Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Philosophy of Medicine

While philosophy and medicine, beginning with the ancient Greeks, enjoyed a long history of mutually beneficial interactions, the professionalization of “philosophy of medicine” is a nineteenth century event.  One of the first academic books on the philosophy of medicine in modern terms was Elisha Bartlett’s Essay on the Philosophy of Medical Science, published in 1844.  In the mid to late twentieth century, philosophers and physicians contentiously debated whether philosophy of medicine was a separate discipline distinct from the disciplines of either philosophy or medicine.  The twenty-first century consensus, however, is that it is a distinct discipline with its own set of problems and questions. Professional journals, books series, individual monographs, as well as professional societies and meetings are all devoted to discussing and answering that set of problems and questions.  This article examines—by utilizing a traditional approach to philosophical investigation—all aspects of the philosophy of medicine and the attempts of philosophers to address its unique set of problems and questions.  To that end, the article begins with metaphysical problems and questions facing modern medicine such as reductionism vs. holism, realism vs. antirealism, causation in terms of disease etiology, and notions of disease and health.  The article then proceeds to epistemological problems and questions, especially rationalism vs. empiricism, sound medical thinking and judgments, robust medical explanations, and valid diagnostic and therapeutic knowledge.  Next, it will address the vast array of ethical problems and questions, particularly with respect to principlism and the patient-physician relationship.  The article concludes with a discussion of what constitutes the nature of medical knowledge and practice, in light of recent trends towards both evidence-based and patient-centered medicine.  Finally, even though a vibrant literature on nonwestern traditions is available, this article is concerned only with the western tradition of philosophy of medicine (Kaptchuk, 2000; Lad, 2002; Pole, 2006; Unschuld, 2010).

Table of Contents

  1. Metaphysics
    1. Reductionism vs. Holism
    2. Realism vs. Antirealism
    3. Causation
    4. Disease and Health
  2. Epistemology
    1. Rationalism vs. Empiricism
    2. Medical Thinking
    3. Explanation
    4. Diagnostic and Therapeutic Knowledge
  3. Ethics
    1. Principlism
    2. Patient-Physician Relationship
  4. What is Medicine?
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Metaphysics

Traditionally, metaphysics pertains to the analysis of objects or events and the forces or factors causing or impinging upon them.  One branch of metaphysics, denoted ontology, investigates problems and questions concerning the nature and existence of objects or events and their associated forces or factors.  For philosophy of medicine in the twenty-first century, the two chief objects are the patient’s disease and health, along with the forces or factors responsible for causing them.  “What is/causes health?” or “What is/causes disease?” are contentious questions for philosophers of medicine.  Another branch of metaphysics involves the examination of presuppositions that inform a given ontology.  For philosophy of medicine, the most controversial debate centers around the presuppositions of reductionism and holism.  Questions like “Can a disease be sufficiently reduced to its elemental components?” or “Is the patient more than simply the sum of physical parts?” drive discussion among philosophers of medicine.  In addition, the debate between realism and antirealism has important traction within the field.  This debate centers on questions like, “Are disease-causing entities real?” or “Are these entities socially constructed?”   This section first explores the reductionism-holism and realism-antirealism debates, along with the notion of causation, before turning attention to the notions of disease and health.

a. Reductionism vs. Holism

The reductionism-holism debate enjoys a lively history, especially from the middle to the latter part of the twentieth century.  Reductionism, broadly construed, is the diminution of complex objects or events to their component parts.  In other words, the properties of the whole are simply the addition or summation of the properties of the individual parts.  Such reductionism is often called metaphysical or ontological reductionism to distinguish it from methodological or epistemological reductionism.  Methodological reductionism refers to the investigation of complex objects and events and their associated forces or factors by using technology that isolates and analyzes individual components only.  Epistemological reductionism involves the explanation of complex objects and events and their associated forces or factors in terms of their individual components only.  For the life sciences vis-à-vis reductionism, an organism is made of component parts like bio-macromolecules and cells, whose properties are sufficient for investigating and explaining the organism, if not life itself.  Life scientists often sort these parts into a descending hierarchy. Beginning with the organism,  they proceed downward through organ systems, individual organs, tissues, cells, and macromolecules until reaching the atomic and subatomic levels.  Albert Szent-Gyorgyi once remarked, as he descended this hierarchy in his quest for understanding living organisms, “life slipped between his fingers.”  Holism, however, is the position that the properties of the whole are not reducible to properties of its individual components.  Jan Smuts (1926) introduced the term in the early part of the twentieth century, especially with respect to biological evolution, to account for living processes—without the need for immaterial components.

The relevance of the reductionism-holism debate pertains to both medical knowledge and practice.  Reductionism influences not only how a biomedical scientist investigates and explains disease, but also how a clinician diagnoses and treats it.  For example, if a biomedical researcher believes that the underlying cause of a mental disease is dysfunction in brain processes or mechanisms, especially at the molecular level, then that disease is often investigated exclusively at that level.  In turn, a clinician classifies mental diseases in terms of brain processes or mechanisms at the molecular level, such as depletion in levels of the neurotransmitter serotonin.  Subsequently, the disease is treated pharmacologically by prescribing drugs to elevate the low levels of the neurotransmitter in the depressed brain to levels considered normal within the non-depressed brain.  Although the assumption of reductionism produces a detailed understanding of diseases in molecular or mechanistic terms, many clinicians and patients are dissatisfied with the assumption.  Both clinicians and patients feel that the assumption excludes important information concerning the nature of the disease, as it influences both the patient’s illness and life experience.  Rather than simply treating the disease, such information is vital for treating patients with chronic cases.  In other words, patients often feel as if physicians reduce them to their disease or diseased body part  rather than on the overall illness experience.  The assumption of holism best suits the approach to medical knowledge and practice that includes the patient’s illness experience.  Rather than striving exclusively for restoration of the patient to a pre-diseased state, the clinician assists the patient in redefining what the illness means for their life.  The outcome is not a physical cure necessarily, as it is healing of wholeness from the fragmentation in the patient’s life caused by the illness.

b. Realism vs. Antirealism

Realism is the philosophical notion that observable objects and events are actual objects and events, independent of the person observing them.  In other words, since it exists outside the minds of those observing it, reality does not depend on conceptual structures or linguistic formulations..  Proponents of realism also espouse that even unobservable objects and events, like subatomic particles, exist.  Historically, realists believe that universals—abstractions of objects and events—are separate from the mind cognizing them.  For example, terms like bacteria and cell denote real objects in the natural world, which exist apart from the human minds trying to examine and understand them.  Furthermore, scientific investigations into natural objects like bacteria and cells yield true accounts of these objects.  Anti-realism, on the other hand, is the philosophical notion that observable objects and events are not actual objects and events as observed by a person but rather they are dependent upon the person observing them.  In other words, these objects and events are mind-dependent—not mind-independent.   Anti-realists deny the existence of objects and events apart from the mind cognizing them.  Human minds construct these objects and events based on social or cultural values.  Historically, anti-realists subscribe to nominalism, in which universals do not exist and predicates of particular objects do.  Finally, they question the truth of scientific accounts of the world since no mind-independent framework can be correct absolutely.  Antirealists hold that such truth is framework dependent, so when one changes the framework, truth itself changes.

The debate among realists and anti-realists has important implications for philosophers of medicine, as well as for the practice of clinical medicine.  For example, a contentious issue is whether disease entities or conditions for the expression of a disease are real or not.  Realists argue that such entities or conditions are real and exist independent of medical researchers investigating them, while anti-realists deny their reality and existence.  Take the example of depression.  According to realists, the neurotransmitter serotonin is a real entity that exists in a real brain—apart from clinical investigations or investigators.  A low level of that transmitter is a real condition for the disease’s expression.  For anti-realists, however, serotonin is a laboratory or clinical construct based on experimental or clinical conditions.  Changes in that construct lead to changes in understanding the disease.  The debate is not simply academic but has traction for the clinic.  Clinical realists believe that restoring serotonin levels cures depression.  Clinical anti-realists are less confident about restoring levels of the neurotransmitter to affect a cure.  Rather, they believe that both diagnosis and treatment of depression do not devolve into simplistic measurements of serotonin levels.  Importantly, the anti-realists do not harbor the hope that additional information is likely to remedy the clinical problems associated with serotonin replacement therapy.  The problems are ontological to their core.  The neurotransmitter is a mental construct entirely dependent on efforts to investigate and translate laboratory investigations into clinical practice.

c. Causation

Causation has a long philosophical history, beginning with the ancient Greek philosophers.  Aristotle in particular provided a robust account of causation in terms of material cause, what something is made of; formal cause, how something is made; efficient cause, forces responsible for making something; and, final cause, the purpose for or end to which something is made.  In the modern period, Francis Bacon pruned the four Aristotelian causes to material and efficient causation.  With the rise of British empiricism, especially with David Hume’s philosophical analysis of causation, causation comes under critical scrutiny.  For Hume, in particular, causation is simply the constant conjunction of object and events, with no ontological significance in terms of hooking up the cause with the effect.  According to Hume, society indoctrinates us to assume something real exists between the cause and its effect.  Although Hume’s skepticism of causal forces prevailed in his personal study, it did not prevail in the laboratory.  During the nineteenth century, with the maturation of the scientific revolution, only one cause survived for accounting for natural entities and phenomena—the material cause, which is not strictly Aristotle’s original notion of material causation.  The modern notion involves mechanisms and processes and thereby eliminates efficient causation.  The material cause became the engine driving mechanistic ontology.  During the twentieth century, after the Einsteinian and quantum revolutions, mechanistic ontology gave way to physical ontology that included forces such as gravity as causal entities.  A century later, efficient causation is the purview of philosophers, who argue endlessly about it, while scientists take physical causation as unproblematic in constructing models of natural phenomena based on cause and effect.

For philosophers of medicine, causation is an important notion for analyzing both disease etiology and therapeutic efficacy (Carter, 2003).  At the molecular level, causation operates physico-chemically to investigate and explain disease mechanisms.  In the example of depression, serotonin is a neurotransmitter that binds specific receptors within certain brain locations, which in turn causes a cascade of molecular events in maintaining mental health.  This underlying causal or physical mechanism is critical not only for understanding the disease, but also for treating it.  Medical causation also operates at other levels.  For infectious diseases, the Henle-Koch postulates are important in determining the causal relationship between an infectious microorganism and an infected host (Evans, 1993).  To secure that relationship the microorganism must be associated with every occurrence of the disease, be isolated from the infected host, be grown under in vitro conditions, and be shown to elicit the disease upon infection of a healthy host.  Finally, medical causation operates at the epidemiological or population level.  Here, Austin Bradford Hill’s nine criteria are critical for establishing a causal relationship between environmental factors and disease incidence (Hill, 1965).  For example, the relationship between cigarette smoking and lung cancer involves the strength of the association between smoking and lung cancer, as well as the consistency of that association for the biological mechanisms.  These examples establish the importance of causal mechanisms involved in disease etiology and treatment, especially for diseases with an organic basis; however, some diseases, particularly mental disorders, do not reduce to such readily apparent causality.  Instead, they represent rich areas of investigations for philosophers of medicine.

d. Disease and Health

“What is disease?” is a contentious question among philosophers of medicine.  These philosophers distinguish among four different notions of disease.  The first is an ontological notion.  According to its proponents, disease is a palpable object or entity whose existence is distinct from that of the diseased patient.  For example, disease may be the condition brought on by the infection of a microorganism, such as a virus.  Critics, who champion a physiological notion of disease, argue that advocates of the ontological notion confuse the disease condition, which is an abstract notion, with a concrete entity like a virus.  In other words, proponents of the first notion often combine the disease’s condition and cause.  Supporters of this second notion argue that disease represents a deviation from normal physiological functioning.  The best-known defender of this notion is Christopher Boorse (1987), who defines disease as a value-free statistical norm with respect to “species design.”  Critics who object to this notion, however, cite the ambiguity of the term “norm” in terms of a reference class.  Instead of a statistical norm, evolutionary biologists propose a notion of disease as a maladaptive mechanism, which factors in the organism’s biological history.  Critics of this third notion claim that disease manifests itself, especially clinically, in terms of the individual patient and not a population.  A population may be important to epidemiologists but not to clinicians who must treat individual patients whose manifestation of a disease and response to therapy for that disease may differ from each other significantly.  The final notion of disease addresses this criticism.  The genetic notion claims that disease is the mutation in or absence of a gene.  Its champions assert that each patient’s genomic constitution is unique. By knowing the genomic constitution, clinicians are able to both diagnose the patient’s disease and tailor a specific therapeutic protocol.  Critics of the genetic notion claim that disease, especially its experience, cannot be reduced to nucleotide sequences.  Instead, it requires a larger notion including social and cultural factors.

“What is health?” is an equally contentious question  among philosophers of medicine.   The most common notion of health is simply absence of disease.  Health, according to proponents of this notion, represents a default state as opposed to pathology.  In other words, if an organism is not sick then it must be healthy.  Unfortunately, this notion does not distinguish between various grades of health or preconditions towards illness.  For example, as cells responsible for serotonin stop producing the neurotransmitter a person is prone to depression.  Such a person is not as healthful as a person who is making sufficient amounts of serotonin.  An adequate understanding of health should account for such preconditions.  Moreover, health as absence of disease often depends upon personal and social values of what is health.  Again, ambiguity enters into defining health given these values.  For one person, health might be very different from that of another.  The second notion of health does permit distinction between grades of health, in terms of quantifying it, and does not depend upon personal or social values.  Proponents of this notion, such as Boorse, define health in terms of normal functioning, where the normal reflects a statistical norm with respect to species design.  For example, a person with low levels of serotonin who is not clinically symptomatic in terms of depression is not as healthful as a person with statistically normal neurotransmitter levels.  Criticisms of the second notion revolve around its lack of incorporating the social dimension of health and jettison the notion altogether opting for the notion of wellbeing.  Wellbeing is a normative notion that combines both a person’s values, especially in terms of his or her life goals, and objective physiological states.  Because normative notions contain a person’s value system, they are often difficult to define and defend since values vary from person to person and culture to culture.  Proponents of this notion include Lennart Nordenfelt (1995), Carol Ryff and Burton Singer (1998), Carolyn Whitbeck (1981).

2. Epistemology

Epistemology is the branch of philosophy concerned with the analysis of knowledge, in terms of both its origins and justification.  The overarching question is, “What is knowing or knowledge?”  Subsidiary questions include, “How do we know that we know?”; “Are we certain or confident in our knowing or knowledge?”; “What is it we know when we claim we know?” Philosophers generally distinguish three kinds or theories of knowledge.  The first pertains to knowledge by acquaintance, in which a knowing or an epistemic agent is familiar with an object or event.  It is descriptive in nature, that is, a knowing-about knowledge.  For example, a surgeon is well acquainted with the body’s anatomy before performing an operation.  The second is competence knowledge, which is the species of knowledge useful for performing a task skillfully.  It is performative or procedural in nature, that is, a knowing-how knowledge.  Again, by way of example, the surgeon must know how to perform a specific surgical procedure before executing it.  The third, which interests philosophers most, is propositional knowledge.  It pertains to certain truths or facts.  As such, philosophers traditionally call this species of knowledge, “justified true belief.”  Rather than descriptive or performative in nature, it is explanatory, or a knowing-that knowledge.  Again, by way of illustration, the surgeon must know certain facts or truths about the body’s anatomy, such as the physiological function of the heart, before performing open-heart surgery.  This section begins with the debate between rationalists and empiricists over the origins of knowledge, before turning to medical thinking and explanation and then concluding with the nature of diagnostic and therapeutic knowledge.

a. Rationalism vs. Empiricism

The rationalism-empiricism debate has a long history, beginning with the ancient Greeks, and focuses on the origins of knowledge and its justification.  “Is that origin rational or empirical in nature?”  “Is knowledge deduced or inferred from first principles or premises?”  “Or, is it the result of careful observation and experience?”  These are just a few of the questions fueling the debate, along with similar questions concerning epistemic justification.  Rationalists, such as Socrates,Plato,  Descartes, and Kant, appeal to reason as being both the origin and the justification of knowledge.  As such, knowledge is intuitive in nature, and in contrast to the senses or perception, it is exclusively the product of the mind.  Given the corruptibility of the senses, argue the rationalists, no one can guarantee or warrant knowledge—except through the mind’s capacity to reason.  In other words, rationalism provides a firm foundation not only for the origin of knowledge but also for warranting its truth.    Empiricists, such as Aristotle, Avicenna, Bacon, Locke, Hume, and Mill, avoid the fears of rationalists and exalt observation and experience with respect to the origin and justification of knowledge.  According to empiricists, the mind is a blank slate (Locke’s tabula rasa) upon which observations and experiences inscribe knowledge.  Here, empiricists champion the role of experimentation in the origin and justification of knowledge.

The rationalism-empiricism debate originates specifically with ancient Greek and Roman medicine.  The Dogmatic school of medicine, founded by Hippocrates’ son and son-in-law in the fourth century BCE, claimed that reason is sufficient for understanding the underlying causes of diseases and thereby for treating them.  Dogmatics relied on theory, especially the humoral theory of health and disease, to practice medicine.  The Empiric school of medicine, on the other hand, asserted that only observation and experience, not theory, is a sufficient foundation for medical knowledge and practice.  Theory is an outcome of medical observation and experience, not their foundation.  Empirics relied on palpable, not underlying, causes to explain health and disease and to practice medicine.  Philinus of Cos and his successor Serapion of Alexandria, both third century BCE Greek physicians, are credited with founding the Empiric school, which included the influential Alexandrian school.  A third school of medicine arose in response to the debate between the Dogmatics and Empirics, the Methodic school of medicine.  In contrast to Dogmatics, and in agreement with Empirics, Methodics argued that underlying causes are superfluous to the practice of medicine.  Rather, the patient’s immediate symptoms, along with common sense, are sufficient and provide the necessary information to treat the patient.  Thus, in contrast to Empirics, Methodics argued that experience is unnecessary to treat disease and that the disease’s symptoms provide all the knowledge needed to practice medicine.

The Dogmatism-Empiricism debate, with Methodism representing a minority position, raged on and was still lively in the seventeenth and eighteenth centuries.  For example, Giorgio Baglivi (1723), an Armenian-born seventeenth century Italian physician, decried the polarization of physicians along dogmatic and empiric boundaries and recommended resolving the debate by combining the two.  Contemporary philosophical commentators on medicine recognize the importance of both epistemic positions, and several commentators propose synthesis of them.  For example, Jan van Gijn (2005) advocates an “empirical cycle” in which experiments drive hypothetical thinking, which in turn results in additional experimentation.  Although no clear resolution of the rationalism-empiricism debate in medicine appears on the immediate horizon, the debate does emphasize the importance of and the need for additional philosophical analysis of epistemic issues surrounding medical knowledge.

b. Medical Thinking

“How doctors think” is the title of two  twenty-first century books on medical thinking.  The first is by a medical humanities scholar, Kathryn Montgomery (2006).  Montgomery addresses vital questions about how physicians go about making clinical decisions when often faced with tangible uncertainty.  She argues for medical thinking based not on science but on Aristotelian phronesis, or practical or intuitive reasoning.  The second book is by a practicing clinician, Jerome Groopman (2007).  Groopman also addresses questions about medical thinking, and he too pleads for clinical reasoning based on practical or intuitive foundations.  Both books call for introducing the art of medical thinking to offset the over dependence on the science of medical thinking.  In general, medical thinking reflects the cognitive faculties of clinicians to make rational decisions about what ails patients and how best to go about treating them both safely and effectively.  That thinking, during the twentieth century, mimicked the technical thinking of natural scientists—and, for good reason.  As Paul Meehl (1954) convincingly demonstrated, statistical reasoning in the clinical setting out performs intuitive clinical thinking.  Although Montgomery’s and Groopman’s attempts to swing the pendulum back to the art of medical thinking, the risk of medical errors often associated with such thinking demands clearer analysis of the science of medical thinking.  That analysis centers traditionally on both logical and algorithmic methods of clinical judgment and decision-making, to which the twenty-first century has turned.

Georg Stahl’s De logico medica, published in 1702, is one of the first modern treatises on medical logic.  However, not until the nineteenth century did logic of medicine become an important area of sustained analysis or have an impact on medical knowledge and practice.  For example, Friedrich Oesterlen’s Medical logic, published in English translation in 1855, promoted medical logic not only as a tool for assessing the formal relationship between propositional statements and thereby avoiding clinical error, but also for analyzing the relationship among medical facts and evidence in the generation of medical knowledge.  Oesterlen’s logic of medicine was indebted to the Paris school of clinical medicine, especially Pierre Louis’ numerical method (Morabia, 1996).  Contemporary logic of medicine continues this tradition, especially in terms of statistical analysis of experimental and clinical data.  For example, Edmond Murphy’s The Logic of Medicine (1997) represents an analysis of logical and statistical methods used to evaluate both experimental and clinical evidence.  Specifically, Murphy identifies several “rules of evidence” critical for interpreting such evidence as medical knowledge.  A particularly vigorous debate concerns the role of frequentist vs. Bayesian statistics in determining the statistical significance of data from clinical trials.  The logic of medicine, then, represents an important and a fruitful discipline in which medical scientists and clinical practitioners can detect and avoid errors in the generation and substantiation of medical knowledge and in its application or translation to the clinic.

Philosophers of medicine actively debate the best courses of action for making clinical decisions.  For, clinical judgment is an informal process in which a clinician assesses a patient’s clinical signs and symptoms to come to an accurate judgment about what is ailing the patient. To make such a judgment requires an insight into the intelligibility of the clinical evidence.  The issue for philosophers of medicine is what role intuition should play in clinical judgment when facing thethe ideals of objective scientific reasoning and judgment.  Meehl’s work on clinical judgment, as noted earlier casted suspicion on the effectiveness of intuition in clinical judgment; and yet, some philosophers of medicine champion  the understood dimension in such decision-making.  The debate often reduces to whether clinical judgment is an art or a science; however, some, like Alvan Feinstein (1994), argue for a reconciliatory position between them.  Once a physician comes to a judgment then the physician must make a decision as to how to proceed clinically.  Although clinical decision making, with its algorithmic-like decision trees, is a formal procedure compared to clinical judgment, philosophers of medicine actively argue about the structure of these trees and procedures for generating and manipulating them.  The main issue is how best to define the utility grounding the trees.

c. Explanation

Epistemologists are generally interested in the nature of propositions especially the explanatory power of those justified true beliefs.  To know something truly is to understand and explain the hidden causes behind it.  Explanations operate at a variety of levels.  For example, neuroscientific explanations account for human behavior in terms of the neurological activity while astrological explanations account for such behavior with respect to astronomical activity.  Philosophers, especially philosophers of science, distinguish several kinds of explanations, including the covering law explanation, causal explanation, and inference to the best explanation.  In twenty-first century medicine, explanations are important for understanding disease mechanisms and, in understanding those mechanisms, for developing therapeutic modalities to treat the patient’s disease.  This line of reasoning runs deep in medical history, beginning, as we have seen, with the Dogmatics.  Twenty-first century philosophers of medicine utilize the explanatory schemes developed by philosophers of science to account for medical phenomena.  The Following section will briefly examine each of these explanatory schemes and their relevance for medical explanations.

Carl Hempel and Paul Oppenheim introduced covering law explanation in the late 1940s.  According to Hempel and Oppenheim (1948), explanations function as arguments with the conclusion or explanandum—that which is explained—deduced or induced from premises or explanans—that which does the explaining.  At least one of the explanans must be a scientific law, which can be a mechanistic or statistical law.  Although covering law explanations are useful for those medical phenomena that reduce to mechanistic or statistical laws, such as explaining cardiac output in terms of heart rate and stroke volume, not all such phenomena lend themselves to such reductive explanations.  The next explanatory scheme, causal explanation, attempts to rectify that problem.  Causal explanation relies on the temporal or spatial regularity of phenomena and events and utilizes antecedent causes to explain phenomena and events.  The explanations can be simplistic in nature, with only a few antecedent causes arranged linearly, or very complex, with multiple antecedent causes operating in a matrix of interrelated and integrated interactions.  For example, causal explanations of cancer involve at least six distinct sets of genetic factors controlling cellular phenomena such as cell growth and death, immunological response, and angiogenesis.  Finally, Gilbert Harman articulated the contemporary form of inference to the best explanation, or IBE, in the 1960s.  Harman (1965) proposed that based on the totality of evidence one must choose the explanation that best accounts for or infers that evidence and reject its competitors.  The criteria for “bestness” range from the explanation’s simplicity to its generality or consilience to account for analogous phenomena.  Peter Lipton (2004) offers Ignaz Semmelweis’ explanation of increased mortality of women giving birth in one ward compared to another, as an example of IBE.  Donald Gillies (2005) provides an analysis of it in terms of Kuhnian paradigm.

d. Diagnostic and Therapeutic Knowledge

Diagnostic knowledge pertains to the clinical judgments and decisions made about what ails a patient.  Epistemologically, the issues concerned with such knowledge are its accuracy and certainty.  Central to both these concerns are clinical symptoms and signs.  Clinical symptoms are subjective manifestations of the disease that the patient articulates during the medical interview, while clinical signs are objective manifestations that the physician discovers during the physical examine.  What is important for the clinician is how best to quantify those signs and symptoms, and then to classify them in a robust nosology or disease taxonomy.  The clinical strategy is to collect the empirical data through the physical examination and laboratory tests, to deliberate on that data, and then to draw a conclusion as to what the data means in terms of the patient’s disease condition.  The strategy is fraught with questions for philosophers of medicine, from “What constitutes symptoms and signs and how they differ?” to “How best to measure and quantify the signs and to classify the diseases?”  Philosophers of medicine debate the answers to these questions, but the discussion among philosophers of science over the strategy by which natural scientists investigate the natural world guides much of the debate.  Thus, a clinician generates hypotheses about a patient’s disease condition, which he or she then assesses by conducting further medical tests.  The result of this process is a differential diagnosis, which represents a set of hypothetical explanations for the patient’s disease condition.  The clinician then narrows this set to one diagnostic hypothesis that best explains most, and hopefully all, of the relevant clinical evidence.  The epistemic mechanism that accounts for this process and the factors involved in it are unclear.  Philosophers of medicine especially dispute the role of tacit factors in the process.  Finally, the heuristics of the process are an active area of philosophical investigation in terms of identifying rules for interpreting clinical evidence and observations.

Therapeutic knowledge refers to the procedures and modalities used to treat patients.  Epistemologically, the issues concerned with such knowledge are its efficacy and safety.  Efficacy refers to how well the pharmacological drug or surgical procedure treats or cures the disease, while safety refers to possible patient harm caused by side effects.  The questions animating discussion among philosophers of medicine range from “What is a cure?” to “How to establish or justify the efficacy of a drug or procedure?” The latter question occupies a considerable amount of the philosophy of medicine literature, especially the nature and role of clinical trials.  Although basic medical research into the etiology of disease mechanisms is important, the translation of that research and the philosophical problems that arise from it are foremost on the agenda for philosophers of medicine.  The origin of clinical trials dates at least to the eighteenth century but not until the twentieth century is consensus reached over the structure of these trials.  Today, four phases define a clinical trial.  During the first phase, clinical investigators establish the maximum tolerance of healthy volunteers to a drug.  The next phase involves a small patient population to determine the drug’s efficacy and safety.  In the third phase, which is the final phase required to obtain FDA approval, clinical investigators utilize a large and relatively diverse patient population to establish the drug’s efficacy and safety.  A fourth stage is possible in which clinical investigators chart the course of the drug’s use and effectiveness in a diverse patient population over a longer period.  The following are topics of active discussion among philosophers of medicine: The nature of clinical trials with respect to features like randomizing in which test subjects are arbitrarily assigned to either experimental or control groups, blinding of patients and physicians to randomizing to remove assessment bias, concurrent control in which the control group does not receive the experimental treatment that the test group receives, and the role of the placebo effect or the expected benefit patient’s anticipate from receiving treatment represent.  However, the most pressing problem is the type of statistics utilized for analyzing clinical trial evidence.   Some philosophers of medicine champion frequentist statistics, while others Bayesian statistics.

3. Ethics

Ethics is the branch of philosophy concerned with the right or moral conduct or behavior of a community and its members.  Traditionally, philosophers divide ethics into descriptive, normative, and applied ethics.  Descriptive ethics involves detailing ethical conduct without evaluating it in terms of moral codes of conduct, whereas normative ethics pertains to how a community and its members should act under given situations, generally in terms of an ethical code.  This code is often a product of certain values held in common within a community.  For example, ethical codes against murder reflect values community members place upon taking human life without just cause.  Besides values, ethicists base normative ethics on a particular theoretical perspective.  Within western culture, three such perspectives predominate.  The first and historically oldest ethical theory—although it experienced a Renaissance in the late twentieth century—is virtue ethics.  Virtue ethics claims that ethical conduct is the product of a moral agent who possesses certain virtues, such as prudence, courage, temperance, or justice—the traditional cardinal virtues.  The second ethical theory is deontology and bases moral conduct on adherence to ethical precepts and rules reflecting moral duties and obligations.  The third ethical theory is consequentialism, which founds moral conduct on the outcome or consequence of an action.  The chief example of this theory is utilitarianism, or the maximization of an action’s utility, which claims that an action is moral if it realizes the greatest amount of happiness for the greatest number of community members.   Finally, applied ethics is the practical use of ethics within a profession such as business or medicine.  Medical or biomedical ethics reflects applied ethics and is a major feature within the landscape of twenty-first century medicine.  Historically, ethical issues are a conspicuous component of medicine beginning with Hippocrates.  Throughout medical history several important treatises on medical ethics have been published.  Probably the best-known example is Thomas Percival’s Medical Ethics, published in 1803, which influenced the development of the American Medical Association’s ethical code.  Today, medical ethics is founded not on any particular ethical theory but on four ethical principles.

a. Principlism

The origins of the predominant system for contemporary medical or biomedical ethics began in 1932.  In that year, the Public Health Service, in conjunction with the Tuskegee Institute in Macon County, Alabama, undertook a clinical study to document the course of syphilis on untreated test subjects.  The subjects were Afro-American males.  Over the next forty years, healthcare professionals observed the course of the disease, even after the introduction of antibiotics.  Not until 1972, did the study end and only after public outcry from newspaper articles—especially an article in the New York Times—reporting the study’s atrocities.  What made the study so atrocious was that the healthcare professionals misinformed the subjects about treatment or failed to treat the subjects with antibiotics.  To insure that such flagrant abuse of test subjects did not happen again, the National Commission for the Protection of Human Subjects of Biomedical and Behavioral Research met from February 13-16, 1976.  At the Smithsonian Institute’s Belmont Conference Center in Maryland, the commission drafted guidelines for the treatment of research subjects.  The outcome was a report entitled, Ethical Principles and Guidelines for the Protection of Human Subjects of Research, or known simply as the Belmont Report, published in 1979.  The report lists and discusses several ethical principles necessary for protecting human test subjects and patients from unethical treatment at the hands of healthcare researchers and providers.  The first is respect for persons, in that researchers must respect the test subject’s autonomy to make informed decisions based on accurate and truthful information concerning the test study’s procedures and risks.  The next principle is beneficence or maximizing the benefits to risk ratio for the test subject.  The final ethical principle is justice, which ensures that the cost to benefit ratio is equitably distributed among the general population and that no one segment of it bears an unreasonable burden with respect to the ratio.

One of the framers of the Belmont Report was a young philosopher named Tom Beauchamp.  While working on the report, Beauchamp, in collaboration with a colleague, James Childress, was also writing a book on the role of ethical principles in guiding medical practice.  Rather than ground biomedical ethics on any particular ethical theory, such as deontology or utilitarianism, Beauchamp and Childress looked to ethical principles for guiding and evaluating moral decisions and judgments in healthcare.  The fruit of their collaboration was Principles of Biomedical Ethics, first published in the same year as the Belmont Report, 1979.  In the book, Beauchamp and Childress apply the ethical principles approach of the report to regulate the activities of biomedical researchers, to assist physicians in deliberating over the ethical issues associated with the practice of clinical medicine.  However, besides the three guiding principles of the report, they added a fourth—nonmaleficence.  Moreover, the first principle became patient autonomy, rather than respect of persons as denoted in the report.  For the autonomy principle, Beauchamp and Childress stress the patient’s liberty to make critical decisions concerning treatment options, which have a direct impact on the patient’s own values and life plans.  The authors’ second principle, nonmaleficence, instructs the healthcare provider to avoid doing harm to the patient, while the next principle of beneficence emphasizes removing harm and doing good to the patient.  Beauchamp and Childress articulate the final principle, justice, in terms reminiscent of the Belmont report with respect to equitable distribution of risks and benefits, as well as healthcare resources, among both the general and patient populations.  The bioethical community quickly dubbed  the Beauchamp and Childress approach to biomedical ethics as principlism.

Principlism’s impact on the bioethical discipline is unparalleled.  Beauchamp and Childress’ book is now in its fifth edition and is a standard textbook for teaching biomedical ethics at medical schools and graduate programs in medical ethics.  One of the chief advocates of principlism is Raanan Gillon (1986)  Gillon expanded the scope of the principles to aid in their application to difficult bioethical issues, especially where the principles might conflict with one another.  However, principlism is not without its critics.  A fundamental complaint is the lack of theoretical support for the four principles, especially when the principles collide with one another in terms of their application to a bioethical problem. In its use, ethicists and clinicians generally apply the principles in an algorithmic manner to justify practically any ethical position on a biomedical problem.  What critics want is a unified theoretical basis for grounding the principles, in order to avoid or adjudicate conflicts among the principles.  Moreover, Beauchamp and Childress’ emphasis on patient autonomy had serious ramifications on the physician’s role in medical care, with that role at times marginalized to the patient’s role.  Alfred Tauber (2005), for instance, charges that such autonomy itself is “sick” and often results in patients abandoned to their own resources with detrimental outcomes for them.  In response to their critics, Beauchamp and Childress argue that no single ethical theory is available to unite the four principles to avoid or adjudicate conflicts among them.  However, they did introduce in the fourth edition of Principles, a notion of common morality—a set of shared moral standards—to provide theoretical support for the principles.  Unfortunately, their notion of common morality lacks the necessary theoretical robustness to unify the principles effectively.  Although principlism still serves a useful function in biomedical ethics, particularly in the clinic, early twenty-first century trends towards healthcare ethics and global bioethics have made its future unclear.

b. Patient-Physician Relationship

According to many philosophers of medicine, medicine is more than simply a natural or social science; it is a moral enterprise.  What makes medicine moral is the patient-physician or therapeutic relationship.  Although some philosophers of medicine criticize efforts to model the relationship, given the sheer number of contemporary models proposed to account for it, modeling the relationship has important ramifications for understanding and framing the moral demands of medicine and healthcare.  The traditional medical model within the industrialized West, especially in mid twentieth century America, was paternalism or “doctor knows best.”  The paternalistic model is doctor-centered in terms of power distribution, with the patient representing a passive agent who simply follows the doctor’s orders.  The patient is not to question those orders, unless to clarify them.  The source for this power distribution is the doctor’s extensive medical education and training relative to the patient’s lack of medical knowledge.  In this model, the doctor represents a parent, generally a father figure and the patient a child—especially a sick child.  The motivation of this model is to relieve a patient burdened with suffering from a disease, to benefit the patient from the doctor’s medical knowledge, and to affect a cure while returning the patient to health.  In other words, the model’s guiding principle is beneficence.  Besides the paternalistic model, other doctor-centered models include the priestly and mechanic models.  However, the paternalistic model, as well as the other doctor-centered models, ran into severe criticism with abuses associated with the models and with the rise of patient advocacy groups to correct the abuses.

Within the latter part of the twentieth century and the rise of patient autonomy as a guiding principle for medical practice, alternative patient-physician models challenged traditional medical paternalism.  Instead of doctor-centered, one set of models are patient-centered in which patients are the locus of power.  The most predominant patient-centered model is the business model, where the physician is a healthcare provider and the patient a consumer of healthcare goods and services.  The business model is an exchange relationship and relies heavily on a free market system.  Thus, the patient possesses the power to pick and choose among physicians until a suitable healthcare provider is found.  The legal model is another patient-centered model, in which the patient is a client and the guiding forces are patient autonomy and justice.  Patient and physician enter into a contract for healthcare services.  Another set of models in which patients have significant power in the therapeutic relationship are the mutual models.  In these models, neither patients nor physicians have the upper hand in terms of power-they share it.  The most predominant model is the partnership model in which patient and physician are associates in the therapeutic relationship.  The guiding force of this model is informed consent in which the physician apprises the patient of the available therapeutic options and the patient then chooses which is best.  Both the patient and physician share decision making over the best means for affecting a cure.  Finally, other examples of mutual models include the covenant model, which stresses promise instead of contract; the friendship model, which involves a familial-like relationship; and, the neighbor model, which maintains a “safe” distance and yet familiarity between patient and physician.

4. What is Medicine?

The nature of medicine is certainly an important question facing twenty-first century philosophers of medicine.  One reason for its importance is that the question addresses the vital topic of how physicians should practice medicine.  During the turn of the twenty-first century, clinicians and other medical pundits have begun to accept evidence-based medicine, or EBM, as the best way to practice medicine.  Proponents of EBM claim that physicians should engage in medical practices based on the best scientific and clinical evidence available, especially from randomized controlled clinical trials, systematic observations, and meta-analyses of that evidence, rather than on pathophysiology or an individual physician’s clinical experience. Proponents also claim that EBM represents a paradigmatic shift away from traditional medicine.  Traditional practitioners doubt the radical claims of EBM proponents.  One specific objection is that application of evidence from population based clinical trials to the individual patient within the clinic is not as easy to accomplish as EBM proponents realize.  In response, some clinicians propose patient-centered medicine (PCM).   Patient-centered advocates include the patient’s personal information in order to apply the best available scientific and clinical evidence in treatment.  The focus then shifts from the patience’s disease to the patience’s illness experience.  The key for the practice of patient-centered medicine is a physician’s effective communication with the patient.  While some commentators present EBM and PCM as competitors, others propose a combination or integration of the two medicines.  The debate between advocates of EBM and PCM is reminiscent of an earlier debate between the science and art of medicine and belies a deep anxiety over the nature of medicine.  Certainly, philosophers of medicine can play a strategic role in the debate and assist towards its satisfactory resolution.

Besides its nature,  twenty-first century medicine also faces a number of crises, including economic, malpractice, healthcare insurance, healthcare policy, professionalism, public or global health, quality-of-care, primary or general care, and critical care—to name a few (Daschle, 2008; Relman, 2007).  Philosophers of medicine can certainly contribute to the resolution of these crises by carefully and insightfully analyzing the issues associated with them.  For example, considerable attention has been paid in the literature to the crisis over the nature of medical professionalism (Project of the ABIM Foundation, et al., 2002; Tallis, 2006).  The question that fuels this crisis is what type of physician best meets the patient’s healthcare needs and satisfies medicine’s social contract.  The answer to this question involves the physician’s professional demeanor or character.  However, little consensus as to how best to define professionalism is palpable in the literature.  Philosophers of medicine can aid by furnishing guidance towards a consensus on the nature of medical professionalism.

Philosophy of medicine is a vibrant field of exploration into the world of medicine in particular, and of healthcare in general.  Along traditional lines of metaphysics, epistemology, and ethics, a cadre of questions and problems face philosophers of medicine and cry out for attention and resolution.  In addition, many competing forces are vying for the soul of medicine today.  Philosophy of medicine is an important resource for reflecting on those forces in order to forge a medicine that meets both physical and existence needs of patients and society.

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Author Information

James A. Marcum
Baylor University
U. S. A.

Last updated: January 7, 2012 | Originally published: