The term “mental causation” applies to causal transactions involving mental events or states, such as beliefs, desires, feelings, and perceptions. Typically, the term is used to refer to cases where a mental state causes a physical reaction: for instance, the mental state of perceiving a Frisbee flying your way can cause the physical event of your springing up to catch it. It should also be recognized that mental causation covers those cases where the causal transaction occurs just among mental states themselves, as when one entertains a series of thoughts while planning, deliberating, solving a problem, remembering, and so on. The term “mental causation” need not cover such exotica as minds bending spoons (if such feats are to be believed), psychosomatic illnesses, or controlling one’s body through yogic meditation. Simply waving your hand (a physical event) because you wish to greet a friend (a mental event) suffices for counting as an instance of mental causation.
The phenomenon of mental causation, as may be apparent, is thoroughly commonplace and ubiquitous. But this is not the only reason why it is significant. It is absolutely fundamental to our concept of actions performed intentionally (as opposed to involuntarily), which, in turn, is central to those of agency, free will, and moral responsibility. An action, as philosophers use the term, is not a mere bodily motion like involuntarily blinking one’s eyes. It is something one does intentionally, as when one winks to grab someone’s attention. The distinction between a mere bodily movement and an action hinges on the possibility of mental causation, since actions have mental states, such as intentions, as direct causes. This distinction, in turn, is critical for gauging moral responsibility, since we attribute or withhold judgments of moral responsibility depending upon whether the agent acted intentionally.
While the phenomenon of mental causation seems obvious enough, the explanation of how it is possible is far from obvious. There are certain putative marks distinctive of mental states that pose problems for their capacity to wield causal powers, marks such as: being a non-physical substance (problem of spatial location and problem of conservation); failing to conform to law-like regularities (problem of anomalism); being extrinsic to an agent’s body (problem of externalism); and being supplanted by brain states (problem of exclusion).
The main assumption that generates problems for mental causation is dualism, the view that mental phenomena and physical phenomena are fundamentally different from each other. In particular, the mental is not reducible to the physical: constructing a physical duplicate of a conscious person does not guarantee that the physical duplicate has a mind. René Descartes (1596 – 1650) is the classic source for defenses of dualism. The view that the mental is so reducible is known as reductive materialism, which maintains that mental phenomena are nothing but a species of physical phenomena, which consist of purely physical substances, physical properties, and physical laws governing their behavior.
Reductive materialism does not face the problem of mental causation, as mental causation, being nothing more than a species of physical causation, is no more problematic than just plain old physical causation. Not so for dualism.
Dualism comes in two main versions: substance dualism and property dualism. Standard discussions divide the issue along the traditional problem of mental causation and the contemporary problem of mental causation. The former is generated by the form of dualism known as substance dualism, while the latter generated by what is known as property dualism. It is actually more accurate to say of both problems that there are several sub-problems associated with each.
Substance dualism comes out of the traditional Christian conception of a person as consisting of both a body and a soul that can survive the destruction of the body. Descartes offered the most fully developed formulation of substance dualism (also called “Cartesian dualism,” after its founder), so called because the idea is that the mind and the body constitute each their own “substance.” A substance, on Descartes’s view, is anything that can logically exist on its own, where something can logically exist on its own if one can coherently conceive of that individual without having to conceive of it with anything else – a pumpkin, a cow, a ball of wax; things that are not substances would be things like a sense of humor or a friendly smile, as they need to be a part of something else in order for us to conceive of them coherently (a person, in the case of humor, and a face, in the case of a smile). Descartes’s formulation of substance dualism maintains that the mind has no physical features – no mass, shape, spatial dimension, and so on. The mind, in other words, has no physically detectable qualities. Furthermore, under this formulation, the body has no mental features. This basically means that the brain does not think, feel, or perceive, a rather odd view by today’s standards.
Property dualism, by contrast, allows for the brain to think, feel, and perceive, for it allows that all substances are physical, but it maintains that thoughts, feelings, and perceptions are instances of mental properties that are not reducible to physical properties. Properties, unlike substances, are repeatable; that is, a single property, such the color orange, can occur in many different substances – a pumpkin and a squash can both be orange. Examples of mental properties are things like the belief that it is raining, the desire to stay dry, and other propositional attitudes, as well as sensations, like pains, itches, and tickles. According to property dualism, an individual who has exactly the same physical properties as a conscious person may still lack mental properties. Both property dualism and substance dualism allow for the possibility of what philosophers of mind call zombies. These are not the brain-dead stalkers of Hollywood, but rather creatures that are physically identical to a fully conscious individual that nonetheless lack a mental life. Property dualism and substance dualism differ in that substance dualism entails property dualism, but the converse is not true.
There are four basic models of mind-body interaction. These are:
These models can each be formulated in terms of the vocabulary of either substance dualism or property dualism. In this entry, the models will be neutral between these two versions of dualism.
What these models say and how they differ are best understood when applied to a concrete example. Take the case where you have the misfortune of stubbing your toe. The trauma to your toe sends signals through nerves in your leg and torso that stimulate those neural tissues responsible for the capacity to experience pain – call them C-fibers, the neural correlate of pain. The crucial question is how the term “correlate” is specified: is the correlation causal or non-causal, and if causal, do the effects themselves have causal powers or not? The different models give us different answers to this question.
The critical feature of interactionism is its commitment to “two-way” causation – mental-to-physical causation and physical-to-mental causation. Here is the interactionist’s story. When you stub your toe (call this event a), this stimulates the C-fibers in your brain (call this event b). This neural event b causes you to experience the sensation of pain (event c.). The pain you feel causes you to get annoyed (event d), causing a neural event (e), which is the neural correlate of annoyance.
A diagram may be helpful here. Causal transactions are represented by arrows. Mental events (like pain and annoyance) go above the bar, and physical events (like stubbing your toe, C-fiber stimulation (CFS), and the neural correlate of annoyance (N)) go below it.
Objections to Interactionism: As the picture makes clear, causation flows from the mental to the physical and from the physical to the mental. Indeed, this is the hallmark of interactionism, which is depicted by the arrows from (b) to (c) and (d) to (e). Interactionism is probably the most common view held by the folk, but as will be explained below, it faces the problem of spatial location and the problem of conservation.
Dualism does not necessarily entail interactionism, since one can be a dualist and yet maintain that there is no causal interaction between the mental and the physical. This is parallelism. On this model, mental and physical events do not causally interact; they only co-occur. When causal transactions do occur, they occur only between members of their own kind: mental events enter into causal transactions only with other mental events, and physical events enter into causal transactions only with other physical events.
Parallelism raises the following pressing question: what guarantees that the mental event and its physical correlate will be appropriately coordinated? Why do we feel pain upon bodily trauma on a regular basis, or seek water when we are thirsty rather than whistle a tune, or elevate our arm when we want to raise it rather than raise our foot? Our minds and bodies are remarkably well coordinated for two systems that are supposed to have no causal contact with each other.
There are two different accounts of how the coordination is achieved: pre-established harmony, the view of Gottfried Leibniz (1646 – 1716) and occasionalism, the view of Nicolas Malebranche (1638 – 1715). Both appeal crucially to God as the source of mind-body coordination. According to Leibniz’s pre-established harmony (1695), the proper pairing of a mental event and a bodily event was long established by God. As Leibniz explains, the mind and the body are like two separate clocks wound up in advance to chime at precisely the same time. On this view, God is thus fairly “hands-off” when it comes to coordinating an individual’s mind with her body, having done all the work ahead of time.
Not so on the view developed by Malebranche. According to Malebranche’s occasionalism, coordination is achieved on an event by event basis; whenever someone wants to raise her arm, God is right there to make her arm go up (Malebranche 1958, 2:316). The basis for this view stems out of a previous commitment to a certain view about causation according to which only God can bring about causes and effects.
Objections to Parallelism: To modern ears, this convenient appeal to God to solve the coordination problem is untenable and just too convenient. In defense of pre-established harmony and occasionalism, we need to understand that they are driven by prior commitments about the nature of God and the world as God created it, not simply introduced to solve a problem about mind-body coordination. However, those who reject the metaphysical schemes of Leibniz and of Malebranche will find these solutions unsatisfactory.
Epiphenomenalism is the view that physical events cause mental events, but mental events never cause anything, not even other mental events. It is thus a partial concession to interactionism, as it allows for causation in “one direction” – from the physical to the mental – and so it denies parallelism, as it insists upon causal contact from the physical to the mental. The mind, on this model, is like a shadow cast by the body, where the body is the only thing that makes things happen – the mind is just “projected” and is causally inert. This analogy is inexact, for even shadows do darken the regions upon which they are cast, and at times, frighten or amuse or do other things. But mental events are not supposed to do anything, according to epiphenomenalism, not even cause other mental events.
As odd as the model may initially appear, there is a compelling motivation for it. It does not encounter the coordination problem faced by parallelism, because it allows for mental events to be causally grounded by their physical causes. Thus, the reason why, say, one feels pain upon stubbing one’s toe is that the stubbing causes the C-fiber stimulation, which then causes the pain in a law-like manner.
Objections to Epiphenomenalism: In spite of its stated virtues, epiphenomenalism has been thought to be unappealing, precisely because it does not credit the mind with any causal efficacy. Consequently, epiphenomenalism is logically consistent with the complete absence of mentality; mindless bodies would function in exactly the same way, as the mind has no capacity to generate any causal impact. In short, epiphenomenalism denies that there is any mental causation. Even parallelism allows for the mind to have a measure of efficacy since mental events can, at least, cause other mental events. But under epiphenomenalism, not even this limited causal efficacy is accorded to the mind. This makes epiphenomenalism quite objectionable.
With all the difficulties encountered by interactionism, parallelism, and epiphenomenalism, one may wonder why we don’t construe the mind in wholly physical terms – why, that is, we don’t just identify the mental with the physical. This is the idea behind reductionism. On this view, mental events just are physical events; the difference between the mental and the physical lies only in how we conceive of them, not in how they really are. Thus, there are concepts that are about mental phenomena and concepts that are about physical phenomena, but it is possible for a mental concept and a physical concept to pick out one and the same physical event.
As Figure 4 indicates, mental events just are physical events; there are no events that are non-physical. For this very reason, mental causation is just a species of physical causation, and is therefore no more problematic than plain old physical causation. On this view, mental causation is just physical causation that has been conceptualized using mental concepts, or described using mental vocabulary.
Objections to Reductionism: While reductionism has the virtue of presenting a clear account of mental causation, it faces the problem of justifying the reducibility of the mental to the physical. There are compelling reasons for thinking that the mind is not just a purely physical phenomenon. Descartes, for instance, gives us two arguments for the irreducibility of mental substances to physical substances. The first is the argument from divisibility, which basically claims that the mind cannot be physical, as physical things have spatial dimension but minds simply are not the kinds of things that have spatial dimension. And the second is the argument from conceivability, according to which it is conceivable that the conceiver does not have a body, but not conceivable that the conceiver does not have a mind. While contemporary philosophers no longer work within the framework of substance dualism, there are other considerations that have been used to support the irreducibility of mental properties to physical properties (for the irreducibility of phenomenal properties, see Jackson 1982, Nagel 1974, Kripke 1980, Chalmers 1996; for the irreducibility of intentional properties, see Davidson 1970, Child 1994).
The traditional problem of mental causation begins with the idea that the mind is its own substance that has no physical characteristics. In the absence of physical characteristics, it becomes quite puzzling how the mind is supposed to exert any causal influence. There are two ways of formulating the problem: the Problem of Spatial Location and the Problem of Energy Conservation.
This problem is based upon a certain assumption about the nature of causation – that the cause and its effect must be spatially contiguous (touch each other, so to speak), and thus have spatial location. The spatial location requirement has ample intuitive support: a stone does not move unless something pushes against it; a pot of water does not boil unless heat is directly applied to it; a plant does not grow unless its roots draw water from the soil; and so on. (Typically, a given effect has multiple causal factors whose conjunction is necessary for the effect, and conversely, a given cause produces more than one effect. Since nothing hangs on observing this nicety, this entry will help itself to the simplifying talk of one cause per effect and one effect per cause.) In each of these cases, the causes and their effects are in spatial contact in one way or another. As a general matter, nowhere in nature is there causation where the cause or effect has no spatial location. But this is precisely what Cartesian mind-body interaction asks us to believe. The problem can be summed up by the inconsistency among the following statements:
The claim about mental causation (1) and the claim about spatial location (2) are very intuitive, so dualism would lose much credibility if it could not make sense of how the two claims could be true under dualism. However, the three claims do not look like they are consistent with each other. If causes and effects must have spatial location, as (1) maintains, then the mental cause of a bodily event must occur in a spatial location. But (2) denies that mental events have spatial location, so the assertion that there is mental causation (3) is not consistent with the conjunction of (1) and (2). Descartes’s colleagues were quite open about their puzzlement. Pierre Gassendi, for instance, asked:
How can there be effort directed at anything, or motion set up in it, unless there is mutual contact between what moves and what is moved? (Cottingham, et al., 1984, p, 236).
Princess Elizabeth of Bohemia, another contemporary of Descartes, was even more forthright about her puzzlement:
[T]he determination of movement seems always to come about from the moving body’s being propelled – to depend on the kind of impulse it gets from what sets it in motion, or again, on the nature and shape of this latter thing’s surface. Now the first two conditions involve contact, and the third involves that the impelling thing has extension; but you utterly exclude extension from your notion of soul, and contact seems to me incompatible with a thing’s being immaterial (Anscombe and Geach 1954, pp. 274 – 5).
There are two standard dualist strategies to handle the problem: the Pineal Gland Reply and the Reply from Quantum Mechanics.
Pineal Gland Reply: Descartes proposed that we could locate the workings of mental causation in the pineal gland, which Descartes believed to be the gateway between the mind and the body. We now know that the pineal gland is responsible for regulating the hormone melatonin, but aside from Descartes’ anatomical inaccuracy, the strategy of appealing to a physical locus is fundamentally misguided, because it does nothing to solve the problem. For how, one is right to ask, can mental causation occur “in” the pineal gland if the mind cannot be located “in” anything, lacking as it is in spatial dimension?
Reply from Quantum Mechanics: This reply rejects (2), the spatial location constraint upon causes and effects as inaccurate. The basis for this rejection is certain alleged findings in quantum mechanics where the position of a traveling particle, such as an electron, is indeterminate. That is, there is a chance that a particle will show up in a certain region but its presence in that region is purely a matter of chance, and yet for all its lack of a determinate spatial location, it is still capable of entering into causal relations. Perhaps minds are like this as well; they can cause things to happen even if they have no determinate location. Or so the reply goes. There are three difficulties with this reply. First, the comparison between minds and fundamental physical particles is imperfect, for electrons can have a location, albeit indeterminate, whereas minds, according to the Cartesian conception, cannot have any location at all. Second, the jury is still out on the interpretation of these alleged findings; for all we know, some theory will be able to explain away the appearance of indeterminacy and model the universe after strictly deterministic principles. And third, no entities outside of the domain of fundamental physics – macro-physical entities – have this odd indeterminacy about their occurrence or location, and so it appears too convenient to proclaim of minds, a macro-entity by any standards, that it is like the micro-physical entity of electrons in this one respect.
This problem draws upon two key assumptions. The first is the idea that causation is matter of energy transfer, such as when one pool ball transfers its momentum to another ball upon collision, or when the calories from ingesting food get converted into bodily energy (for energy transfer accounts of causation, see Aronson 1985, Dowe 2000, Fair 1979, and Salmon 1994). The second is the principle of the conservation of energy, a fundamental law of nature that is taken to be a cornerstone of contemporary science. According to this principle, the total quantity of energy in the universe remains fixed at all times. Energy, of course, comes in many forms – kinetic, chemical, electrical, thermal, and so on – and energy can be transformed from one form to another, and loss or gain of energy can happen within a component part of the universe, but the sum total energy in the universe as a whole can be neither created nor destroyed. The principle of conservation entails a significant lemma, which is that the physical universe is a causally closed system: at no point in the history of the physical universe can there be outside energy causing something to happen within the system, nor can energy leave the system to cause something to happen outside of it.
Insofar as the body is a part of the physical system, it cannot be caused to move by anything other than something else within that system. But if the mind is not a part of that system, as Cartesian dualism maintains, then its causal influence upon the body would be a foreign source of energy impinging upon the energy equilibrium of the universe, thereby violating conservation. The inconsistency here is present in the following statements:
Again, these statements cannot be true together. The conjunction of (1) and (3) entail a disruption in the balance of energy in the physical universe, but (2) denies that this can happen.
Reply from Rejection of Conservation: This reply rejects (2) by appealing to what is known as “tunneling,” a quantum mechanical phenomenon found in certain types of radioactive decay. When a particle “tunnels,” it effectively escapes a barrier that requires more energy than it could inherently have, creating a sudden surge of energy that temporarily disrupts conservation. It is as if a 10 horse-power motor put out 11 horse-power out of nowhere. The application of this possibility to dualistic mental causation is tempting: if the non-physical desire to raise one’s arm disrupts the overall energy balance when it causes one’s arm to go up, the mental event “tunnels” to our brain, thereby explaining the disruption of the sum total of energy. We certainly cannot rule out this scenario from our armchairs, but this reply is problematic, for the same reason that it was found problematic when claiming that the mind could be like electrons in having indeterminate spatial location. Tunneling is found only at the subatomic level and nowhere else in the natural world. We do not find it in biology, geology, astronomy, or in any of the other special sciences. Thus, there is no reason to expect the phenomenon of tunneling in the realm of mental events.
The traditional problem of mental causation lies in the commitment to substance dualism. The contemporary problem, on the other hand, lies in its commitment to property dualism, along with other assumptions concerning token physicalism, the causal efficacy of mental events versus the causal relevance of mental properties, and conditions for causal relevance.
Contemporary approaches to the mind typically work within the framework of physicalism, the view that everything that exists in space-time is exclusively physical or constituted by the physical. The optimal way of formulating the doctrine of physicalism is itself a substantive issue (for comprehensive discussions, see Poland 1994, Gillett and Loewer 2001, Melnyk 2003, Kim 2005), but the version that most philosophers work with, or react to, in the mental causation literature, is token physicalism (see Donald Davidson 1970). According to token physicalism, each mental event is a particular (also called a token), which is numerically identical with a physical particular; this means that a mental event is an occurrence of an event in the brain or of some other suitably complex physical medium. The converse, on the other hand is not necessarily true, since there are physical events that are not mental, such as tsunamis, apples falling to the ground, magnets attracting iron filings, and so on.
We can illustrate the concept of token identity this way. Say that Alice sneezes in such a way that the sneezing event was both a loud noise a as well as an emission of a virus b. If the loud noise was indeed one and the same event as the emission of the virus, then we can say that a is token identical with b. The token identity of a mental event and a physical event conforms to this idea: some mental occurrence was one and the same event as a physical occurrence. On Davidson’s view, an event is a mental event m just in case it has a mental property M (or it is describable in terms of mental predicates); similarly for the relevant aspects of physical events. To say, then, that a mental event m is token identical with a physical event p is to say that m and p are just one and the same thing, one event having both M and P.
Token physicalism it is to be carefully distinguished from what is known as type physicalism, the view that each mental property M is identical with, or reducible to, a physical property P. Particulars are unrepeatable (that is, they are bound to a unique spatio-temporal region) whereas types are repeatable (that is, they can show up in different things and at different times). The idea behind type physicalism can be illustrated this way. The property roundness (call it “R”) and the property circularity (“C”) are both types, as they are repeatable. As it happens, they are one and the same type, which means that any particular having R necessarily has C. The difference between token physicalism and type physicalism is basically this: whereas token physicalism only entails that every particular thing having a mental property also has some physical property or other, type physicalism entails that for each mental property, there is a physical property with which that mental property is identical.
The advantage of token physicalism is that it allows a mental event to enter into causal transactions in a way that does not violate the spatial location constraint upon causes, and therefore, does not face the Problem of Spatial Location: physical events have spatial location, so if m and p are token identical, then m has whatever spatial location p has. Nor does it run afoul of the Problem of Conservation: m just is p (and thus not distinct from p), so m‘s causal efficacy does not add anything extra over and above the causal efficacy of the event p.
Nonetheless, token physicalism still faces problems accounting for mental causation. While mental events are one thing, the mental properties in virtue of which those events are efficacious are another; for a single event can have many properties, but only some of them may be involved in bringing about an effect. Here is an example of this. Suppose one steps on a banana peel and falls smack down to the ground. The banana peel has many properties: its slipperiness and its yellowness, for instance. But, surely the causally relevant property was the slipperiness of the peel, not the color of the peel, for had the peel not been slippery, the falling would not have occurred (all things being equal), but the falling still would have occurred even if the peel were a different color. To track this distinction, let us use the term “efficacy” for events and “relevance” for the properties of events.
The troubling idea, then, is that while a mental event may be causally efficacious insofar as it is an event, only its physical properties, and not its mental ones, are causally relevant for bringing about the effect. An example of this is the following. Suppose Alice sneezes, causing Bob to catch her cold. Suppose also that the sneezing event was a loud noise as well as an emission of a virus. Then, while it is true to say that the loud noise caused Bob’s cold, as the loud noise is the same event as the emission of the virus, surely it was only the event’s being an emission of a virus that was causally relevant to the onset of Bob’s illness. Under token physicalism, the worry is that mental properties are like the property of being a loud noise – completely irrelevant to bringing about the effect. This is the worry that drives the contemporary problems of mental causation, which are manifest in the problem of anomalism, the problem of externalism, and the problem of exclusion. But before introducing these problems, it will be helpful to lay out a rough account of what it means for a property to be causally relevant or irrelevant.
What test can we use to determine whether a property is causally relevant or not? This is a different question from the question of what it takes for a property to pass that test. Here, we just want to lay out the test. Let us be clear that properties are causally relevant to something or other, typically, to the instantiation of other properties. Causal relevance is thus a 4-place relation where the relata consist of the cause event c, the effect event e, and properties F of c and G of e, wherein c causes e to instantiate G in virtue of the fact that c has F.
To gauge whether properties are causally relevant or irrelevant, philosophers appeal to the following conditions or counterfactuals:
Property F is causally relevant to property G only if:
- Suppose F and G occurred; then if F had not occurred, then G would not have occurred;
- Suppose F and G had not occurred; then if F had occurred, then G would have occurred;
- There is no H such that had H occurred without F, G would not have occurred, or had F occurred without H, G would still have occurred.
Conditions (1) – (3) convey the idea that G’s occurrence is contingent upon F’s occurrence. More specifically, (1) says that F’s occurrence is necessary for G: G doesn’t or can’t occur unless F occurs. (2) says that F’s occurrence necessitates G: F guarantees G’s occurrence. Finally, (3) says that F is not a mere spurious cause of G: F does not merely accompany the property H that happens to be the one that’s doing the real causal work. Failure to satisfy any of the three conditions would indicate that the candidate property is not causally relevant.
It is important to appreciate that these conditions are only to test for whether a property is causally relevant. As it was said earlier, they do not answer the question of what it takes for a property to pass that test. One way to put this point is to distinguish between the truth conditions for a claim and the truth makers for the claim: the truth makers of the claim describe the fact, mechanism, or elements, in virtue of which the claim is true. Thus, they do not form an analysis, certainly not a full analysis, as they are only necessary conditions that may not be jointly sufficient. A genuine analysis requires that one specify both necessary and sufficient conditions as well as what it is in virtue of which these very conditions hold – the truth-maker.
In contemporary discussions of mental causation, there are three stumbling blocks for the satisfactions of the conditions for causal relevance in the case of mental properties. These are: the problem of anomalism, the problem of externalism, and the problem of exclusion.
The basic root of the problem of anomalism is the thesis of psychophysical anomalism, the claim that there are no strict, exceptionless, laws involving mental states. The problem has been acknowledged by many philosophers, but its most explicit formulation has been laid out by Kim (Kim 1989). On a widely received view about causal relevance, a property is causally relevant only if it is “nomically subsumed,” that is, if it appears in a strict law. The denial that mental properties can appear in laws of this kind naturally threatens to render mental properties causally irrelevant. The threat of epiphenomenalism posed by the problem of anomalism can be formulated thus:
This problem of anomalism has its origin in Davidson’s theory of anomalous monism (Davidson 1970). The problem of anomalism has a bit of an ironic history since the original intent of Davidson’s anomalous monism was to explain how mental causation is possible. Nonetheless, a number of critics have argued that anomalous monism leads to epiphenomenalism (Antony 1989, Kim 1989b, 1993c, LePore and Loewer 1987, McLaughlin 1989, 1993). Anomalous monism is made up of two theses: first, that there are no laws connecting mental properties with physical properties (this is the thesis called “psychophysical anomalism”), and second, that every mental event is token-identical with a physical event, and thus causally efficacious insofar as the physical event with which it is identical is causally efficacious. It is the result of the attempt to render consistent the following seemingly inconsistent set of statements:
Each of these principles is independently plausible. The Principle of Causal Interaction is just the statement that mental causation occurs. The Principle of Nomic Subsumption needs a bit more explanation. This entry presents the most common reading of the principle. Suppose event c is of type F (it has F as a property) and e is of type G. According to this principle, F can be causally relevant to G only if there is a law is to the effect that events of type F cause events of type G. For instance, when a sudden sneeze causes a sleeping baby to awake, the cause has the capacity to produce that effect because there is a law-like generalization to the effect that noises above a certain level cause sleep disturbances. Davidson (1993) has objected to this construal of causation conflates causation with causal explanation. As Davidson explains, causal explanations mention properties when explaining a causal transaction, but statements reporting a causal transaction do not. When it comes to causation, events cause other events, according to Davidson, no matter how they are described – no matter which properties we refer to when talk about the events. This construal of causation has been roundly criticized (McLaughlin 1993).
The Principle of the Anomalism of the Mental states that there are no laws involving mental states that are strict, strict in the sense that they are exceptionless. A cursory look at the following generalizations reasonably backs this up:
(A) – (C) represent a very small number of generalizations of folk psychology, and while they do a good job of covering many cases, we can easily imagine circumstances under which they would be false. According to the Principle of the Anomalism of the Mental, this is true of all generalizations of folk psychology.
While independently plausible, the principles together appear to generate an inconsistency: if there are no laws couched in mental terms, as is maintained by the Anomalism of the Mental, but laws are necessary for causal interaction, which is stated by the Principle of Nomic Subsumption, then it follows that mental events have no causal powers, contrary to the first statement, the Principle of Causal Interaction. Davidson resolves this inconsistency with an appeal to token physicalism (explained above), where mental events can be causally efficacious, thanks to their token-identity with causally efficacious physical events.
Token physicalism, however, is not sufficient for supporting the causal relevance of mental properties – for securing the idea that a mental event caused a physical event in virtue of its having a mental property. In fact, the very argument Davidson gives for token physicalism through his argument for anomalous monism, has been interpreted to lead to the causal irrelevance of mental properties. The interpretation goes as follows: if event c can cause event e only if there is a strict law covering c and e, and the only laws that are strict are physical laws (laws relating physical properties) it follows that c causes e because of c‘s physical properties; indeed, c cannot cause e in virtue of its mental property, because mental properties cannot come together in a law. In short, if strict laws are necessary for securing the causal relevance of properties, but there are no strict laws involving mental properties, then mental properties cannot be relevant on this view.
Ceteris Paribus Causal Relevance: A (mental) property M of an event c is causally relevant to a (physical) property P of event e if there is a strict causal law connecting M with P or a non-strict law connecting M with P.
Problems: This solution faces three objections. The first is that the ceteris paribus clauses may threaten to render any “law” vacuous that is so modified, and so strict laws might be what we need after all (Schiffer 1991, Fodor 1991b). The second is that mental properties just may not be the kinds of properties that can appear in laws, strict or otherwise. There are two considerations that have been availed in support of this skepticism. The first is based upon claims that normative relations constitutively constrain the distribution of mental properties, a pattern then cannot also be constrained by laws (Davidson 1970, 1974; McDowell 1984; Kim 1985). The second is based upon what is called the “simulation theory of folk psychology,” the idea that mental states are attributed to an agent by placing one’s self in the agent’s situation, a process that does not require the existence of mental laws (see Heal 1995, Gordon 1995, and Goldman 1995). The third objection is that even if mental properties can appear in laws, they face the problem of exclusion, which briefly is the problem that the physical properties of an event pre-empt its mental properties, given the generality of physics – that the physical domain is completely self-sufficient in bringing about all causal transactions – and the exclusion principle, which states that a causally sufficient property of an event excludes the causal relevance of other properties of the event.
The second solution to the problem of anomalism has been pursued by LePore and Loewer 1987, 1989, and Horgan 1989. Like the appeal to ceteris paribus laws, this approach also denies that strict laws are necessary for grounding the causal relevance of a property. But instead of appealing to non-strict laws, this solution appeals to counterfactual dependencies involving mental properties.
On this view, a mental property can be causally relevant if its non-occurrence means that the effect also would not have occurred. The basic idea is this. Suppose we want to know whether one’s belief that there is water in the glass was causally relevant to the motion of reaching out for the glass. The belief is causally relevant if the motion of reaching out would not have occurred if the belief had not occurred; this is just to say that the effect is counterfactually dependent upon its cause. Here is the account given by LePore and Loewer 1987:
Counterfactual Causal Relevance: Property M of event c is causally relevant to property P of event e if:
- c causes e,
- c has M and e has P,
- if c did not have M, then e would not have had P,
- M and P are metaphysically independent.
The appeal to causation in (i) does not render this partial analysis circular, since the analysis is for causal relevance, not causation per se. Condition (ii) highlights the role of properties in causal transactions. Condition (iii) states the counterfactual relation between the properties that allegedly suffices for one’s being causally relevant to the other. Condition (iv) comes from the Humean view that logically or metaphysically connected properties cannot stand in a causal relation, and so (iv) is to ensure that M and P are candidates for causal relevance.
Problem: The main problem with this solution is that the mere holding of the relevant counterfactuals is not sufficient for causal relevance (Braun 1995; McLaughlin 1989, p. 124; Kim 2006, pp. 189 – 194). Fires give off both heat and smoke. Now, if fire is placed near a piece of wax, the wax melts because of the heat, not the smoke, given off by the fire. That is, the smoke is not causally relevant to melting the wax. However, there is a counterfactual dependency of the melting upon the smoke because smoke, as much as heat, reliably occurs when there is fire. Thus, there are spurious counterfactual dependencies, and for all we know, the counterfactual dependency of bodily motion upon mental properties is as spurious as the dependency of melting upon smoke. The lesson is this: the counterfactual dependency of G upon F does not suffice for F’s causal relevance to G. In addition, the counterfactual approach also faces the problem of exclusion.
Externalism is a thesis about semantic content; according to the thesis, we must take into consideration facts about the physical environment, as well as the linguistic norms of one’s surrounding community, when individuating contentful mental states (the classic sources are Putnam 1975, Burge 1979). This is a thesis that affects intentional states (also called propositional attitudes), the states that have representational contents, rather than phenomenal states, the states that have a “what-it-is-like” quality to them. The problem generated by externalism for the causal relevance of intentional states is that it renders the content of the intentional state extrinsic (see Fodor 1987, pp. 27 – 54; McGinn 1989, p. 118). Causation, as we intuitively understand it, however, involves only the intrinsic features of objects and events. Consequently, externalist ways of individuating intentional content make them unsuitable for causal involvement.
While it is not easy to pin down exactly the distinction between intrinsic and extrinsic properties, we can get at the general idea with the following example. Take an individual who is 6 feet tall. Being 6 feet tall does not depend upon facts in its environment; whether or not the individual is tall or short, on the other, does so depend, since whether the individual is tall, say, will depend upon whether she is among small children. Properties that do not depend upon the environment are intrinsic; those that do are extrinsic.
To appreciate how causation only involves intrinsic properties, consider the following scenario. One puts a very convincing counterfeit dollar into a soda machine, successfully allowing you to get a soda. It is natural to assume that only the intrinsic features of the dollar bill – its size, design, texture – were causally relevant to the transaction, not the fact that the dollar is genuine or counterfeit, which are extrinsic features, as they involve a relation to certain facts, namely, where it was originally produced – at the U.S. mint or in one’s garage. These latter properties are extrinsic features of the dollar and the example illustrates their causal irrelevance.
Now, when we individuate the contents of a mental state (for those mental states that have intentional contents) according to standards of externalism, the content is rendered extrinsic. The classic example is found in Putnam (1975). Consider the very familiar term, “water.” The meaning of our term “water” is H2O. Now imagine a world, “Twin Earth,” that is just like ours except that the stuff the Twin Earthlings call “water” happens to be a different chemical compound, which we can just label “XYZ.” As Putnam argues, the meaning of “water” differs between the two worlds, even if Earthlings and Twin Earthlings make all the same associations with the stuff both call “water” – that it is stuff we drink, that it falls from the sky, fills the lakes and rivers, is the universal solvent, and so on. In spite of these identical associations, the word “water” is homonymous, meaning H2O when uttered by an Earthling, but XYZ when uttered by a Twin Earthling. This point about the meaning of the word transfers over to the content of our thoughts: when an Earthling and Twin-Earthling are entertaining thoughts about what both call “water,” they are thinking about different things.
This little scenario demonstrates how content – the meaning of the intentional state – under externalism, fails to supervene upon the individual’s internal properties, and is therefore extrinsic to the agent’s body. The threat of epiphenomenalism can be formulated thus:
The problem is that extrinsic properties generally, as a rule, fail the test for causal relevance. As the test specified, a property can be causally relevant only if (among other things) had it failed to occur, the effect would not have occurred; and had it succeeded in occurring, then the effect would have occurred. But this pattern of counterfactual dependencies is not satisfied by externally individuated contents. Suppose you reach out for a refreshing glass of water because you believe that there is water in the glass. In order for that belief to be causally relevant, its absence must result in the absence of the reaching motion. But this isn’t what happens when we individuate content externally: the physical identical twin who is thinking about XYZ, not water proper, does exactly the same thing. Different thoughts do not manifest in different behaviors. As a result, content bearing mental states are not causally relevant to behavior.
Solutions to the argument from externalism pursue one of two strategies; one is to deny the thesis of externalism, premise (2) (see Fodor 1980), and the other is to deny the thesis of local causation, premise (1) (see Burge 1995). Let us begin with the denial of externalism. The strategy here is to appeal to “narrow content.” Narrow content is the content that intrinsic twins have in common; narrow content, by stipulation, supervenes upon the intrinsic properties of an individual (Fodor 1991). (Think about the purely intrinsic features of the dollar bill – features that would be equally shared by a genuine bill and a counterfeit. The intrinsic features are their “narrow content.”) Unlike broad content, which is individuated in terms of the external, historical circumstances surrounding the uses of a term, narrow content is what supervenes upon the internal properties of the individuals, and is thus shared by you and your Twin-Earthly counterpart. Narrow content is the content one entertains under the Cartesian account of mental representation: as you entertain a thought of water, the content of that thought never “reaches out” beyond your head. Intentional properties, then, individuated narrowly, will be just as suited to causing behavior as any other internal properties of a person.
Problem: The appeal to narrow content certainly gets around the problem of causal irrelevance that faces broad content, but the notion of narrow content is highly contentious. Some have even argued that the notion is incoherent (see Adams et al. 1990). Consider again the counterfeit dollar. Surely we do not value it because just because it shares the same intrinsic features as the genuine article; the difference between the genuine bill and the counterfeit makes all the difference between the two. The relevance of the extrinsic is prevalent. Take a different case – the case of gold. When one wants to purchase a gold ring, one has in mind the metal with a certain molecular structure, not some alloy that looks like gold but isn’t gold. Our attributive practices honor this attention to the broad way of individuating content. When we refer to what people are thinking about, what the contents of their intentional states are, we intend to refer to the externalistically individuated contents of their mental states.
The denial of the local causation thesis is the denial of the claim that only intrinsic properties of a cause can be causally relevant. The idea is that there can be “broad causation” (see Burge 1989, Yablo 1997). This view requires a little stage setting. On this approach, there is the causation of bodily motion by neural properties, on the one hand, and then there is the causation of intentionally characterized action by broadly individuated mental content. Take, for instance, one’s waving to a friend: by doing this, one performs the action of greeting a friend, but one also engages in a purely bodily process that engages one’s bones and muscles. On this solution to the problem of externalism, we have two causal processes – one that pertains to the proximal visual stimuli that result in the bodily movement – this would be “narrow causation” – and a different one that pertains to the appearance of the friend, resulting in the action of greeting – this would be “broad causation.” The friend one has in mind, of course, is the individual with whom one has had actual causal contact, not some physically similar but distinct individual (for example, an extraordinary gathering of molecular components that result in an object that looks like the friend). And to the extent that one has in mind the friend and not the freak doppelganger, one’s thought has broad content, which, on this approach, causally results in the action.
Problem: The very concept of wide causation goes against our ordinary intuitions about what causation involves. According to our ordinary intuitions, we assume that causes and their effects must be in spatial contact with each other or mediated by things that spatially link them together – that there is no action at a distance. But wide causation asks us to believe exactly this – that things are caused by situations that have no physical contact with them. It would make no difference, it seems, that it was the friend and not the doppelganger that motivated one to wave. For this reason, wide causation is not an easy solution (but see Yablo 1997 for a defense).
It seems undeniable that mental states bring about behavior: it is because you wanted to catch the Frisbee that you sprung up to catch it – if you didn’t want to catch it, your body wouldn’t have moved the way it did. It is also undeniable that the brain, or more specifically, our neurophysiological system, is fully sufficient to bring about all bodily motion. There are many reasons, however, to think that mental states are not just mere states of the brain. But if this is the case, then it’s not clear what causal role mental states would have given that their neural correlates are fully equipped to perform all the causal work. Brain states, in other words, seem to make the mental states superfluous and therefore irrelevant.
The problem of exclusion can be laid out as follows (this formulation comes from Yablo 1992, pp. 247 – 248):
The exclusion problem does not subscribe to any particular views about the nature of causation and its relationship to laws. Its standard formulations just invoke certain widely held physicalist principle that the physical world is causally closed and comprehensive. The simple reference to this principle, along with the assumption that mental properties are not reducible to physical properties, are all that’s needed to set the argument in motion. In addition, its epiphenomenalist conclusion applies not just to mental properties, but to any special science property that is not strictly reducible to a physical property. The argument casts a wide net (Kim 1989b, 1992, 1993b).
The following is a menu of the main strategies that have been pursued for solving the exclusion problem (see Kim 1989a, 1990 for a discussion of some of these options):
There have been several proposals along these lines, none free of problems. On one approach, each mental property M is reductively identified with a physical property P. This is the view known as the Identity Theory of Mind, which was introduced by U.T. Place in 1956 and by J.J.C. Smart in 1956. The main problem with this approach is the multiple realizability of mental properties (Fodor 1975, 1980a, 1980b; Putnam 1960). According to this thesis, there are many different physical properties P1, P2, …, Pn, each of whose instantiation can suffice for the instantiation of its corresponding mental property M. If P1 and P2 are distinct realizers of M, then M cannot be identified with both P1 and P2. This makes sense if we think of the following example. Suppose Tom and Max are not the same height. Tom is, however, of the same height as Sally. If this is the case, then Sally cannot be the same height as both Tom and Max. The upshot is that no multiply realizable mental property is identifiable with, and hence, reducible to, a physical property.
On a different approach, which attempts to accommodate the multiple realizability of mental properties, known as disjunctive reduction, M is reduced to the disjunction of all the physical property realizations (P1 or P2 or … Pn), such that generalizations of the form
M if and only if (P1 or P2 or … Pn)
hold as a matter of law. The main problem with this approach is that it is committed to disjunctive properties whose disjuncts have nothing in common at the physical level. This makes the disjunct unsuitable for appearing in laws (Armstrong 1978, 1983).
On another approach, which also attempts to accommodate the multiple realizability of mental properties, known as species-specific or “local” reduction, M is reduced to a single physical kind P relative to some species S, giving us laws of the form
S only if (M if and only if P).
The problem with this approach is that it compromises the idea that a mental property is species-invariant – that a pain, say, in a human, is the same mental property as a pain in an octopus, a Martian, or a computer (see Pereboom and Kornblith 1991).
On another approach yet, it is not mental properties that are reduced per se, but rather their instances. Property instances are known as tropes. The idea here is that we can reduce an instance of a mental property – a mental trope – with a physical trope (see Macdonald and Macdonald 1986, Robb 1997). Tropes and properties differ in an important way: while a property is repeatable – whiteness, for instance, is one and the same entity that can appear in a multitude of different objects – a trope is not repeatable. The whiteness of a piece of paper, according to a trope theorist, is a unique instance of that particular shade of whiteness. The trope strategy is to identify a mental trope with a physical trope. The idea is that since physical tropes are causally relevant, identifying a mental trope with a physical trope secures its relevance as well. However, the trope approach is only as good as the argument for the claim that a mental trope is indeed identical with a physical trope. More problematically, there is a concern that we can ask even of tropes whether a trope is causally relevant in virtue of its being a mental trope as opposed to its being a physical trope. That is, the same underlying epiphenomenalist implications that plague Davidson’s token physicalism may be raised for the trope approach.
The most developed account under this option is given by Yablo (Yablo 1993). As scarlet and crimson are each determinates of the determinable red, M and P are related as determinable to determinate. Determinables supervene upon their determinates, and do so with metaphysical necessity. That is, there is no world in which the determinable does not appear if one of its determinates is instantiated.
Yablo argues that the virtue of this approach is that it does not pit M and P against each other as competitors, “since a determinate cannot pre-empt its own determinable.” (Yablo 1992, p. 250) So just as the determinate, crimson, does not causally pre-empt its determinable, red, when we all press our brake pedals at a traffic light that’s just turned crimson, no physical property P pre-empts the determinable mental property M when an agent performs an action.
Problem: While this approach has intuitive appeal, it is not clear that a determinate does not causally exclude the determinable. Consider the determinable, being colored, which has as its determinates, redness, yellowness, and greenness. The determinable is certainly present when any of these properties is present, but different effects ensue upon the instantiation of these properties. If, for instance, a driver detected a green light, she would have continued driving, but if she had detected a red light, she would have brought her car to a full stop. It appears that the determinable, being colored, was not relevant to either outcome since it was present with opposite outcomes.
Shoemaker 2001 appeals to the idea of realization, as it is implicated in the theory of functionalism and its attendant notion of multiple realizability, as well as a certain account of the nature of properties in general according to which properties are causal powers. (An earlier, but less developed, strategy along these lines is suggested by Kim 1993a.) On Shoemaker’s view, both realized and realizing properties have causal powers, but the causal powers of the realized (mental) property form a subset of the causal powers of the realizing (physical) property. The benefit of this view is that a subset of causal powers cannot be “excluded” or trumped or overridden by the superset, as the subset is just a part of the superset. If a 10-pound brick crushes a statue, then the part of the brick that weighs 8 pounds will certainly be involved in the effect, and not trumped by the 10-pound brick of which it constitutes a part.
Problem: Gillett and Rives 2005 argue that this account of realization does not safeguard mental properties from causal exclusion by their realizing physical properties. The idea is that if physical properties are fundamental and do all the causal work, then no property realized by a physical property does further causal work over and above the work done by the physical realizer. Claiming that the causal powers of a realized property form a subset of its realizing base does nothing to help the realized property enter into the causal work-force.
Steuber 2005 argues that causation itself cannot be separated from the explanatory schemes in which they are expressed. Since psychological explanations accomplish one thing, while physical or neurobiological explanations accomplish another, the causal relations they track are themselves different relations, and thus not in competition with one another, as there is no one explanandum for them to both explain.
A strategy of this kind has been developed by Dretske (Dretske 1988, 1989). Dretske distinguishes between a triggering cause and a structuring cause, each cause satisfying two different types of explanatory interests. Schematically speaking, if we want to know how a particular behavior came about, we seek to isolate its triggering cause; such a cause lies within the purview of neurophysiological explanations. But if we want to know why an agent performed some particular behavior and not some other type of behavior, we are seeking its structuring cause, and these are the kinds of causes that psychological explanations are particularly well suited to picking out.
Dretske illustrates the difference between a triggering cause and a structuring cause, as well as how these causes are related to each other, with the homely thermostat. A thermostat is designed to turn on the furnace when it registers a certain temperature. The triggering cause of the switching of the furnace was the cool temperature of the room, but the wiring that connects the thermostat to the furnace, for instance, is the structuring cause of the very same effect. The structuring cause, in short, is the set of pre-existing background conditions that make it possible for the triggering cause to exert its particular effect. Most designed artifacts possess this sort of bi-level causal structure, and so do we. Just as a thermostat possesses an internal sensor calibrated to turn on the furnace when the sensor registers a certain temperature, we possess an internal representational system coordinated with our motor system to trigger the appropriate bodily movements when our internal states represent the presence of certain objects in the environment. Which connections are forged between a given representational state and its corresponding bodily motion, and how these connections are made, is largely a matter of the agent’s learning history. Learning is the process during which the representational content is “recruited” as a cause of the behavior; it structures, so to speak, the relevant links between the agent’s representational states and her motor output.
Problem: Kim 1989a, however, has objected that if we insist that a bit of behavior has some causal origin that is irreducibly mental, and therefore non-physical, then this effectively violates the causal closure of the physical domain. If not, then we are back to the very problem of exclusion that Dretske’s distinction was designed to avoid.
Philosophers are still busy at work trying to make sense of mental causation. Many criticize the assumptions on which the alleged problems of mental causation are predicated, particularly Kim’s formulation of the exclusion problem (Bennett 2003, Menzies 2003, Raymont 2003). Others enjoin us to accept those very positions that have been cast aside as unavailable, such as type physicalism (Hill 1991), or down-right implausible, such as epiphenomenalism (Bieri 1992, Chalmers 1996, ch.5).
Some have even questioned whether we really have a problem concerning mental causation (Baker 1993, Burge 1993). Baker 1993 has argued that once the principles of physicalism are accepted, not only are we saddled with the exclusion problem, the problem is absolutely unsolvable. But, Baker continues, the wide-scale epiphenomenalism that would ensue were we to take the principles of physicalism seriously is tantamount to a reductio ad absurdum of the principles themselves, so we must reject the principles, in which case the exclusion problem dissolves of itself. Baker quite radically proposes that we reject the causal closure thesis if we wish to hold onto the possibility of mental causation – indeed, if we want to hold onto the possibility of macro-causation generally – a possibility that Baker claims is well testified by the successes of our explanatory practices.
Antony 1991 as well as Kim 1993, however, have argued that the problem of mental causation is the problem of explaining how and why there is this explanatory success when it comes to explaining behavior in mental terms. That is, the problem does not go away by pointing out that our mentalistic explanations perform quite well. The puzzle is how they explain so well, given that the metaphysics all point to the causal irrelevance of the mental.
There are, to be sure, other novel solutions in the making. But the ideal solution, given the multiplicity of the problems surrounding mental causation – the problem of anomalism, the problem of externalism, and the problem of exclusion – is one that can solve all the problems together, perhaps not with just one account that simultaneously solves all three, but maybe a patchwork account, each of whose components mutually support the others.
California State University at Northridge
U. S. A.
Last updated: February 10, 2007 | Originally published: