Better known in China as “Master Meng” (Chinese: Mengzi), Mencius was a fourth-century BCE Chinese thinker whose importance in the Confucian tradition is second only to that of Confucius himself. In many ways, he played the role of St. Paul to Confucius’ Jesus, interpreting the thought of the master for subsequent ages while simultaneously impressing Confucius’ ideas with his own philosophical stamp. He is most famous for his theory of human nature, according to which all human beings share an innate goodness that either can be cultivated through education and self-discipline or squandered through neglect and negative influences, but never lost altogether. While it is not clear that Mencius’ views prevailed in early Chinese philosophical circles, they eventually won out after gaining the support of influential medieval commentators and thinkers such as Zhu Xi (Chu Hsi, 1130-1200 CE) and Wang Yangming (1472-1529 CE). (See Romanization systems for Chinese terms.) Today contemporary philosophical interest in evolutionary psychology and sociobiology has inspired fresh appraisals of Mencius, while recent philological studies question the coherence and authenticity of the text that bears his name. Mencius remains a perennially attractive figure for those intrigued by moral psychology, of which he was the foremost practitioner in early China.
Like the historical Confucius, the historical Mencius is available only through a text that, in its complete form at least, postdates his traditional lifetime (372-289 BCE). The philological controversy surrounding the date and composition of the text that bears his name is far less intense than that which surrounds the Confucian Analects, however. Most scholars agree that the entire Mencius was assembled by Mencius himself and his immediate disciples, perhaps shortly after his death. The text records several encounters with various rulers during Mencius’ old age, which can be dated between 323 and 314 BCE, making Mencius an active figure no later than the late fourth century BCE.
The other major source of information about Mencius’ life is the biography found in the Shiji (Records of the Grand Historian) of Sima Qian (c. 145-90 BCE), which states that he was a native of Zou (Tsou), a small state near Confucius’ home state of Lu in the Shandong peninsula of northeastern China. He is said to have studied with Confucius’ grandson, Zisi (Tzu-ssu), although most modern scholars doubt this. He also is thought to have become a minister of the state of Qi (Ch’i), which also was famous as the home of the Jixia (Chi-hsia) Academy. The Jixia Academy was a kind of early Chinese “think tank” sponsored the ruler of Qi that produced, among other thinkers, Mencius’ later opponent Xunzi (Hsun-tzu, 310-220 BCE).
Mencius was born in a period of Chinese history known as the Warring States (403-221 BCE), during which various states competed violently against one another for mastery of all of China, which once was unified under the Zhou dynasty until its collapse, for all intents and purposes, in 771 BCE. It was a brutal and turbulent era, which nonetheless gave rise to many brilliant philosophical movements, including the Confucian tradition of which Mencius was a foremost representative. The common intellectual and political problem that Warring States thinkers hoped to solve was the problem of China’s unification. While no early Chinese thinker questioned the need for autocratic rule as an instrument of unification, philosophers differed on whether and how the ruler ought to consider moral limitations on power, traditional religious ceremonies and obligations, and the welfare of his subjects.
Into the philosophical gap created by a lack of political unity and increasing social mobility stepped members of the shi (“retainer” or “knight”) class, from which both Confucius and Mencius arose. As feudal lords were defeated and disenfranchised in battle and the kings of the various warring states began to rely on appointed administrators rather than vassals to govern their territories, these shi became lordless anachronisms and fell into genteel poverty and itinerancy. Their knowledge of aristocratic traditions, however, helped them remain valuable to competing kings, who wished to learn how to regain the unity imposed by the Zhou and who sought to emulate the Zhou by patterning court rituals and other institutions after those of the fallen dynasty.
Thus, a new role for shi as itinerant antiquarians emerged. In such roles, shi found themselves in and out of office as the fortunes of various patron states ebbed and flowed. Mencius’ office in the state of Qi probably was no more than an honorary title. While out of office, veteran shi might gather small circles of disciples – young men from shi backgrounds who wished to succeed in public life – and seek audiences with rulers who might give them an opportunity to put their ideas into practice. The text of the Mencius claims to record Mencius’ teachings to his disciples as well as his dialogues with the philosophers and rulers of his day.
Mencius inherits from Confucius a set of terms and a series of problems. In general, one can say that where Confucius saw a unity of inner and outer – in terms of li (ritual propriety), ren (co-humanity), and the junzi (profound person)-xiaoren (small person) distinction – Mencius tends to privilege the inner aspects of concepts, practices, and identities. For Mencius, the locus of philosophical activity and self-cultivation is the xin (hsin), a term that denotes both the chief organ of the circulatory system and the organ of thought, and hence is translated here and in many other sources as “heart-mind.” Mencius’ views of the divine, political organization, human nature, and the path toward personal development all start and end in the heart-mind.
Mencius’ philosophical concerns, while scattered across the seven books of the text that bears his name, demonstrate a high degree of consistency unusual in early Chinese philosophical writing. They can be categorized into four groups:
Again, as with Confucius, so too with Mencius. From late Zhou tradition, Mencius inherited a great many religious sensibilities, including theistic ones. For the early Chinese (c. 16th century BCE), the world was controlled by an all-powerful deity, “The Lord on High” (Shangdi), to whom entreaties were made in the first known Chinese texts, inscriptions found on animal bones offered in divinatory sacrifice. As the Zhou polity emerged and triumphed over the previous Shang tribal rule, Zhou apologists began to regard their deity, Tian (“Sky” or “Heaven”) as synonymous with Shangdi, the deity of the deposed Shang kings, and explained the decline of Shang and the rise of Zhou as a consequence of a change in Tianming (“the mandate of Heaven”). Thus, theistic justifications for conquest and rulership were present very early in Chinese history.
By the time of Mencius, the concept of Tian appears to have changed slightly, taking on aspects of “fate” and “nature” as well as “deity.” For Confucius, Tian provided personal support and sanction for his sense of historical mission, while at the same time prompting Job-like anxiety during moments of ill fortune in which Tian seemed to have abandoned him. Mencius’ faith in Tian as the ultimate source of legitimate moral and political authority is unshakeable. Like Confucius, he says that “Tian does not speak – it simply reveals through deeds and affairs” (5A5). He ascribes the virtues of ren (co-humanity), yi (rightness), li (ritual propriety), zhi (wisdom), and sheng (sagehood) to Tian (7B24) and explicitly compares the rule of the moral king to the rule of Tian (5A4).
Mencius thus shares with Confucius three assumptions about Tian as an extrahuman, absolute power in the universe: (1) its alignment with moral goodness, (2) its dependence on human agents to actualize its will, and (3) the variable, unpredictable nature of its associations with mortal actors. To the extent that Mencius is concerned with justifying the ways of Tian to humanity, he tends to do so without questioning these three assumptions about the nature of Tian, which are rooted deep in the Chinese past, as his views on government, human nature, and self-cultivation will show.
The dependence of Tian upon human agents to put its will into practice helps account for the emphasis Mencius places on the satisfaction of the people as an indicator of the ruler’s moral right to power, and on the responsibility of morally-minded ministers to depose an unworthy ruler. In a dialogue with King Xuan of Qi (r. 319-301 BCE), Mencius says:
The people are to be valued most, the altars of the grain and the land [traditional symbols of the vitality of the state] next, the ruler least. Hence winning the favor of the common people you become Emperor…. (7B14)
When the ruler makes a serious mistake they admonish. If after repeated admonishments he still will not listen, they depose him…. Do not think it strange, Your Majesty. Your Majesty asked his servant a question, and his servant dares not fail to answer it directly. (5B9)
Mencius’ replies to King Xuan are bracingly direct, in fact, but he can be coy. When the king asks whether it is true that various sage kings (Tang and Wu) rebelled against and murdered their predecessors (Jie and Zhou), Mencius answers that it is true. The king then asks:
“Is it permissible for a vassal to murder his lord?”
Mencius replied, “One who robs co-humanity [ren] you call a `robber’; one who robs the right [yi] you call a `wrecker’; and one who robs and wrecks you call an `outlaw.’ I have heard that [Wu] punished the outlaw Zhou – I have not heard that he murdered his lord. (1B8)
In other words, Wu was morally justified in executing Zhou, because Zhou had proven himself to be unworthy of the throne through his offenses against ren and yi – the very qualities associated with the Confucian exemplar (junzi) and his actions. This is an example of Mencius engaging in the “rectification of names” (zhengming), an exercise that Confucius considered to be prior to all other philosophical activity (Analects 13.3).
While Mencius endorses a “right of revolution,” he is no democrat. His ideal ruler is the sage-king, such as the legendary Shun, on whose reign both divine sanction and popular approval conferred legitimacy:
When he was put in charge of sacrifices, the hundred gods delighted in them which is Heaven accepting him. When he was put in charge of affairs, the affairs were in order and the people satisfied with him, which is the people accepting him. Heaven gave it [the state] to him; human beings gave it to him. (5A5)
Mencius proposes various economic plans to his monarchical audiences, but while he insists on particular strategies (such as dividing the land into five-acre settlements planted with mulberry trees), he rejects the notion that one should commit to an action primarily on the grounds that it will benefit one, the state, or anything else. What matters about actions is whether they are moral or not; the question of their benefit or cost is beside the point. Here, Mencius reveals his antipathy for – and competition with – philosophers who followed Mozi, a fifth-century BCE contemporary of Confucius who propounded a utilitarian theory of value based on li (benefit):
Why must Your Majesty say “benefit” [li]? I have only the co-humane [ren] and the right [yi]. (1A1)
In the end, Mencius is committed to a type of benevolent dictatorship, which puts moral value before pragmatic value and in this way seeks to benefit both ruler and subjects. The sage-kings of antiquity are a model, but one cannot simply adopt their customs and institutions and expect to govern effectively (4A1). Instead, one must emulate the sage-kings both in terms of outer structures (good laws, wise policies, correct rituals) and in terms of inner motivations (placing ren and yi first). Like Confucius, Mencius places an enormous amount of confidence in the capacity of the ordinary person to respond to an extraordinary ruler, so as to put the world in order. The question is, how does Mencius account for this optimism in light of human nature?
Mencius is famous for claiming that human nature (renxing) is good. As with most reductions of philosophical positions to bumper-sticker slogans, this statement oversimplifies Mencius’ position. In the text, Mencius takes a more careful route in order to arrive at this view. Following A. C. Graham, one can see his argument as having three elements: (1) a teleology, (2) a virtue theory, and (3) a moral psychology.
Mencius’ basic assertion is that “everyone has a heart-mind which feels for others.” (2A6) As evidence, he makes two appeals: to experience, and to reason. Appealing to experience, he says:
Supposing people see a child fall into a well – they all have a heart-mind that is shocked and sympathetic. It is not for the sake of being on good terms with the child’s parents, and it is not for the sake of winning praise for neighbors and friends, nor is it because they dislike the child’s noisy cry. (2A6)
It is important to point out here that Mencius says nothing about acting on this automatic affective-cognitive response to suffering that he ascribes to the bystanders at the well tragedy. It is merely the feeling that counts. Going further and appealing to reason, Mencius argues:
Judging by this, without a heart-mind that sympathizes one is not human; without a heart-mind aware of shame, one is not human; without a heart-mind that defers to others, one is not human; and without a heart-mind that approves and condemns, one is not human. (2A6)
Thus, Mencius makes an assertion about human beings – all have a heart-mind that feels for others – and qualifies his assertion with appeals to common experience and logical argument. This does little to distinguish him from other early Chinese thinkers, who also noticed that human beings were capable of altruism as well as selfishness. What remains is for him to explain why other thinkers are incorrect when they ascribe positive evil to human nature – that human beings are such that they actively seek to do wrong.
Mencius goes further and identifies the four basic qualities of the heart-mind (sympathy, shame, deference, judgment) not only as distinguishing characteristics of human beings – what makes the human being qua human being really human – but also as the “sprouts” (duan) of the four cardinal virtues:
A heart-mind that sympathizes is the sprout of co-humanity [ren]; a heart-mind that is aware of shame is the sprout of rightness [yi]; a heart-mind that defers to others is the sprout of ritual propriety [li]; a heart-mind that approves and condemns is the sprout of wisdom [zhi]…. If anyone having the four sprouts within himself knows how to develop them to the full, it is like fire catching alight, or a spring as it first bursts through. If able to develop them, he is able to protect the entire world; if unable, he is unable to serve even his parents. (2A6)
Now the complexity of Mencius’ seemingly simplistic position becomes clearer. What makes us human is our feelings of commiseration for others’ suffering; what makes us virtuous – or, in Confucian parlance, junzi – is our development of this inner potential. To paraphrase Irene Bloom on this point, there is no sharp conflict between “nature” and “nurture” in Mencius; biology and culture are co-dependent upon one another in the development of the virtues. If our sprouts are left untended, we can be no more than merely human – feeling sorrow at the suffering of another, but unable or unwilling to do anything about it. If we tend our sprouts assiduously — through education in the classical texts, formation by ritual propriety, fulfillment of social norms, etc. – we can not only avert the suffering of a few children in some wells, but also bring about peace and justice in the entire world. This is the basis of Mencius’ appeal to King Hui of Liang (r. 370-319 BCE):
[The king] asked abruptly, “How shall the world be settled?”
“It will be settled by unification,” I [Mencius] answered.
“Who will be able to unify it?”
“Someone without a taste for killing will be able to unify it…. Has Your Majesty noticed rice shoots? If there is drought during the seventh and eighth months, the shoots wither, but if dense clouds gather in the sky and a torrent of rain falls, the shoots suddenly revive. When that happens, who could stop it? … Should there be one without a taste for killing, the people will crane their necks looking out for him. If that does happen, the people will go over to him as water tends downwards, in a torrent – who could stop it? (1A6)
Mencius devotes some energy to arguing that “rightness” (yi) is internal, rather than external, to human beings. He does so using examples taken from that quintessentially Confucian arena of human relations, filial piety (xiao). Comparing the rightness that manifests itself in filial piety to such visceral activities as eating, drinking, and sexual intercourse, Mencius points out that, just as one’s attraction or repulsion regarding these activities is determined by one’s internal orientation (hunger, thirst, lust), one’s filial behavior is determined by one’s inner attitudes, as the following imaginary dialogue with one of his opponents shows:
[Ask the opponent] “Which do you respect, your uncle or your younger brother?” He will say, “My uncle.” “When your younger brother is impersonating an ancestor at a sacrifice, then which do you respect?” He will say, “My younger brother.” You ask him, “What has happened to your respect for your uncle?” He will say, “It is because of the position my younger brother occupies.” (6A5)
In other words, the rightness that one manifests in filial piety is not dependent on fixed, external categories, such as the status of one’s younger brother qua younger brother or one’s uncle qua one’s uncle. If it were, one always would show respect to one’s uncle and never to one’s younger brother or anyone else junior to oneself. But as it happens, shifts in external circumstances can effect changes in status; one’s younger brother can temporarily assume the status of a very senior ancestor in the proper ritual context, thus earning the respect ordinarily given to seniors and never shown to juniors. For Mencius, this demonstrates that the internal orientation of the agent (e.g., rightness) determines the moral value of given behaviors (e.g., filial piety).
Having made a teleological argument from the inborn potential of human beings to the presumption of virtues that can be developed, Mencius then offers his sketch of moral psychology – the structures within the human person that make such potential identifiable and such development possible.
The primary function of Mencius’ moral psychology is to explain how moral failure is possible and how it can be avoided. As Antonio S. Cua has noted, for Mencius, moral failure is the failure to develop one’s xin (heart-mind). In order to account for the moral mechanics of the xin, Mencius offers a quasi-physiological theory involving qi (vital energy) – “a hard thing to speak about” (2A2), part vapor, part fluid, found in the atmosphere and in the human body, that regulates affective-cognitive processes as well as one’s general well-being. It is especially abundant outdoors at night and in the early morning, which is why taking fresh air at these times can act as a physical and spiritual tonic (6A8). When Mencius is asked about his personal strengths, he says:
I know how to speak, and I am good at nourishing my flood-like qi. (2A2)
It is interesting to note the apparent link between powers of suasion – essential for any itinerant Warring States shi, whether official or teacher – and “flood-like qi.” The goal of Mencian self-cultivation is to bring one’s qi, xin, and yan (words) together in a seamless blend of rightness (yi) and ritual propriety (li). Mencius goes on to describe what he means by “flood-like qi“:
It is the sort of qi that is utmost in vastness, utmost in firmness. If, by uprightness, you nourish it and do not interfere with it, it fills the space between Heaven and Earth. It is the sort of qi that matches the right [yi] with the Way [Dao]; without these, it starves. It is generated by the accumulation of right [yi] – one cannot attain it by sporadic righteousness. If anything one does fails to meet the standards of one’s heart-mind, it starves. (2A2)
It is here that Mencius is at his most mystical, and recent scholarship has suggested that he and his disciples may have practiced a form of meditative discipline akin to yoga. Certainly, similar-sounding spiritual exercises are described in other early Chinese texts, such as the Neiye (“Inner Training”) chapter of the Guanzi (Kuan-tzu, c. 4th-2nd centuries BCE). It also is at this point that Mencius seems to depart most radically from what is known about the historical Confucius’ teachings. While faint glimpses of what may be ascetic and meditative disciplines sometimes appear in the Analects, nowhere in the text are there detailed discussions of nurturing one’s qi such as can be found in Mencius 2A2.
In spite of the mystical tone of this passage, however, all that the text really says is that qi can be nurtured through regular acts of “rightness” (yi). It goes on to say that qi flows from one’s xin (2A2), that one’s xin must undergo great discipline in order to produce “flood-like qi” (6B15), and that a well-developed xin will manifest itself in radiance that shines from one’s qi into one’s face and general appearance (7A21). In short, here is where Mencius’ case for human nature seems to leave philosophy and reasoned argumentation behind and step into the world of ineffability and religious experience. There is no reason, of course, why Mencius shouldn’t take this step; as Alan K. L. Chan has pointed out, ethics and spirituality are not mutually exclusive, either in the Mencius or elsewhere.
To sum up, both biology and culture are important for Mencian self-cultivation, and so is Tian. “By fully developing one’s heart-mind, one knows one’s nature, and by knowing one’s nature, one knows Heaven.” (7A1) One cannot help but begin with “a heart-mind that feels for others,” but the journey toward full humanity is hardly complete without having taken any steps beyond one’s birth. Guided by the examples of ancient sages and the ritual forms and texts they have left behind, one starts to develop one’s heart-mind further by nurturing its qi through habitually doing what is right, cultivating its “sprouts” into virtues, and bringing oneself up and out from the merely human to that which Tian intends for one, which is to become a sage. Nature is crucial, but so is nurture. Mencius’ model of moral psychology is both a “discovery” model (human nature is good) and a “development” model (human nature can be made even better):
A person’s surroundings transform his qi just as the food he eats changes his body. (7A36)
Detailed discussion of Mencius’ key interpreters is best reserved for an article on Confucian philosophy. Nonetheless, an outline of the most important commentators and their philosophical trajectories is worth including here.
The two best known early interpreters of Mencius’ thought – besides the compilers of the Mencius themselves – are the Warring States philosophers Gaozi (Kao-tzu, 300s BCE) and Xunzi (Hsun-tzu, 310-220 BCE). Gaozi, who is known only from the Mencius, evidently knew Mencius personally, but Xunzi knew him only retrospectively. Both disagreed with Mencius’ views on human nature.
Gaozi’s dialogue with Mencius on human nature can be found in book six of the Mencius, in which both Mencius’ disciples and Gaozi himself question him on his points of disagreement with Gaozi. Gaozi – whom later Confucians identified, probably anachronistically, as a Daoist — offers multiple hypotheses about human nature, each of which Mencius refutes in Socratic fashion. Gaozi first argues that human nature is neither bad nor good, and presents two organic metaphors for its moral neutrality: wood (which can be carved into any object) and water (which can be made to flow east or west).
Challenging the carved wood metaphor, Mencius points out that in carving wood into a cup or bowl, one violates the wood’s nature, which is to become a tree. Does one then violate a human being’s nature by training him to be good? No, he says, it is possible to violate a human being’s nature by making him bad, but his nature is to become good. As for the water metaphor, Mencius rejects it by remarking that human nature flows to the good, just as water’s nature flows down. It is possible to make people bad, just as it is possible to make water flow up – but neither is a natural process or end. “Although man can be made to become bad, his nature remains as it was.” (6A2)
Like Mencius, Xunzi claims to interpret Confucius’ thought authentically, but leavens it with his own contributions. While neither Gaozi nor Mencius is willing to entertain the notion that human beings might originally be evil, this is the cornerstone of Xunzi’s position on human nature. Against Mencius, Xunzi defines human nature as what is inborn and unlearned, and then asks why education and ritual are necessary for Mencius if people really are good by nature. Whereas Mencius claims that human beings are originally good but argues for the necessity of self-cultivation, Xunzi claims that human beings are originally bad but argues that they can be reformed, even perfected, through self-cultivation. Also like Mencius, Xunzi sees li as the key to the cultivation of renxing.
Although Xunzi condemns Mencius’ arguments in no uncertain terms, when one has risen above the smoke and din of the fray, one may see that the two thinkers share many assumptions, including one that links each to Confucius: the assumption that human beings can be transformed by participation in traditional aesthetic, moral, and social disciplines. (Gaozi’s metaphor of carved wood, incidentally, is one of Xunzi’s favorites.) Through an accident of history, Mencius had no occasion to meet Xunzi and thus no opportunity to refute his arguments, but if he had, he might have replied that Xunzi cannot truly believe in the original depravity of human beings, or else he could not place such great faith in the morally-transformative power of culture.
Later interpreters of Mencius’ thought between the Tang and Ming dynasties are often grouped together under the label of “Neo-Confucianism.” This term has no cognate in classical Chinese, but is useful insofar as it unites several thinkers from disparate eras who share common themes and concerns. Thinkers such as Zhang Zai (Chang Tsai, 1020-1077 CE), Zhu Xi (Chu Hsi, 1130-1200 CE) and Wang Yangming (1472-1529 CE), while distinct from one another, agree on the primacy of Confucius as the fountainhead of the Confucian tradition, share Mencius’ understanding of human beings as innately good, and revere the Mencius as one of the “Four Books” — authoritative textual sources for standards of ritual, moral, and social propriety. Zhang Zai’s interest in qi as the unifier of all things surely must have been stimulated by Mencius’ theories, while Wang Yangming’s search for li (cosmic order or principle) in the heart-mind evokes Mencius 6A7: “What do all heart-minds have in common? Li [cosmic order] and yi [rightness].” Both thinkers also display a bent toward the cosmological and metaphysical which disposes them toward the mysticism of Mencius 2A2, and betrays the influence of Buddhism (of which Mencius knew nothing) and Daoism (of which Mencius indicates little knowledge) on their thought.
During the Qing (Ch’ing) dynasty (1644-1911 CE), late Confucian thinkers such as Dai Zhen (Tai Chen, 1724-1777 CE) developed critiques of Xunzi that aimed at the vindication of Mencius’ position on human nature. Kwong-loi Shun has pointed out that Dai Zhen’s defense of Mencius actually owes more to Xunzi than to Mencius, particularly in regard to how Dai Zhen sees one’s heart-mind as learning to appreciate li (cosmic order) and yi (rightness), rather than naturally taking pleasure in such things, as Mencius would have it. Although Dai Zhen shares Mencius’ view of the centrality of the heart-mind in moral development, in the end, he does not ascribe to the heart-mind the same kind of ethical directionality that Mencius finds there.
More recently, the philosophers Roger Ames and Donald Munro have developed postmodern readings of Mencius that involve contemporary developments such as process thought and evolutionary psychology. Although their philosophical points of departure differ, both Ames and Munro share a distaste for the prominence of Tian in Mencius’ thought, and each seeks in his own way to separate the “essence” of Mencian thought from the “dross.” For Ames, the “essence” – although, as a postmodern thinker, he rejects any notion of “essentialism” – is Mencius’ “process” model of human nature and the cosmos, while the “dross” is Mencius’ understanding of Tian as transcendent, which (in Ames’ reading) undermines human agency. For Munro, the “essence” is Mencius’ grounding ethics in inborn nature, while the “dross” is Mencius’ appeals to Tian as the author of that inborn nature. Their work is an attempt to make Mencius not only intelligible, but also valuable, to contemporary Westerners. At the same time, critics have noted that much of the authentic Mencius may be discarded on the cutting room floor in this process of reclaiming him for contemporary minds. One thinks of David Nivison’s warning to philosophers, past and present, not to indulge in “wishful thinking” and excise or explain away what one does not wish to see in the Mencius.
This cursory review of some important interpreters of Mencius’ thought illustrates a principle that ought to be followed by all who seek to understanding Mencius’ philosophical views: suspicion of the sources. Almost all of our sources for reconstructing Mencius’ views postdate him or come from a hand other than his own, and thus all should be used with caution and with an eye toward possible influences from outside of fourth century BCE China.
U. S. A.
Last updated: June 28, 2005 | Originally published: