogues provided, among other topics, an explanation of how humankind transitioned from its original state of unrestrained self-pleasing into a complex functioning society. Pride was still central to this analysis, but because of the intricacy and confusion behind such a word as pride, Mandeville introduced a helpful distinction between “self-love” and “self-liking”. Self-liking was identified as the cause of pride and shame and accounted for the human need to gain approval from others, whereas self-love referred to material needs of the body; he asserted that the seeds of politeness were lodged within self-love and self-liking.
In part, this distinction came as response to Joseph Butler who claimed that Mandeville’s version of psychological egoism fell apart upon application. By seeking to reduce the consequences that stemmed from Mandeville’s exposure of the hypocrisy of acting for public benefit, Butler argued the compatibility of self-love and benevolence. He did this by making self-love a general, not a particular passion and in doing so, he made the object of self-love happiness. Happiness, then, would be entirely in the interest of moral subjects. Butler held that self-love was compatible with benevolence because calculating long-term interests led to virtuous action. To Mandeville, however, this avoided the main point by failing to ask the central ethical question: how the distinction between moral and non-moral action can be made if moral acts are indistinguishable from self-interested ones. This second volume of the Fable dismisses many of Butler’s criticisms as ignorant, but Mandeville did realize that his notion of pride needed to be re-conceptualized because it was a loaded term and yet was central to his estimation. According to Mandeville, Butler’s error –leading him to claim Mandeville’s system collapsed incoherently– was failing to recognize that men first had to like themselves, but could only do so through other’s recognition and then approbation. Mandeville upheld that self-love is given to all for self-preservation, but we cannot love what we dislike and so we must genuinely like our own being. He alleged that nature caused us to value ourselves above our real worth and so in order to confirm the good opinions we have of ourselves, we flock together to have these notions affirmed. He wrote, “an untaught Man would desire every body that came near him, to agree with him in the Opinion of his superiour Worth, and be angry, as far as his Fear would let him, with all that should refuse it: He would be highly delighted with, and love every body, whom he thought to have a good Opinion of him” (The Fable, Vol. II, pg. 138-9). So, he thought even in an instance where a group of men was fully fed, within less than a half an hour self-liking would lead to a desire for superiority in some way, be it through strength, cunning, or some other grander quality.
Mandeville thought introducing the distinction between “self-liking” and “self-love” rectified confusions over the role of pride. Humans have a deeply rooted psychological need for approbation, and this can drive us to ensure we truly possess the qualities we admire in others. In fact, he claimed self-liking is so necessary to beings who indulge it that people can taste no pleasure without it. Mandeville gives an example of the extremities of this need by claiming self-liking can even drive one to suicide if he or she fails to receive the approbation of others. Still, Mandeville maintains that because our motivation is for the pleasure of a good opinion of ourselves along with a good reputation, our achievement of virtuous character traits, even if genuinely desired, is not true virtue. The motivation is selfish and, consequently, not virtuous.
A large part of Mandeville’s later work focused on critiquing theorists like Berkeley, Law, and Shaftesbury. He particularly criticized Shaftesbury who claimed that human benevolence was natural and that men could act disinterestedly without regard to pride. Mandeville opposed the search for this objective standard of morality as being no better than “a Wild-Goose-Chace that is little to be depended on” (The Fable, Vol. I, p. 331). He thought that impressing upon people that they could be virtuous without self-denial would be a “vast inlet to hypocrisy,” not only deceiving everyone else, but also themselves (The Fable, Vol. I, p. 331). Mandeville aimed to show that, by using his own rigorous and austere standards of morality, his opponents had never performed a virtuous act in their lives; furthermore, if everyone must live up to these ideals, it would mean the collapse of modern society. Thus by alleging the difficulty of achieving virtue and the usefulness of vice, his paradox seemed to set a trap. Francis Hutcheson took up this debate in defense of Shaftesbury in order to establish an alternate account of human virtue to show how humanity could naturally be virtuous by acting from disinterested benevolence. He found the Fable’s outcome detestable in that it reduced societal virtue to passion and claimed this constituted a comprehensive system of sociability. Hutcheson considered a proper moralist to be one who promoted virtue by demonstrating that it is within one’s own best interest to act virtuously. He argued, by constructing his theory of the moral sense, that virtue was pleasurable and in complete accordance with one’s nature. Still, even with this radical departure from Mandeville’s conclusions, both undoubtedly agreed that reason could not sufficiently supply a standard for action: one must begin with an examination of human nature.
Other philosophers took the Fable in a less outraged and condemnatory fashion than Hutcheson. Instead of agreeing with Mandeville that self-interest negated moral worth and attempting to show that human action could be entirely disinterested, Hume agreed with substantial aspects of his basic analysis, but pointed out that if good things result from vice, then there is something deeply incorrect in retaining the terminology of vice after all. Hume considered Hutcheson’s conclusion— that we give our approvals because we are pleased naturally by the actions we find virtuous— to be incorrect. Hume noted, much like Mandeville, that our sense of duty or morality solely occurs in civilization, and he aligns himself more closely with Mandeville than Hutcheson when accounting for human sociability.
It is, perhaps, through Jean-Jacques Rousseau that Mandeville’s naturalistic account of human sociability found its most important messenger. In 1756, Adam Smith, in his review of Rousseau’s Discourse on the Origins of Inequality remarked how Mandeville’s second volume of the Fable gave occasion to Rousseau’s system. Rousseau and Mandeville both deny the natural sociability of man and equally stress the gradual evolution of society. For Rousseau, mankind was endowed with pity, or a “natural repugnance at seeing any other sensible being and particularly any of our own species, suffer pain or death” (Discourse on the Origins of Inequality). This pity or compassion plays a large part in modifying amour de soi-même (self-respect) and making it humane. He saw this passion as a natural and acknowledged that Mandeville agreed. What Mandeville failed to see, thought Rousseau, was that from this pity came all of the other societal virtues.
Smith was also influenced by Mandeville, but likewise disagreed with the supposition that people are wholly selfish, and his Theory of Moral Sentiments spends considerable time debunking the positions of Hobbes and Mandeville accordingly. Smith was able to circumvent this purely self-interested account by drawing on the role of sympathy. He supposed the whole account of self-interest as found in Hobbes’s and Mandeville’s systems caused such commotion in the world because of misapprehensions on the role of sympathy. Smith determined that an operational system of morals was partly based on its capacity to account for a good theory of fellow feeling. So, for example, Mandeville claimed that one’s motivation to help a beggar on the streets would stem from passions like pity that govern humankind: to walk away from someone in need would raise pity within one’s self in such way as to cause psychological harm, and therefore any help given would be performed in order to relieve the unease of seeing another in suffering.
Smith also considered Mandeville’s claim that humans only associated with one another to receive pleasure from the esteem they sought. While Smith did not wholly accept this, they both agreed about the enticing nature of public praise and that it can, at times, be a more powerful desire than accumulation of money. Smith responds directly to Mandeville on this point in the Theory of Moral Sentiments, paying particular attention to Mandeville’s account of the role of pride. Smith rejects Mandeville’s contention that all public spirit and self-sacrifice are merely clever ways to receive the praise of society. He gets around this by drawing a distinction between the desire to become praise-worthy, which is not vice, and the desire of frivolous praise for anything whatsoever. He claims there is a tricky similarity between the two that has been exaggerated by Mandeville, but the distinction is made by separating vanity from the love of true glory. Both are passions, but one is reasonable while the other is ridiculous. Significantly, though, Smith never lays to rest the importance of motivation to one’s overall actions and acknowledges how there are alternate motivations to act which employ both the role of sympathy and self-interest, e.g., one may donate out of some true feeling from sympathy, all the while knowing the move is socially advantageous. Smith gives some praise to Mandeville’s licentious system, because even though it was ultimately incorrect, it could not have made so much noise in the world if it had not, in some way, bordered upon truth. Smith noted it was because of Mandeville’s clever, yet misplaced analysis of human nature that people began to feel the connection between economic activity and human desire.
In Mandeville’s “Vindication” of the Fable, he proposed that the reason for its sudden popularity may have been his “An Essay on Charity and Charity-Schools” (1723). In this essay Mandeville took his theory from fable to applied social criticism as he claimed that charity is often mistook for pity and compassion. Pity and compassion, as opposed to charity, can be traced back to a desire to think well of one’s self. This “charity”, then, would not be virtuous action but vicious, and therefore worthy of examination. To say Mandeville was unpopular for writing against the formation of charity schools would be an understatement: charity schools were highly regarded and were the most popular form of benevolence in eighteenth-century England. Initiated near the end of the seventeenth century, they were the predominant form of education for the poor. Donning a charitable temperature, these schools provided ways to impose virtuous qualities into the minds of poor children. The common attitude toward these children was rather derogatory and often depicted them as “rough” because they came from pickpockets, idlers and beggars of society. The curriculum within charity schools was overtly religious, attempting to instill moral and religious habits so as to turn these children into polite members of society.
Bernard Mandeville opposed the formation of charity schools, and while his disagreement may seem harsh, it is a practical example of the kind of hypocrisy he contested. Mandeville challenged the use of the word “charity” in description of these schools, and claimed that they were formed not out of the virtue of charity, but out of the passion of pity. To him, passions like pity are acted upon to relieve one’s own self the unease of seeing another in suffering. He explains that, in order for an action to be virtuous, there must not be an impure motive. Acts performed on behalf of friends and family, or done in order to gain honor and public respect could not be charitable. If charity were reducible to pity, then charity itself would be an undiscriminating universal passion and be of no use to society. To him, charity schools were simply clever manifestations of pride. Beginning the essay with his own rigid definition of charity, Mandeville clearly intended to show that these schools were not worthy to be so entitled.
Mandeville argued pity and compassion were accounted for by human passions, and noted, that though it may seem odd, we are controlled by self-love that drives us to relieve these feelings. He drew a sketch of self-love and pity working together with his beggar example. Imagine a beggar on the streets appeals to you by explaining his situation, showing off his wound in need of medical attention, and then implores you to show virtue for Jesus Christ’s sake by giving him some money. His image raises within you a sense of pity, and you feel compelled to give him money. Mandeville claimed the beggar is a master in this art of capturing pity and makes his marks buy their peace. It is our self-love alone that motivates us to give money to this beggar, which cannot constitute an act of charity.
The part of the “Essay” that would have been truly offensive to those in Mandeville’s time comes when he turns accusations of villainy not to so-called objects of charity but to people with wealth and education. He attacks those of good reputation and claims that the reason they have this good reputation is that they have hidden their private vice behind public benefit. He compared charity schools to a vogue in the fashion of hooped petticoats, and pointed out no reason could be given for either. Moreover, he considered these schools to be pernicious, as they would weaken the established social hierarchies on which the British state depended. Charity schools were fashionable to support, but beyond this, Mandeville found little reason for their continuation.
Mandeville disagreed with the entire motivation behind charity schools, seeing them as nothing but a system where men he most opposed could impart their views onto following generations. Mandeville thought, as was common in his day, that people were born into their life stations and should seek to be content within them. He still considered charity to be necessary at times because the helpless should be looked after, but he believed the model of charity schools would only ever promote laziness in society. This view becomes less cynical when considering his support of economic activity as a solution. Mandeville approved of the growing industry and he saw economic advancements as necessary pieces to advancing civilization because standards were being raised, for example: today’s poor were living like yesterday’s rich. He alleged that British prosperity depended, in part, on exploiting the laboring poor, and so it was not the economic advancement he challenged, but rather the hypocrisy of individuals who thought that by their public benefit, they were advancing society. These citizens were acting out of self-love not charity, and if this could be realized, then instances like charity schools could be given over to the critical examination Mandeville thought they deserved.
Mandeville’s defense of luxury stands amidst the forefront of economic discussions in the eighteenth century. While he charged that a state founded on selfishness is corrupt, he also showed that society must be based upon that selfishness and that no state can be great without embracing luxury. His argument that luxury was harmless to social (if not personal, spiritual) prosperity and necessary for economic flourishing flew in the face of traditional ascetic moral codes embedded in certain Christian teaching, as well as earlier republican political theory which claimed that luxury rendered a population impotent and corrupted individuals, leading to the internal decay of the polity and its vulnerability to external conquest.
Mandeville’s most prevalent influence on economic theory was through Adam Smith. Both of them by and large supported market-based systems of free resource allocation. Mandeville’s commanding point, which could not be ignored by future economists, was that without indulgence there would be little, if any, consumer spending. Mandeville certainly influenced Smith’s economic thought, as Smith picks up the private vice, public benefit paradox in order to claim that one of the original principles in human nature is to barter and trade for private advantage, which then propels commercial society forward resulting in economic advancement and prosperity. This paradox raised the question of whether self-interested action was vicious, and further proposed that by attending to one’s own needs, one could actually contribute to society in positive ways. In his Wealth of Nations, Smith borrowed largely from Mandeville’s earlier position on the usefulness of self-interested behavior, though he denied the scandalous implications Mandeville provided. It is speculated as to whether Smith inherited his invisible hand notion from the paradox Mandeville presented–although the phrase was never explicitly mentioned in Mandeville’s writing– because Smith mentions the invisible hand when he provides an example of unintended public interest brought about by intending one’s own gain. Influence is also found in the division of labor theory, which was one of Smith’s tenets of modern economic thought.
Most notably, Mandeville’s work contains the genealogical origins of laissez-faire economic theory- in particular as put forward by Friedrich von Hayek, one of the Fable’s keenest twentieth-century admirers. The similarity lies in Mandeville’s claim that self-seeking individuals will interact in mutually beneficial ways without being coordinated from above, while a natural check on their interactions will result in public benefit as the outcome. Interference with this self-seeking will pervert the balance- as alleged in the conclusion of the Grumbling Hive. Because of this notion of order emerging through voluntarily, unregulated activities, Hayek credits Mandeville as being one of the first to put forward the concept of “spontaneous order”. Using the same sort of language, Mandeville remarked, “how the short-sighted Wisdom, of perhaps well-meaning People, may rob us of a Felicity, that would flow spontaneously from the Nature of every large Society, if none were to divert or interrupt the Stream” (The Fable, Vol. II, p. 427). Hayek argued that instead of solely viewing Mandeville through the lens of a moral philosopher, we should see him as a great psychologist who may not have contributed much by way of answers, but certainly asked the right questions using an evolutionary approach to understand society. Hayek even goes so far as to claim that Darwin, in many respects, is the culmination of a development Mandeville started more than any other single person. This approach– rather than assuming society was the product of planning and conscious design by elites– helped spark new empirical explorations. Mandeville saw the sociability of man as arising from two things: the many desires he has, and the opposition met while attempting to satisfy these desires. He brings to the foreground the beneficial effects of luxury, and this was part of what interested John Maynard Keynes. In his General Theory, Keynes cited Mandeville as a source for his position in emphasizing the positive effects of consumption (aggregate demand). This stood in opposition to classical economics who held up production (aggregate supply) as the motor of economic growth.
While there was no systematic formulation of laissez-faire theory in Mandeville’s writing, it was an important literary source for the doctrine, namely, its analysis of human selfishness and the societal benefits ironically and unintentionally stemming therefrom. It is precisely through these attempts to reconcile the paradox of private vices, public benefits that we find some of the first leanings toward a modern utilitarian attitude. Accordingly, Mandeville is thought to be one its most fundamental and early philosophical influences, as transmitted in particular by David Hume and Adam Smith to Jeremy Bentham and then John Stuart Mill.
Bernard Mandeville was an outspoken and controversial author and an equally interesting character. He claims that he wrote mostly for his own entertainment, but the vast number of essays, poems, and stories he composed should, perhaps, be allowed to speak for themselves. The best modern edition and collection of Mandeville’s work is F.B. Kaye’s The Fable of the Bees. The textual references throughout the article were from Kaye’s Fable through the Online Library of Liberty (1988). The following list of Mandeville’s work is adapted from and indebted to Kaye’s own work on Bernard Mandeville.
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Last updated: October 1, 2013 | Originally published: