The philosophical approach known as existentialism is commonly recognized for its view that life’s experiences and interactions are meaningless. Many existentialist thinkers are led to conclude that life is only something to be tolerated, and that close or intimate relationships with others should be avoided. Heard distinctly among this despair and dread was the original philosophical voice of Gabriel Marcel. Marcel, a World War I non-combatant veteran, pursued the life of an intellectual, and enjoyed success as a playwright, literary critic, and concert pianist. He was trained in philosophy by Henri Bergson, among others. A prolific life-long writer, his early works reflected his interest in idealism. As Marcel developed philosophically, however, his work was marked by an emphasis on the concrete, on lived experience. After converting to Catholicism in 1929, he became a noted opponent of atheistic existentialism, and primarily that of Jean-Paul Sartre. Sartre’s characterizations of the isolated self, the death of God, and lived experience as having “no exit” especially disgusted Marcel. Regardless of his point of departure, Marcel throughout his life balked at the designation of his philosophy as, “Theistic existentialism.” He argued that, though theism was consistent with his existentialism, it was not an essential characteristic of it.
Marcel’s conception of freedom is the most philosophically enduring of all of his themes, although the last decade has seen a resurgence of attention paid to Marcel’s metaphysics and epistemology. A decidedly unsystematic thinker, it is difficult to categorize Marcel’s work, in large part because the main Marcelian themes are so interconnected. A close read, however, shows that in addition to that of freedom, Marcel’s important philosophical contributions were on the themes of participation, creative fidelity, exigence, and presence.
Gabriel Marcel was born in Paris in 1889, the city where he also died in 1973. Marcel was the only child of Henri and Laure Marcel. His father was a French diplomat to Sweden and was committed to educating his son through frequent travel across Europe. The death of his mother, in 1893 when Gabriel was not quite four years old left an indelible impression on him. He was raised primarily by his mother’s sister, whom his father married two years after Laure’s passing, and though “Auntie” loved her nephew and gave him the best formal education, Gabriel loathed the structure of the classroom, and became excited about the intellectual life only after entering Sorbonne, from which he graduated in 1910.
Marcel was not a “dogmatic pacifist,” but experiences in World War I as a non-combatant solidified to Marcel the, “Desolate aspect that it [war] became an object of indignation, a horror without equal,” (AE 20) and contributed to a life-long fascination with death. It was during the war that many of the important philosophical themes in Marcel’s later work would take root, and indeed, during the war, Marcel began writing in a journal that served as a framework for his first book, Metaphysical Journal (1927).
After the war, Marcel married Jaqueline Boegner, and he taught at a secondary school in Paris. It was in these early wedded years that Marcel became engaged as a playwright, philosopher, and literary critic. The couple continued to travel, they adopted a son, Jean Marie, and Marcel developed friendships with important thinkers of the day. Marcel gave talks throughout Europe as a result of these contacts, and was regarded as a keen mind and a type of renaissance figure, excelling in music, drama, philosophy, theology, and politics. As for his literary works, Marcel in total published more than 30 plays, a number of which have been translated in English and produced in the United States. Marcel was acutely aware, however, that his dramatic work did not enjoy the popularity of his philosophical work, but he believed nonetheless that both were, “Capable of moving and often of absorbing readers very different from one another, living in the most diverse countries—beings whom it is not a question of counting precisely because they are human beings and belong as such to an order where number loses all meaning,” (AE, 27).
Although Marcel did not pursue anything more permanent than intermittent teaching posts at secondary schools, he did hold prestigious lectureships, giving the Gifford Lectures at Aberdeen in 1949-50 and the William James Lectures at Harvard in 1961. His most significant philosophical works include Being and Having (1949), The Mystery of Being, Volume I and II (1950-51), Man against Mass Society (1962) and Creative Fidelity (1964). During his latter years, he emerged as a vocal political thinker, and played a crucial role in organizing and advocating the international Moral Re-Armament movement of the 1960s. (Marcel was pleased to be awarded the Peace Prize of the Börsenverein des Buchhandels in 1964.)
Throughout his life, Marcel sought out, and was sought out by, various influential thinkers, including Paul Ricoeur, Jacques Maritain, Charles Du Bos, Gustave Thibon, and Emmanuel Levinas. In spite of the many whom he positively influenced, Marcel became known for his very public disagreements with Jean-Paul Sartre. In fact, the acrimony between the two became such that the two would attend performances of the other’s plays, only to storm out midway. Perhaps the most fundamental ideological disagreement between the two was over the notion of autonomy. For Marcel, autonomy is a discovery of the self as a being receptive to others, rather than as a power to be exerted. Marcel’s autonomy is rooted in a commitment to participation with others (see 3 below), and is unique in that the participative subject is committed by being encountered, or approached by, another individual’s need. Sartre’s notion of commitment is based on the strength of the solitary decisions made by individuals who have committed themselves fully to personal independence. Yet, Marcel took commitment to be primarily the response to the appeal directed to the self as an individual (A 179) so that the self is free to respond to another on account of their mutual needs. The feud between the two, though heated, had the effect of casting a shadow over Marcel’s work as “mysticism” rather than philosophy, a stigma that Marcel would work for the rest of his life to dispute.
A strange inner mutation is spreading throughout humanity, according to Marcel. As odd as it first seems, this mutation is evoked by the awareness that members of humanity are contingent on conditions which make up the framework for their very existence. Man recognizes that at root, he is an existing thing, but he somehow feels compelled to prove his life is more significant than that. He begins to believe that the things he surrounds himself with can make his life more meaningful or valuable. This belief, says Marcel, has thrown man into a ghostly state of quandary caused by a desire to possess rather than to be. All people become a master of defining their individual selves by either their possessions or by their professions. Meaning is forced into life through these venues. Even more, individuals begin to believe that their lives have worth because they are tied to these things, these objects. This devolution creates a situation in which individuals experience the self only as a statement, as an object, “I am x.”
The objectification of the self through one’s possessions robs one of her freedom, and separates her from the experiences of her own participation in being. The idolatrous world of perverted possession must be abandoned if the true reality of humanity is to be reached (SZ 285). Perhaps most known for his views on freedom, Marcel gave to existentialism a view of freedom that marries the absolute indeterminacy of traditional existentialism with Marcel’s view that transcendence out of facticity can only come by depending upon others with the same goals. The result is a type of freedom-by-degrees in which all people are free, since to be free is to be self-governing, but not all people experience freedom that can lead them out of objectification. The experience of freedom cannot be achieved unless the subject extricates herself from the grip of egocentrism, since freedom is not simply doing what desire dictates. The person who sees herself as autonomous within herself has a freedom based on ill-fated egocentrism. She errs in believing freedom to be rooted on independence.
Freedom is defined by Marcel in both a negative and positive sense. Negatively, freedom is, “The absence of whatever resembles an alienation from oneself,” and positively as when, “The motives of my action are within the limits of what I can legitimately consider as the structural traits of my self,” (TF, 232). Freedom, then, is always about the possibilities of the self, understood within the confines of relationships with others. As an existentialist, Marcel’s freedom is tied to the raw experiences of the body. However, the phenomenology of Marcelian freedom is characterized by his insistence that freedom is something to be experienced, and the self is fully free when it is submerged in the possibilities of the self and the needs of others. Although all humans have basic, autonomous freedom (Marcel thought of this as “capricious” freedom), in virtue of their embodiment and consciousness; only those persons who seek to experience being by freely engaging with other free beings can break out of the facticity of the body and into the fulfillment of being. The free act is significant because it contributes to defining the self, “By freedom I am given back to myself,” (VII vii).
At first glance, Marcelian freedom is paradoxical: the more one enters into a self-centered project, the less legitimate it is to say that the act is free, whereas the more the self is engaged with other free individuals, the more the self is free. However, the phenomenological experience of freedom is less paradoxical when it is seen through the lens of the engagement of freedom. Ontologically, we rarely have experiences of the singular self; instead, our experiences are bound to those with whom we interact. Freedom based on the very participation that the free act seeks to affirm is the ground of the true experience of freedom towards which Marcel gravitates.
Marcel was an early proponent of what would become a major Sartrean existential tenet: I am my body. For Marcel, the body does not have instrumental value, nor is it simply a part or extension of the self. Instead, the self cannot be eradicated from the body. It is impossible for the self to conceive of the body in any way at all except for as a distinct entity identified with the self (CF 23). Existence is prior, and existence is prior to any abstracting that we do on the basis of our perception. Existence is indubitable, and existence is in opposition to the abstraction of objectivity (TW 225). That we are body, of course, naturally lends us to think of the body in terms of object. But individuals who resort to seeing the self and the world in terms of functionality are ontologically deficient because not only can they not properly respond to the needs of others, but they have become isolated and independent from others. It is our active freedom that prevents us from the snare of objectifying the self, and which brings us into relationships with others.
When we are able to act freely, we can move away from the isolated perspective of the problematic man (“I am body only,”) to that of the participative subject (“I am a being among beings”) who is capable of interaction with others in the world. Marcelian participation is possible through a special type of reflection in which the subject views herself as a being among beings, rather than as an object. This reflection is secondary reflection, and is distinguished from both primary reflection and mere contemplation. Primary reflection explains the relationship of an individual to the world based on her existence as an object in the world, whereas secondary reflection takes as its point of departure the being of the individual among others. The goal of primary reflection, then, is to problematize the self and its relation to the world, and so it seeks to reduce and conquer particular things. Marcel rejects primary reflection as applicable to ontological matters because he believes it cannot understand the main metaphysical issue involved in existence: the incommunicable experience of the body as mine. Neither does mere contemplation suffice to explain this phenomenon. Contemplation is existentially significant, because it indicates the act by which the self concentrates its attention on its self, but such an act without secondary reflection would result in the same egocentrism that Marcel attempts to avoid through his work.
Secondary reflection has as its goal the explication of existence, which cannot be separated from the individual, who is in turn situated among others. For Marcel, an understanding of one’s being is only possible through secondary reflection, since it is a reflection whereby the self asks itself how and from what starting point the self is able to proceed (E 14). The existential impetus of secondary reflection cannot be overemphasized for Marcel: Participation which involves the presence of the self to the world is only possible if the temptation to assume the self is wholly distinct from the world is overcome (CF 22). The existential upshot is that secondary reflection allows the individual to seek out others, and it dissolves the dualism of primary reflection by realizing the lived body’s relation to the ego.
Reflexive reflection is the reflection of the exigent self (see 5 below). It occurs when the subject is in communion with others, and is free and also dependent upon others (as discussed in 2). Reflexive reflection is an inward looking that allows the self to be receptive to the call of others. Yet, Marcel does not call on the participative subject to be reflective for receptivity’s sake. Rather, the self cannot fully understand the existential position without orientating itself to something other than the self.
For Marcel, to exist only as body is to exist problematically. To exist existentially is to exist as a thinking, emotive, being, dependent upon the human creative impulse. He believed that, “As soon as there is creation, we are in the realm of being,” and also that, “There is no sense using the word ‘being’ except where creation is in view,” (PGM xiii). The person who is given in a situation to creative development experiences life qualitatively at a higher mode of being than those for whom experiences are another facet of their functionality. Marcel argues that, “A really alive person is not merely someone who has a taste for life, but somebody who spreads that taste, showering it, as it were, around him; and a person who is really alive in this way has, quite apart from any tangible achievements of his, something essentially creative about him,” (VI, 139). This is not to say, of course, that the creative impulse is measurable by what we produce. Whereas works of art most explicitly express creative energy, inasmuch as we give ourselves to each other, acts of love, admiration, and friendship also describe the creative act. In fact, participation with others is initiated through acts of feeling which not only allow the subject to experience the body as his own, but which enable him to respond to others as embodied, sensing, creative, participative beings as well. To feel is a mode of participation, a creative act which draws the subject closer to an experience of the self as a being-among-beings, although higher degrees of participation are achieved by one whose acts demonstrate a commitment to that experience. So, to create is to reject the reduction of the self to the level of abstraction—of object, “The denial of the more than human by the less than human,” (CF 10).
If the creative élan is a move away from the objectification of humanity, it must be essentially tied relationally to others. Creative fidelity, then, entails a commitment to acts which draw the subject closer to others, and this must be balanced with a proper respect for the self. Self-love, self-satisfaction, complacency, or even self-anger are attitudes which can paralyze one’s existential progress and mitigate against the creative impulse. To be tenacious in the pursuit– the fidelity aspect– is the most crucial part of the creative impulse, since creation is a natural outflow of being embodied. One can create, and create destructively. To move towards a greater sense of being, one must have creative fidelity. Fidelity exists only when it triumphs over the gap in presence from one being to another—when it helps others relate, and so defies absences in presence (CF 152).
It is not enough to be constant, since constancy is tenacity towards a specific goal, which requires neither presence nor an openness to change. Rather, creative fidelity implies that there is presence, if it is true that faithfulness requires being available (in the Marcelian sense, see 5) to another even when it is difficult. (Interestingly, Marcel’s notion of fidelity means more than someone’s merely not being unfaithful. A spouse, for example, might not physically cheat on her husband, but on Marcel’s view, if she remains unavailable to her partner, she can only be called “constant”. She cannot be called “faithful”.) Additionally, fidelity requires that a subject be open to changing her mind, actions, and beliefs if those things do not contribute to a better grasp of what it means to be. Since fidelity is a predicate that is best ascribed by others to us, it follows that receptivity to the views of others’ is a natural component of fidelity.
But what is it that Marcel thinks we ought to be faithful towards? It isn’t simply to pursue the impetus of the exigent life, although that is involved. More concretely, creative fidelity is a fidelity towards being free, and that freedom involves making decisions about what is important, rather than living in a state of stasis. Marcel railed against indecision with respect to what is essential, even though such indecision, “Seems to be the mark and privilege of the illumined mind,” (CF 190) because truly free people are not entrapped by their beliefs, but are liberated by living out their consequences (see 2).
Dominating Marcel’s philosophical development was the intersection of his interest in the individuality of beings and his interest in the relations which bind beings together. An acceptable ontology must account for the totality of the lived experience, and so must have as a point of departure the fact that humans are fundamentally embodied. From there, ontology must explain how an individual fits among other individuals, and so must account for what it means to experience and have relations in the world. Ontological exigence is the Marcelian actualization of transcendence, which is manifested as a thirst for the fullness of being and a demand to transcend the world of abstract objectivity. This desire to be fulfilled within the body, however, is not a desire for perfection (which cannot be achieved) but is instead, “The contradiction of the functionalized world and of the overpowering monotony of a society in which it becomes increasingly difficult to differentiate between members of society,” (V. II, 42). The typical person (that is, the “Problematic man”) has become an object to him or herself through sheer busyness of life, through a lack of meaningful relationships with others, and through the intrusion of technological advancement. The exigent person can transcend her problematicity—indeed, she, “Gradually develops individuality” (CF 149), and she does this by being aware of the self as a body in relation with, and in participation with, others in the world. (The cognitive subject cannot seek the fulfilled state of the exigent self in a meaningful way, and the experiencing subject cannot see beyond herself as an object. It is the participative subject, who is governed by the uniquely Marcelian doctrines of reflection, communion, receptivity, and availability, which can move from self-as-body to self-as-being among beings.)
The reflective focus of the exigent self occurs most effectively when the subject is involved in a community of people who are mutually receptive and accepting of others’ experiences and needs. Just as secondary reflection must be active in order to participate with others, the exigent self’s reflexive reflection is rooted in an active, more developed sense of availability to others (see 3). This availability is not passive; rather, the exigent self actively seeks out relationships with others, just as she is actively engaged in the concern for others. Whereas a subject’s passivity can result in fear, hesitancy, and powerlessness, the action of the exigent self can allow her to positively change a situation for another person. The force of the exigent life comes through the experience of being that is only found in sharing with others in being. The most significant end achievable for an individual is to be immersed in the beings of others, for only with others does the self experience wholeness of being. (This isn’t to say, of course, that the self will experience wholeness just in virtue of her being available to others. Availability is a risk one takes, since it is only through availability that the potential for fullness emerges as possible.)
In opposition to exigence is the life of the problematic man. There is a polarity between what is given in the technological world (a world in which things are objectified according to their function—biological, political, economic, social) and the fullness of being, which resists abstract determinations. Marcel argued that, “Nothing is more awful than this reduction of man, of a human being by such distinctions,” (TW 225-6). The exigent life is repelled by this reduction, and serves as a protest against it. Exigence provides a recourse to a type of experience which bears within itself the warrant of its own value. It is the substitution of one mode of experience for another; one that strives towards an increasingly pure mode of existence (VI ix).
The term “presence” is used in various ways in the English language, although each connote a “here-ness” that indicates whether or not a subject was “here”. One of the differences in how we use the term is in the strength of a thing’s “here-ness”. Two people sitting in close physical proximity on an airplane might not be present to each other, although people miles away speaking on a phone might have a stronger awareness of being together. There is mystery in presence, according to Marcel, because presence can transcend the objective physical fact of being-with each other. Presence is concerned with recognizing the self as a being-among-beings, and acknowledging the relevance of others’ experiences to the self, as a being.
The notion of presence for Marcel is comprised of two other parallel notions, communion and availability. Together, communion and availability enable an individual to come into a complete participation with another being. Although “presence” is found throughout Marcel’s work, he admits that it is impossible to give a rigorous definition of it. Rather than working out a lexical definition of the term, we ought to evoke its meaning through our shared experiences. Marcel demonstrates this by noting how easy it is to find ourselves with others who are not significantly present at all, and at other times we are present to those who are not physically with us at all. The mark of presence is the mutual tie to the other. For Marcel, it means that the self is “given” to the other, and that givenness is responsively received or reciprocated. (The reciprocity of presence is a necessary condition for it.) Presence is shared, then, in virtue of our openness to each other.
This openness is not linguistically based, since it is beyond the physical relation and communication among individuals. Non-linguistic presence is possible for Marcel because of an aspect of presence Marcel calls “communion”. Communion with other participative beings is renewing to the self as a result of the other giving to me out of who he is, rather than merely by what he says. Marcel almost certainly borrows from Martin Buber’s I-Thou in his view of communion, in that Buber’s ontological communion is the free expression of those who are able to give and receive freely to each other so that an encounter with the other is possible, and for Marcel this communion is expressed as a free reception of the other to oneself (IB 136). Communion-as-encounter, according to Marcel (GR 273), is encapsulated by the French en, whereas in English, within best represents the envelopment of one’s being that occurs in communion. A shared experience allows for a more full understanding of one’s own being. If the self is in communion with another, and is present to the other, the self is more present towards the self. Communion with others can give new meaning to experiences that otherwise would have been closed to the self.
For interactions in which there is communication without communion, Marcel believes that the self becomes an object to the one with whom the communication is occurring. And, where there is objectification, there cannot be participation, and without the availability of participation, there cannot be presence. A key aspect of communion, then, is the way it limits the objectification of beings. Marcel argues that one cannot have presence with—that is, one cannot welcome or gather to the self—whatever is purely and simply an object. For objects, the self can take it or leave it, but presence can only be invoked or evoked (VI 208). Presence that results from communion produces a bond between those who are in participation with another, who are receptive to another, and who are committed to sharing in each others’ experiences.
Communion is necessary for presence, but is entwined with Marcel’s notion of availability, disponibilité. If it is true that participative beings can have communion with each other, and so encounter one another, then there must be another component to presence that enables a once-objectified person to respond to the encounter of communion. The ability to yield to that which is encountered, and so to pledge oneself to another, is the component of presence that Marcel calls availability (HV 23). Availability can be understood as being at hand, or handiness, so that a person is ready to respond to another when called upon. The available subject seeks out other available subjects as individuals whose experiences can compliment and more fully speak to her. Of course, for another’s experiences to speak to the subject, she must be open to the influence and needs of the other. But this openness cannot result in the objectification of the subject by the other. To be available is not to be possessed as an object. Rather, to be available means that that the best use the subject can make of her freedom is to place it in the other’s hands, as a free response to who the other is. The subject is not an object to be disposed of, then, but a fellow subject in need of the influence of the experiences of the other.
The positive result of living an available life is that it makes the subject more fully aware of herself than she would be if she did not have the relationship. No longer does the subject have to struggle with her facticity, but she can find contentment through the mutual presence—from the communion and availability she has with a community of beings, all of whom are committed to the same end. Just as the joints of the skeleton are conjoined and adapted to bones, Marcel contends that the individual life finds its justification and its meaning by being inwardly conjoined, adapted, and oriented towards something other than itself (V I, 201-2).
There are, certainly, detriments to the life of presence that Marcel explicates. He penned as many words on unavailability, indisponibilité as he did availability, and with good reason: obstacles frequently occur when individuals attempt to coalesce their experiences to emerge as stronger, more cohesive beings. Almost all occurrences of unavailability result form an individual seeking fulfillment through the objectification of the self. To be unavailable is to be preoccupied with the self as an object, to be self-centered in such a way as to exclude the possibility of engaging with others as subjects (BH 74, 78). The unavailable person is characterized by an absorption with her self, whether with her own successes and accomplishments or her own problems. She can feel temporary satisfaction by wallowing in herself, but she only experiences herself as object, and so cannot be whole. Whatever brief satisfaction the unavailable individual has, it is short-lived because she becomes encumbered—for Marcel, “used up”—by all of the things by which she attempts to define herself: job, family, poor health, indebtedness, etc. Marcel compares the encumbered, unavailable life, to a hand-written draft of a manuscript. Just as the clutter of editing marks on a draft disables the author from figuring out what is important to the central ideas, the encumbered self no longer has access to her own point of view. The result is frustration, apathy, or distrust in oneself or others. The weight of encumbrance renders the self incapable of presence, and so the self becomes opaque. The opaque person ceased to let his presence pass into the world, and so has blocked the experiences of others to help inform and shape his own.
The existential life that Marcel paints as possible for humanity is largely one of hope—but not one of optimism. Being in the world as body allows one to seek out new opportunities for the self, and so Marcelian hope is deeply pragmatic in that it refuses to compute all of the possibilities against oneself. But the picture is not rosy. Hope for Marcel is not faith that things will go well, because most often, things do not go well. The depravity of the problematic man threatens to suffocate. Yet, even if there is despair in our situation, there is always movement towards something more. This movement towards is the philosophical project for Gabriel Marcel. If there is always movement, and always more to reach for, the existential self is never complete (and indeed, this is why Marcel refused to categorize his existential project as a “system” or “dialectic”). The mystery of being for the existential self is unsolvable, because it is not a problem to be solved.
The notion of “hope” for Marcel relies upon a significant Marcelian distinction between problem and mystery. For the problematic man (see section 2) each aspect of life is reduced to the level of a problem, so that the self and all of its relationships, goals, and desires are treated as obstacles to be conquered. Life is, for the problematic man, a series of opportunities to possess, and the body is alienated from the problematic man’s own corporeality. Not only is such a person separated from his own being as a result, he is distanced from the true mystery of being. If I am my body, and I want to inquire into being, I must grasp that being is a philosophical mystery to be engaged with rather than a problem to be solved. The existential self, upon recognizing that the self is not something that is possessed, can then shift his thought from questioning the significance of his own existence as a matter of fact, to questioning how he is related to his body. The vital cannot be separated from the spiritual, since the spiritual is conditioned on the body, which can then provide for opportunities and so, for hope.
The mystery of being, then, is a tale to be told, analyzed, probed, and worked toward. To be sure, even as experiences change, society evolves, and relations emerge, the individual who seeks meaning through an investigation of their being will never be fully satisfied. If Marcel’s ontology is viable, and the self can question who it is that asks Who am I?, then the self will find the answer to be constantly in flux.
Jill Graper Hernandez
University of Texas at San Antonio
U. S. A.
Last updated: December 8, 2009 | Originally published: