Marcus Aurelius (121—180 C.E.)

aureliuThe philosophy of the Roman Emperor Marcus Aurelius can be found in a collection of personal writings known as the Meditations. These reflect the influence of Stoicism and, in particular, the philosophy of Epictetus, the Stoic. The Meditations may be read as a series of practical philosophical exercises, following Epictetus' three topics of study, designed to digest and put into practice philosophical theory. Central to these exercises is a concern with the analysis of one's judgements and a desire to cultivate a "cosmic perspective."

From a modern perspective Marcus Aurelius is certainly not in the first rank of ancient philosophers. He is no Plato or Aristotle, nor even a Sextus Empiricus or Alexander of Aphrodisias. To a certain extent this judgement is perfectly fair and reasonable. However, in order to assess the philosophical qualities that Marcus does have and that are displayed in the Meditations it is necessary to emphasize that in antiquity philosophy was not conceived merely as a matter of theoretical arguments. Such arguments existed and were important, but they were framed within a broader conception of philosophy as a way of life. The aim was not merely to gain a rational understanding of the world but to allow that rational understanding to inform the way in which one lived. If one keeps this understanding of 'philosophy' in mind, then one becomes able to appreciate the function and the philosophical value of Marcus' Meditations.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. The Meditations
  3. Philosophy
    1. Stoicism
    2. The Influence of Epictetus
    3. The Three topoi
    4. Philosophical Exercises
    5. The Point of View of the Cosmos
  4. Concluding Remarks
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Life

Marcus Aurelius was born in 121 C.E.. His early education was overseen by the Emperor Hadrian, and he was later adopted by the Emperor Antoninus Pius in 138 C.E.. After an initial education in rhetoric undertaken by Fronto, Marcus later abandoned it in favor of philosophy. Marcus became Emperor himself in AD 161, initially alongside Lucius Verus, becoming sole Emperor in AD 169. Continual attacks meant that much of his reign was spent on campaign, especially in central Europe. However, he did find time to establish four Chairs of Philosophy in Athens, one for each of the principal philosophical traditions (Platonic, Aristotelian, Stoic, andEpicurean). He died in AD 180.

2. The Meditations

Marcus' reputation as a philosopher rests upon one work, the Meditations. The Meditations take the form of a personal notebook and were probably written while Marcus was on campaign in central Europe, c. AD 171-175. The entries appear to be in no particular order and may simply be in the original order of composition. The repetition of themes and the occasional groups of quotations from other authors (see e.g. Med. 4.46, 11.33-39)add to this impression. Book One, however, is somewhat different from the rest of the text and may well have been written separately (a plan for it may be discerned in Med. 6.48).

The first recorded mention of the Meditations is by Themistius in AD 364. The current Greek title - ta eis heauton ('to himself') – derives from a manuscript now lost and may be a later addition (it is first recorded c. AD 900 by Arethas). The modern text derives primarily from two sources: a manuscript now in the Vatican and a lost manuscript (mentioned above), upon which the first printed edition (1558) was based.

Beyond the Meditations there also survives part of a correspondence between Marcus and his rhetoric teacher Fronto, probably dating from earlier in Marcus' life (c. AD 138-166), discovered as a palimpsest in 1815. However, although this interesting discovery sheds some light on Marcus as an individual, it adds little to our understanding of his philosophy.

3. Philosophy

a. Stoicism

According to tradition, Marcus was a Stoic. His ancient biographer, Julius Capitolinus, describes him as such. Marcus also makes reference to a number of Stoics by whom he was taught and, in particular, mentions Rusticus from whom he borrowed a copy of the works of the Stoic philosopher Epictetus (Med. 1.7). However, nowhere in the Meditations does Marcus explicitly call himself a Stoic. This may simply reflect the likelihood that Marcus was writing only for himself rather than attempting to define himself to an audience. Yet it is probably fair to admit that Marcus was at least open to ideas from other philosophical traditions, being impressed by Stoic philosophy, but not merely an unthinking disciple of Stoicism.

b. The Influence of Epictetus

As has been noted, Marcus was clearly familiar with the Discourses of Epictetus, quoting them a number of times (see Med. 11.33-38). Epictetus' fame in the second century is noted by a number of ancient sources, being hailed as the greatest of the Stoics (Aulus Gellius 1.2.6) and more popular than Plato (Origen Contra Celsus 6.2). If Marcus felt drawn towards Stoicism, then Epictetus would surely have stood out as the most important Stoic of the time. It is perhaps reasonable, then, to turn to Epictetus in order to explore the philosophical background to the Meditations.

c. The Three topoi

Central to Epictetus' philosophy is his account of three topoi, or areas of study. He suggests that the apprentice philosopher should be trained in three distinct areas or topoi (see Epictetus Discourses 3.2.1-2):

  1. Desires (orexeis) and aversions (ekkliseis);
  2. Impulse to act (hormas) and not to act (aphormas);
  3. Freedom from deception, hasty judgement, and anything else related to assents (sunkatatheseis).

These three areas of training correspond to the three types of philosophical discourse referred to by earlier Stoics; the physical, the ethical, and the logical (see Diogenes Laertius 7.39). For Epictetus, it is not enough merely to discourse about philosophy. The student of philosophy should also engage in practical training designed to digest philosophical principals, transforming them into actions. Only this will enable the apprentice philosopher to transform himself into the Stoic ideal of a wise person or sage (sophos). It is to this end that the three topoi are directed.

The first topos, concerning desire (orexis), is devoted to physics. It is not enough for the philosopher to know how Nature works; he must train his desires in the light of that knowledge so that he only desires what is in harmony with Nature. For the Stoic, Nature is a complex inter-connected physical system, identified with God, of which the individual is but one part. What might be called the practical implication of this conception of Nature is that an individual will inevitably become frustrated and unhappy if they desire things without taking into account the operations of this larger physical system. Thus, in order to become a Stoic sage - happy and in harmony with Nature – one must train one's desires in the light of a study of Stoic physical theory.

The second topos, concerning impulse (hormê), is devoted to ethics. The study of ethical theory is of course valuable in its own right but, for the Stoic training to be a sage, these theories must be translated into ethical actions. In order to transform the way in which one behaves, it is necessary to train the impulses that shape one's behavior. By so doing the apprentice philosopher will be able not merely to say how a sage should act but also to act as a sage should act.

The third topos, concerning assent (sunkatathesis), is devoted to logic. It is important to remember here that for the Stoics the term 'logic' included not only dialectic but also much of what one would today call epistemology. According to Epictetus every impression (phantasia) that an individual receives often includes a value-judgement (hupolêpsis) made by the individual. When an individual accepts or gives assent (sunkatathesis) to an impression, assent is often given to the value-judgement as well. For instance, when one sees someone drink a lot of wine, one often judges that they are drinking too much wine (see e.g. Epictetus Handbook 45). Epictetus suggests that, in the light of Stoic epistemological theory, the apprentice philosopher should train himself to analyze his impressions carefully and be on guard not to give assent to unwarranted value-judgements.

For Epictetus, then, the student of philosophy must not only study the three types of philosophical discourse but also engage in these three types of philosophical training or exercise in order to translate that theory into actions. Marcus may himself be seen as a student of Epictetus, and so some scholars have suggested that the three topoi form a key to understanding the Meditations. Indeed, the Meditations may be approached as an example of a form of personal writing in which the very act of writing constituted a philosophical exercise designed to digest the three types of philosophical theory. In other words, the Meditations are a text produced by someone engaged in the three topoi outlined by Epictetus. This is hinted at in Med. 9.7 where Marcus exhorts himself to 'wipe out impression (phantasia), check impulse (hormê), and quench desire (orexis)'.

d. Philosophical Exercises

The Meditations certainly do not present philosophical theories similar to those that one can find in, say, the surviving works of Aristotle. Nor are they comparable to a theoretical treatise like the Elements of Ethics by the Stoic Hierocles, possibly a contemporary of Marcus. Nevertheless, the Meditations remain essentially a philosophical text. As has already been noted, the Meditations are a personal notebook, written by Marcus to himself and for his own use. They do not form a theoretical treatise designed to argue for a particular doctrine or conclusion; their function is different. In order to understand this function it is necessary to introduce the idea of a philosophical exercise (askêsis).

In the Meditations Marcus engages in a series of philosophical exercises designed to digest philosophical theories, to transform his character or 'dye his soul' in the light of those theories (see e.g. Med. 5.16), and so to transform his behavior and his entire way of life. By reflecting upon philosophical ideas and, perhaps more importantly, writing them down, Marcus engages in a repetitive process designed to habituate his mind into a new way of thinking. This procedure is quite distinct from the construction of philosophical arguments and has a quite different function. Whereas the former is concerned with creating a particular philosophical doctrine, the latter is a practical exercise or training designed to assimilate that doctrine into one's habitual modes of behavior. Following the account of three types of philosophical training outlined by Epictetus, Marcus reflects in the Meditations upon a medley of physical, ethical, and logical ideas. These written reflections constitute a second stage of philosophical education necessary after one has studied the philosophical theories (see e.g. Epictetus Discourses 1.26.3). By engaging in such written philosophical exercises Marcus attempts to transform his soul or inner disposition that will, in turn, alter his behavior. Thus, this second stage of philosophical education is the process by which a philosophical apprentice trains himself to put theories into practice, and so make progress towards wisdom.

e. The Point of View of the Cosmos

Of all the philosophical exercises in the Meditations the most prominent centers around what might be called 'the point of view of the cosmos'. In a number of passages Marcus exhorts himself to overcome the limited perspective of the individual and experience the world from a cosmic perspective. For example:

You have the power to strip away many superfluous troubles located wholly in your judgement, and to possess a large room for yourself embracing in thought the whole cosmos, to consider everlasting time, to think of the rapid change in the parts of each thing, of how short it is from birth until dissolution, and how the void before birth and that after dissolution are equally infinite. (Med. 9.32; see also 2.17, 5.23, 7.47, 12.32)

In passages such as this Marcus makes implicit reference to a number of Stoic theories. Here, for instance, the Stoic physics of flux inherited from Heraclitus is evoked. Perhaps more important though is the reference to one's judgement and the claim that this is the source of human unhappiness. Following Epictetus, Marcus claims that all attributions of good or evil are the product of human judgements. As Epictetus put it, what upsets people are not things themselves but rather their judgements about things (see Handbook 5). According to Epictetus' epistemological theory (to the extent that it can be reconstructed) the impressions that an individual receives and that appear to reflect the nature of things are in fact already composite. They involve not only a perception of some external object but also an almost involuntary and unconscious judgement about that perception. This judgement will be a product of one's preconceptions and mental habits. It is this composite impression to which an individual grants or denies assent, creating a belief. The task for the philosopher is to subject one's impressions to rigorous examination, making sure that one does not give assent to (i.e. accept as true) impressions that include any unwarranted value judgements.

Marcus' personal reflections in the Meditations may be read as a series of written exercises aimed at analyzing his own impressions and rejecting his own unwarranted value judgements. For instance, he reminds himself:

Do not say more to yourself than the first impressions report. […] Abide always by the first impressions and add nothing of your own from within. (Med. 8.49)

These 'first impressions' are impressions before a value judgement has been made. For Marcus, human well-being or happiness (eudaimonia) is entirely dependent upon correctly examining one's impressions and judgements. For once one has overcome false value-judgements - that wealth and social standing are valuable and that one should compete for them against others, for instance –one will experience the cosmos as a single living being (identified with God) rather than a site of conflict and destruction. As Cicero put it in his summary of Stoic physics:

The various limited modes of being may encounter many external obstacles to hinder their perfect realization, but there can be nothing that can frustrate Nature as a whole, since she embraces and contains within herself all modes of being. (On the Nature of the Gods 2.35)

It is to this end - cultivating an experience of the cosmos as a unified living being identified with God– that the philosophical exercises in the Meditations are directed.

4. Concluding Remarks

From a modern perspective Marcus Aurelius is certainly not in the first rank of ancient philosophers. He is no Plato or Aristotle, nor even a Sextus Empiricus or Alexander of Aphrodisias. To a certain extent this judgement is perfectly fair and reasonable. However, in order to assess the philosophical qualities that Marcus does have and that are displayed in the Meditations it is necessary to emphasize that in antiquity philosophy was not conceived merely as a matter of theoretical arguments. Such arguments existed and were important, but they were framed within a broader conception of philosophy as a way of life. The aim was not merely to gain a rational understanding of the world but to allow that rational understanding to inform the way in which one lived. If one keeps this understanding of 'philosophy' in mind, then one becomes able to appreciate the function and the philosophical value of Marcus' Meditations.

5. References and Further Reading

1. Selected Editions and Translations of the Meditations

  • CROSSLEY, H., The Fourth Book of the Meditations of Marcus Aurelius Antoninus, A Revised Text with Translation and Commentary (London: Macmillan, 1882) - an excellent commentary, sadly of only one book.
  • DALFEN, J., Marci Aurelii Antonini Ad Se Ipsum Libri XII, Bibliotheca Scriptorum Graecorum et Romanorum Teubneriana (Leipzig: Teubner, 1979; 2nd edn 1987) - includes an invaluable word index.
  • FARQUHARSON, A. S. L., The Meditations of the Emperor Marcus Antoninus, Edited with Translation and Commentary, 2 vols (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1944) - arguably the definitive edition and essential for any serious study of the Meditations.
  • FARQUHARSON, A. S. L.,The Meditations of Marcus Aurelius Antoninus, With Introduction and Notes by R. B. Rutherford (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1989) - an edition reprinting only the translation from Farquharson's 1944 edition, but supplemented with a helpful introduction and a selection from the correspondence with Fronto.
  • GATAKER, T., Marci Antonini Imperatoris de rebus suis, sive de eis qae ad se pertinere censebat, Libri XII (Cambridge: Thomas Buck, 1652) - a justly famous early edition of the Meditations containing a substantial commentary.
  • HAINES, C. R., The Communings with Himself of Marcus Aurelius Antoninus, A Revised Text and a Translation into English, The Loeb Classical Library (London: Heinemann, 1916; later reprints by Harvard University Press) - probably the most readily available edition of the Greek text, with a facing English translation. Haines also prepared a two-volume edition of the correspondence with Fronto for the Loeb Classical Library.
  • LEOPOLD, I. H., M. Antoninus Imperator Ad Se Ipsum, Scriptorum Classicorum Bibliotheca Oxoniensis (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1908) - the OCT edition, now out of print.
  • THEILER, W., Kaiser Marc Aurel, Wege Zu Sich Selbst (Zürich: Artemis, 1951) - a widely praised edition of the Greek text, with a facing German translation.

2. Selected Studies

  • AFRICA, T. W., 'The Opium Addiction of Marcus Aurelius', Journal of the History of Ideas 22 (1961), 97-102.
  • ARNOLD, E. V., Roman Stoicism: Being Lectures on the History of the Stoic Philosophy with Special Reference to its Development within the Roman Empire (Cambridge, 1911; repr. London: Routledge & Kegan Paul, 1958)
  • ASMIS, E., 'The Stoicism of Marcus Aurelius', ANRW II 36.3 (1989), pp. 2228-2252.
  • BIRLEY, A. R., Marcus Aurelius: A Biography (London: Batsford, 1966; new edn Routledge 2000)
  • BRUNT, P. A., 'Marcus Aurelius in his Meditations', Journal of Roman Studies 64 (1974), 1-20.
  • CLARKE, M. L., The Roman Mind: Studies in the History of Thought from Cicero to Marcus Aurelius (London: Cohen & West, 1956)
  • HADOT, P., 'Une clé des Pensées de Marc Aurèle: les trois topoi philosophiques selon Épictète', Les Études philosophiques 1 (1978), 65-83.
  • HADOT, P., The Inner Citadel: The Meditations of Marcus Aurelius, trans. M. Chase (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1998); a translation of La Citadelle Intérieure (Paris, 1992)
  • KRAYE, J., 'Ethnicorum omnium sanctissimus: Marcus Aurelius and his Meditations from Xylander to Diderot', in J. Kraye & M. W. F. Stones, eds, Humanism and Early Modern Philosophy (London: Routledge, 2000), pp. 107-134.
  • LONG, A. A., 'Epictetus, Marcus Aurelius', in T. J. Luce, ed., Ancient Writers: Greece and Rome (New York: Scribner's, 1982), pp. 985-1002.
  • MORFORD, M., The Roman Philosophers: From the Time of Cato the Censor to the Death of Marcus Aurelius (London: Routledge, 2002)
  • NEWMAN, R. J., 'Cotidie meditare: Theory and Practice of the meditatio in Imperial Stoicism', ANRW II 36.3 (1989), pp. 1473-1517.
  • RIST, J. M., 'Are You a Stoic? The Case of Marcus Aurelius', in B. F. Meyers & E. P. Sanders, eds, Jewish and Christian Self-Definition 3 (London: SCM, 1982), pp. 23-45.
  • RUTHERFORD, R. B., The Meditations of Marcus Aurelius: A Study (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1989)
  • STANTON, G. R., 'The Cosmopolitan Ideas of Epictetus and Marcus Aurelius', Phronesis 13 (1968), 183-195.
  • WICKHAM LEGG, J., 'A Bibliography of the Thoughts of Marcus Aurelius Antoninus', Transactions of the Bibliographical Society 10 (1908-09, but publ. 1910), 15-81.

Author Information

John Sellars
Email: john.sellars (at) wolfson.ox.ac.uk
University of the West of England
United Kingdom