Menippus, an adherent of the Cynic School of philosophy, was a Greek philosopher of Gadara in Syria, who flourished about 250 BCE. He was born at Sinope in Asia Minor, but his family was originally from Gadara, in Palestine. According to Diogenes Laertius, he was at first a slave, but afterward obtained his freedom by purchase, and eventually succeeded, by dint of money, in obtaining citizenship at Thebes. Here he pursued the employment of a money lender, and obtained from this the title “one who lends money at daily interest”. Having been defrauded, and having lost, in consequence, all his property, he hung himself in despair. Menippus was the author of several works, now completely lost; they satirized the follies of human kind, especially of philosophers, in a sarcastic tone Among other productions, he wrote a piece entitled “The Sale of Diogenes,” and another called “Necromancy.” They were a medley of prose and verse, and became models for the satirical works of Varro (hence called Saturae Menippeae. It is suggested that the Necromancy inspired an imitator of Lucian to compose the “Menippus, or Oracle of the Dead,” which is found among the works of the native of Samosata.
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Last updated: April 20, 2001 | Originally published: April/20/2001
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