The term “contemporary phenomenology” refers to a wide area of 20th and 21st century philosophy in which the study of the structures of consciousness occupies center stage. Since the appearance of Kant’s Critique of Pure Reason and subsequent developments in phenomenology and hermeneutics after Husserl, it has no longer been possible to view consciousness as a simple scientific object of study. It is, in fact, the precondition for any sort of meaningful experience, even the simple apprehension of objects in the world. While the basic features of phenomenological consciousness – intentionality, self-awareness, embodiment, and so forth—have been the focus of analysis, Continental philosophers such as Paul Ricoeur and Jacques Derrida go further in adding a linguistically creative dimension. They argue that metaphor and symbol act as the primary interpreters of reality, generating richer layers of perception, expression, and meaning in speculative thought. The interplay of metaphor and phenomenology introduces serious challenges and ambiguities within long-standing assumptions in the history of Western philosophy, largely with respect to the strict divide between the literal and figurative modes of reality based in the correspondence theory of truth. Since the end of the 20th century, the role of metaphor in the production of cognitive structures has been taken up and extended in new productive directions, including “naturalized phenomenology” and straightforward cognitive science, notably in the work of G. Lakoff and M. Johnson, M. Turner, D. Zahavi, and S. Gallagher.
This article highlights the definitive points in the ongoing philosophical conversation about metaphorical language and it’s centrality in phenomenology. The phenomenological interpretation of metaphor, at times presented as a critique, is a radical alternative to the conventional analysis of metaphor. The conventional view, largely inherited from Aristotle, is also known as the “substitution model.” In the traditional, or standard approach, the uses and applications of metaphor have been restricted to (along with other related symbolic phenomena/tropes) the realms of rhetoric and poetics. In this view, metaphor is none other than a kind of categorical mistake, a deviance of sense produced in order to create a lively effect.
While somewhat contested, the standard substitution theory, also referred to as the “similarity theory,” generally defines metaphor as a stylistic literary device involving a deviant and dyadic movement which shifts meaning from one word to another. This view, first and most thoroughly articulated by Aristotle, reinforces the epistemic primacy of the literal, where metaphor can only operate as a secondary device, one which is dependent on the prior level of ordinary descriptive language, where the first-order language in itself contains nothing metaphorical. In most cases, the relation between two orders, literal and figurative, has been interpreted as an implicit simile, which expresses a “this is that” structure. For example, Aristotle mentions, in Poetics:
When the poet says of Achilles that he “Leapt on the foe as a lion,” this is a simile; when he says of him, “the lion leapt” it is a metaphor—here, since both are courageous, [Homer] has transferred to Achilles the name of “lion.” (1406b 20-3)
In purely conventional terms, poetic language can only be said to refer to itself; that is, it can accomplish imaginative description through metaphorical attribution, but the description does not refer to any reality outside of itself. For the purposes of traditional rhetoric and poetics in the Aristotelian mode, metaphor may serve many purposes; it can be clever, creative, or eloquent, but never true in terms of referring to new propositional content. This is due to the restriction of comparison to substitution, such that the cognitive impact of the metaphoric transfer of meaning is produced by assuming similarities between literal and figurative domains of objects and the descriptive predicates attributed to them.
The phenomenological interpretation of metaphor, however, not only challenges the substitution model, it advances the role of metaphor far beyond the limits of traditional rhetoric. In the Continental philosophical tradition, the most extensive developments of metaphor’s place in phenomenology are found in the work of Martin Heidegger, Paul Ricoeur and Jacques Derrida. They all, in slightly different ways, see figurative language as the primary vehicle for the disclosure and creation of new forms of meaning which emerge from an ontological, rather than purely epistemic or objectifying engagement with the world.
Metaphor consists in giving the thing a name that belongs to something else; the transference being either from species to genus, or from genus to species, or from species to species, on the grounds of analogy. (Poetics 1457b 6-9)
While his philosophical predecessor Plato condemns the use of figurative speech for its role in rhetorike, “the art of persuasion,” Aristotle recognizes its stylistic merits and provides us with the first systematic analysis of metaphor and its place in literature and the mimetic arts. His briefer descriptions of how metaphors are to be used can be found in Rhetoric and Poetics, while his extended analysis of how metaphor operates within the context of language as a whole can be inferred by reading On Interpretation together with Metaphysics. The descriptive use of metaphor can be understood as an extension of its meaning; the term derives from the Greek metaphora, from metaphero, meaning “to transfer or carry over.” Thus, the figurative trope emerges from a movement of substitution, involving the transference of a word to a new sense, one which compares or juxtaposes seemingly unrelated subjects. For example, in Shakespeare’s Sonnet 73:
In me thou seest the glowing of such fire,
That on the ashes of his youth doth lie…
The narrator directly transfers and applies the “dying ember” image in a new “foreign” sense: his own awareness of his waning youth.
This is Aristotle’s contribution to the standard substitution model of metaphor. It is to be understood as a linguistic device, widely applied but remaining within the confines of rhetoric and poetry. Though it does play a central role in social persuasion, metaphor, restricted by the mechanics of similarity and substitution, does not carry with it any speculative or philosophical importance. Metaphors may point out underlying similarities between objects and their descriptive categories, and may instruct through adding liveliness and elegance to speech, but they do not refer, in the strong sense, to a form of propositional knowledge.
The formal structure of substitution operates in the following manner: the first subject or entity under description in one context is characterized as equivalent in some way to the second entity derived from another context; it is either implied or stated that the first entity “is” the second entity in some way. The metaphorical attribution occurs when certain select properties from the second entity are imposed on the first in order to characterize it in some distinctive way. Metaphor relies on pre-existing categories which classify objects and their properties; these categories guide the ascription of predicates to objects, and since metaphor may entail a kind of violation of this order, it cannot itself refer to a “real” class of existing objects or the relations between them. Similarly, in poetry, metaphor serves not as a foundation for knowledge, but as a tool for mimesis or artistic imitation, representing the actions in epic tragedy or mythos in order to move and instruct the emotions of the audience for the purpose of catharsis.
Aristotle’s theory and its significance for philosophy can only be fully understood in terms of the wider context of denotation and reference which supports the classical realist epistemology. Metaphor is found within his taxonomy of speech forms; additionally, simile is subordinate to metaphor and both are figures of speech falling under the rubric of lexis/diction, which itself is composed of individual linguistic units or noun-names and verbs. Lexis operates within the unity of logos, meaning that the uses of various forms of speech must conform to the overall unity of language and reason, held together by categorical structures of being found in Aristotle’s metaphysics.
As a result of Aristotle’s combined thinking in these works, it turns out that the ostensive function of naming individual objects (“this” name standing for “this object” or property) allows for the clear demarcation between the literal and figurative meanings for names. Thus, the noun-name can work as a signifier of meaning in two domains, the literal and the non-literal. However, there remains an unresolved problem: the categorical nature of the boundary between literal and figurative domains will be a point of contention for many contemporary critiques of the theory coming from phenomenological philosophy.
Furthermore, the denotative theory has served in support of the referential function of language, one which assumes a system of methodological connections between language, sense perceptions, mental states, and the external world. The referential relation between language and its objects serves the correspondence theory of truth, in that the truth-bearing capacity of language corresponds to valid perception and cognition of the external world. The theory assumes that these sets of correspondences allow for the consistent and reliable relation of reference between words, images, and objects.
Aristotle accounts for this kind of correspondence in the following way: sense perceptions’s pathemata give rise to the psychological states in which object representations are formed. These states are actually likenesses (isomorphisms) of the external objects. Thus, names for things refer to the things themselves, mental representations of those things, and to the class-based meanings.
If, as Aristotle assumes, the meaning of metaphor rests on the level of the noun-name, its distinguishing feature lies in its deviation, a “something which happens” to the noun/name by virtue of a transfer (epiphora) of meaning. Here, Aristotle creates a metaphor (based on physical movement) in order to explain metaphor. The term “phora” refers to a change in location from one place to another, to which is added the prefix “epi:” epiphora refers then to the transfer of the common proper name of the thing to the new, unfamiliar, alien (allotrios) place or object. Furthermore, the transference (or substitution), borrowing as it does the alien name for the thing, does not disrupt the overall unity of meaning or logical order of correspondence within the denotative system; all such movement remains within the classifications of genus and species.
The metaphoric transfer of meaning will become a significant point of debate and speculation in later philosophical discussions. Although Aristotle himself does not explore the latent philosophical questions in his own theory, subsequent philosophers of language have over the years recast these issues, exploring the challenges to meaning, reference, and correspondence that present themselves in the substitution theory. What happens, on these various levels, when we substitute one object or descriptor of a “natural kind,” to a foreign object domain? It may the be the case that metaphorical transference calls into question the limits of all meaning-bearing categories, and in turn, the manner in which words can be said to “refer” to specific objects and their attributes. By virtue of the epiphoric movement, species and genus attributes of disparate objects fall into relations of kinship, opposition, or deviation among the various ontological categories. These relations allow for the metaphoric novelty which will subsequently fuel the development of alternative theories, those which view as fundamental to our cognitive or conceptual processes. At this point the analysis of metaphor opens up the philosophical space for further debate and interpretation.
In any theory of metaphor, there are significant philosophical implications for the transfer of meaning from one object-domain or context of associations to another. The metaphor, unlike its sister-trope the analogy, creates a new form of predication, suggesting that one category or class of objects (with certain characteristics) can be projected onto another separate class of entities; this projection may require a blurring of the ontological and epistemological distinctions between the kinds of objects that can be said to exist, either in the mind or in the external world. Returning to the Shakespearean metaphor above, what are the criteria that we use to determine whether a dying ember aptly fits the state of the narrator’s consciousness? What are the perceptual and ontological connections between fire and human existence? The first problem lies in how we are to explain the initial “fit” between any predicate category and its objects. Another problem comes to the forefront when we try to account for how metaphors enable us to think in new ways. If we are to move beyond the standard substitution model, we are compelled to investigate the specific mental operations that enable us to create metaphoric representations; we need to elaborate upon the processes which connect particular external objects (and their properties) given to sensory experience to linguistic signs “referring” to a new kind of object, knowledge context, or domain of experience.
According to the standard model, a metaphor’s ability to signify is restricted by ordinary denotation. The metaphor, understood as a new name, is conceived as a function of individual terms, rather than sentences or wider forms of discourse (narratives, texts). As Continental phenomenology develops in the late 19th and 20th centuries, we are presented with radically alternative theories which obscure strict boundaries between the literal and the figurative, disrupting the connections between perception, language, and thought. Namely, the phenomenological, interactionist, and cognitive treatments of metaphor defend the view that metaphorical language and symbol serve as indirect routes to novel ways of knowing and describing human experience. In their own ways, these theories will call into question the validity and usefulness of correspondence and reference, especially in theoretical disciplines such as philosophy, theology, literature, and science.
Although this article largely focuses on explicating phenomenological theories of metaphor, it should be noted that in all three theories mentioned above, metaphor is displaced from its formerly secondary position in substitution theory to occupying the front and center of our cognitive capabilities. Understood as the product of intentional structures in the mind, metaphor now becomes conceptual, rather than merely ornamental, acting as a conduit through which we take apart and re-assemble the concepts we use to describe the varieties and nuances of experience. They all share in the assumption that metaphors suggest, posit, or disclose similarities between objects and domains of experience (where there seem to be none), without explicitly recognizing that a comparison is being made between two sometimes very different kinds of things or events. These theories, when applied to our original metaphor (“in me thou seest…”) contend that at times, there need not be any explicit similarity between states of awareness or existence as “fire” or “ashes”.
In Nietzsche’s thought we see an early turning away from the substitution theory and its reliance on the correspondence theory of truth, denotation, and reference. His description of metaphor takes us back to its primordial “precognitive” or ontological origins; Nietzsche acts here as a pre-cursor to later developments, yet in itself his analysis offers a compelling account of the power of metaphor. Though his remarks on metaphor are somewhat scattered, they can be found in the early writings of 1872-74, Nachgelassene Fragmente, and “On Truth and Lie in an Extra-Moral Sense” (see W. Kaufman’s translation in The Portable Nietzsche). Together with the “Rhetorik” lectures, these writings argue for a genealogical explanation of the conceptual, displacing traditional philosophical categories into the metaphorical realm. In doing so, he deconstructs our conventional reliance on the idea that meaningful language must reflect a system of logical correspondences.
With correspondence, we can only assume we are in possession of the truth when our representations or ideas about the world “match up” with external states of affairs. We have already seen how Aristotle’s system of first-order predication supports correspondence, as it is enabled through the denotative ascription of predicates/categorical features of /to objects. But Nietzsche boldly suggests that we are, from the outset, already in metaphor and he works from this starting point. The concepts and judgments we use to describe reality do not flatly reflect pre-existing similarities or causal relationships between themselves and our physical intuitions about reality, they are themselves metaphorical constructions; that is, they are creative forms of differentiation emerging out of a deeper undifferentiated primordiality of being. The truth of the world is more closely reflected in the Dionysian level of pure aesthetic immersion into an “undecipherable” innermost essence of things.
Even in his early work, The Birth of Tragedy, Nietzsche rejects the long-held assumption that truth is an ordering of concepts expressed through rigid linguistic categories, putting forth the alternative view which gives primacy to symbol as the purest, most elemental form of representation. That which is and must be expressed is produced organically, out of the flux of nature and yielding a “becoming” rather than being.
In the Dionysian dithyramb man is incited to the greatest exaltation of all his symbolic faculties; something never before experienced struggles for utterance—the annihilation of the veil of maya, … oneness as the soul of the race and of nature itself. The essence of nature is now to be expressed symbolically; we need a new world of symbols.… (BOT Ch. 2)
Here, following Schopenhauer, he reverses Aristotelian transference of concept-categories from the literal to the figurative, and makes the figurative the original mode for representation of experience. The class terms “species” and “genus”, based in Aristotle and so important in classical and medieval epistemology, only appear to originate and validate themselves in “dialectics and through scientific reflection.” For Nietzsche, the categories hide their real nature, abiding as frozen metaphors which reflect previously experienced levels of natural experience metaphorically represented in our consciousness. They emerge through construction indirectly based in vague images or names for things, willed into being out of the unnamed flowing elements of biological existence. Even Thales the pre-Socratic, we are reminded, in his attempt to give identity to the underlying unity of all things, falls back on a conceptualization of it as water without realizing he is using a metaphor.
Once we construct and begin to apply our concepts, their metaphorical origins are forgotten or concealed from ordinary awareness. This theoretical process is but another attempt to restore “the also-forgotten” original unity of being. The layering of metaphors, the archeological ancestors of concepts, is specifically linked to our immediate experiential capacity to transcend the proper and the individual levels of experience and linguistic signs. We cannot, argues Nietzsche, construct metaphors without breaking out of the confines of singularity, thus we must reject the artificiality of designating separate names for separate things. To assume that an individual name would completely and transparently describe its referent (in perception) is to also assume that language and external experience mirror one another in some perfect way. It is rather the case that language transfers meaning from place to place. The terms metapherein and Übertragung are equivalently applied here; if external experience is in constant flux, it is not possible to reduplicate exact and individual meanings. To re-describe things through metaphor is to “leave out” and “carry-over” meaning, to undergo a kind of dispossession of self, thing, place, and time and an overcoming of both individualisms and dualities. Thus the meaningful expression of the real is seen and experienced most directly in the endlessly creative activity of art and music, rather than philosophy.
Versions of Nietzsche’s “metaphorization” of thought will reappear in the Continental philosophers described below; those who owe their phenomenological attitudes to Husserl, but disagree with his transcendental idealization of meaning, one which demands that we somehow separate the world of experience from the essential meanings of objects in that world. Taken together, these philosophers call into question the position that truth entails a relationship of correspondence between dual aspects of reality, one internal to our minds and the other external. We consider Heidegger, Ricoeur, and Derrida as the primary examples. For Heidegger, metaphoric language signals a totality or field of significance in which being discloses or reveals itself. Ricoeur’s work, in turn, builds upon aspects of Heidegger’s ontological hermeneutics, explicating how it is the case that metaphors drive speculative reflection. In Ricoeur’s model, the literal level is subverted, and metaphoric language and symbols containing “semantic kernels” create structures of double reference in all figurative forms of discourse. These structures point beyond themselves in symbols and texts, serving as mediums which reveal new worlds of meaning and existential possibilities.
French philosopher Jacques Derrida, on the other hand, reiterates the Nietzschean position; metaphor does not subvert metaphysics, but rather is itself the hidden source of all conceptual structures.
Edmund Husserl’s phenomenological method laid the groundwork, in the early 20th century, for what would eventually take shape in the phenomenological philosophies of Martin Heidegger, Maurice Merleau-Ponty, and Jean-Paul Sartre. Husserl’s early work provides the foundation for exploring how these modes of presentation convey the actual meaningful contents of experience. He means to address here the former distinction made by Kant between the phenomenal appearances of the real (to consciousness) and the noumenal reality of the things-in-themselves. Husserl, broadly speaking, seeks to resolve not only what some see as a problematic dualism in Kant, but also some philosophical problems that accompany Hegel’s constructivist phenomenology.
Taken in its entirety, Husserl’s project demonstrates a major shift in the 20th century phenomenology, seeking a rigorous method for the description and analysis of consciousness and the contents given to it. He intends his method to be the scientific grounding for philosophy; it is to be a critique of psychologism and a return to a universal knowledge of “the things themselves,” those intelligible objects apprehended by and given to consciousness.
In applying this method we seek, Husserl argues, a scientific foundation for universally objective knowledge; adhering to the “pure description” of phenomena given to consciousness through the perception of objects. If those objects are knowable, it is because they are immediate in conscious experience. It is through the thorough description of these objects as they appear to us in terms of color, shape, and so forth, that we apprehend that which is essential – what we call “essences” or meanings. Here, the act of description is a method for avoiding a metaphysical trap: that of imposing these essences or object meanings onto the contents of mental experience. Noesis, for Husserl, achieves its aim by including within itself (giving an account of) the role that context or horizon plays in delineating possible objects for experience. This will have important implications for later phenomenological theories of metaphor, in that metaphors may be said intend new figurative contexts in which being appears to us in new ways.
In Ideen (30), Husserl explains how such a horizon or domain of experience presents a set of criteria for us to apply. We choose and identify an object as a single member of a class of objects, and so these regions of subjective experience, also called regions of phenomena, circumscribe certain totalities or generic unities to which concrete items belong. In order to understand the phenomenological approach to meaning-making, it is first necessary to clarify what we mean by “phenomenological description,” as it is described in Logical Investigations. Drawing upon the work of Brentano and Meinong, Husserl develops a set of necessary structural relations between the knower (ego), the objects of experience, and the horizon within which those objects are given. The relation is characterized in an axiomatic manner as intentionality, where the subjective consciousness and its objects are correlates brought together in a psychological act. Subjectivity contributes to and makes possible cognition; specifically, it must be the case that perception and cognition are always about something given in the stream of consciousness, they are only possible because consciousness intends or refers to these immanent objects. As we shall presently see, the intentional nature of consciousness applies to Ricoeur’s hermeneutics of the understanding, bestowing metaphor with a special ability to expand (to nearly undermining) the structure of reference in a non-literal sense to an existential state.
Husserl’s stage like development of phenomenology unveils the structure of intentionality as derived from the careful description of certain mental acts. Communicable linguistic expressions, such as names and sentences, exist only in so far as they exhibit intentional meanings for speakers. Written or spoken expressions only carry references to objects because they have meanings for speakers and knowers. If we examine all of our mental perceptions, we find it impossible to think without intending an object of some sort. Both Continental and Anglo-American thinkers agree that metaphor holds the key to understanding these processes, as it re-organizes our senses of perception, temporality, and relation of subject to object, referring to these as subjects of existential concern and possibility.
Heidegger, building upon the phenomenological thematic, asserts that philosophical analysis should keep to careful description of the human encounter with the world, revealing the modes in which being is existentially or relationally given. This signals both a nod to and departure from Husserl, leading to a rethinking of phenomenology which replaces the theoretical apprehension of meaning with an “uncovering” of being as it is lived out in experiential contexts or horizons. Later, Ricoeur will draw on Heidegger’s “existentialized” intentionality as he characterizes the referential power of metaphors to signal those meanings waiting to be “uncovered’ by Dasein’s (human as being-there) experience of itself – in relation to others, and to alternate worlds of possibility.
As his student, Heidegger owes to Husserl the phenomenological intent to capture “the things themselves” (die Sachen selbst), however, the Heideggerian project outlined in Being and Time rejects the attempt to establish phenomenology as a science of the structures of consciousness and reforms it in ontologically disclosive or manifestational terms. Heidegger’s strong attraction to the hermeneutic tradition in part originates in his dialogue with Wilhem Dilthey, the 19th century thinker who stressed the importance of historical consciousness attitude in guiding the work of the social sciences and hermeneutics, directed toward the understanding of primordial experience. Dilthey’s influence on Heidegger and Ricoeur (as well as Gadamer) is evident, in that all recognize the historical life of humans as apprehended in the study of the text (a form of spirit), particularly those containing metaphors and narratives conveying a lived, concrete experience of religious life.
Heidegger rejects the notion that the structures of consciousness are internally maintained as transcendentally subjective and also directed towards their transcendental object. Phenomenology must now be tied to the problems of human existence, and must then direct itself immediately towards the lived world and allow this “beholding” of the world to guide the work of “its own uncovering.”
Heidegger argues for a return to the original Greek definitions of the terms phainonmenon (derived from phainesthai, or “that which shows itself”) and logos. Heidegger adopts these terms for his own purposes, utilizing them to reinforce the dependence of ontological disclosure or presence: those beings showing themselves or letting themselves be “seen-as.” The pursuit of aletheia, (“truth as recovering of the forgotten aspects of being”) is now fulfilled through adherence to a method of self-interpretation achieved from the standpoint of Dasein’s (humanity’s) subjectivity, which has come to replace the transcendental ego of Kant and Husserl.
The turn to language, in this case, must be more than simple communication between persons; it is a primordial feature of subjectivity. Language is to be the interpretive medium of the understanding through which all forms of being present themselves to subjective apprehension. In this way, Heidegger replaces the transcendental version of phenomenology with the disclosive, where the structure of interpretation provides further insight into his ontological purposes of the understanding.
The linguistic turn in phenomenology has been most directly applied to metaphor in the works of Paul Ricoeur, who revisits Husserlian and Heideggerian themes in his extensive treatment of metaphor. He extends his analysis of metaphor into a fully developed discursive theory of symbol, focusing on those found in religious texts and sacred narratives. His own views follow from what he thinks are overly limited structuralist theories of symbol, which, in essence, do not provide a theory of linguistic reference useful for his own hermeneutic project. For Ricoeur, a proper theory of metaphor understands it to be “a re-appropriation of our effort to exist,” echoing Nietszche’s call to go back to the primordiality of being. Metaphor must then include the notion that such language is expressive and constitutive of the being of those who embark on philosophical reflection.
Much of Ricoeur’s thought can be characterized by his well-known statement “the symbol gives rise to the thought.” Ricoeur shares Heidegger’s and Husserl’s assumptions: we reflectively apprehend or grasp the structures of human experience as they are presented to temporalized subjective consciousness While the “pure” phenomenology of Husserl seeks a transparent description of experience as it is lived out in phases or moments, Ricoeur, also following Nietzsche, centers the creation of meaning in the existential context. The noetic act originates in the encounter with a living text, constituting “a horizon of possibilities,” for the meaning of existence, thus abandoning the search for essences internal to the objects we experience in the world.
His foundational work in The Symbolism of Evil and The Rule of Metaphor places the route to human understanding concretely, via symbolic expressions which allow for the phenomenological constitution, reflection, and re-appropriation of experience. These processes are enabled by the structure of “seeing-as,” adding to Heidegger’s insight with the metaphoric acting as a “refiguring” of that which is given to consciousness. At various points he enters into conversation with Max Black and Nelson Goodman, among others, who also recognize the cognitive contributions to science and art found in the models and metaphors. In Ricoeur’s case, sacred metaphors display the same second-order functions shared by those in the arts and sciences, but with a distinctively ontological emphasis: “the interpretation of symbols is worthy of being called a hermeneutics only insofar as it is a part of self-understanding and of the understanding of being” (COI 30).
In The Rule of Metaphor, Ricoeur, departing from Aristotle, locates the signifying power of metaphor primarily at the level of the sentence, not individual terms. Metaphor is to be understood as a discursive linguistic act which achieves its purpose through extended predication rather than simple substitution of names. Ricoeur, like so many language philosophers, argues that Aristotelian substitution is incomplete; it does not go far enough in accounting for the semantic, syntactic, logical, and ontological issues that accompany the creation of a metaphor. The standard substitution model cannot do justice to potential for metaphor create meaning by working in tandem with propositional thought-structures (sentences). To these ends, Ricoeur’s study in The Rule of Metaphor replaces substitution and strict denotative theories with a theory of language that works through a structure of double reference.
Taking his lead while diverging from Aristotle, Ricoeur reads the metaphorical transfer of a name as a kind of “category mistake” which produces an imaginative construction about the new way objects may be related to one another. He expands this dynamic of “meaning transfer” on to the level of the sentence, then text, enabling the production of a second-order discursive level of thinking whereby all forms of symbolic language become phenomenological disclosures of being.
The discussion begins with the linguistic movement of epiphora (transfer of names-predicates) taken from an example in Poetics. A central dynamic exists in transposing one term, with one set of meaning-associations onto another. Citing Aristotle’s own example of “sowing around a god-created flame,”
If A = light of the sun, B = action of the sun, C = grain, and D = sowing, then
B is to A, as D is to C
We see action of the sun is to light as sowing is to grain, however, B is a vague action term (sun’s action) which is both missing and implied; Ricoeur calls this a “nameless act” which establishes a similar relation to the object, sunlight, as sowing is to the grain. In this act the phenomenological space for the creation of new meaning is opened up, precisely because we cannot find a conventional word to take the place of a metaphorical word. The nameless act implies that the transfer of an alien name entails more than a simple substitution of concepts, and is therefore said to be logically disruptive.
The “nameless act” entails a kind of “cognitive leap:’’ since there is no conventional term for B, the act does not involve substituting a decorative term in its place. Rather, a new meaning association has been created through the semantic gap between the objects. The absence of the original literal term, the “semantic void”, cannot be filled without the creation of a metaphor which signals the larger discursive context of the sentence and eventually, the text. If, as above, the transfer of predicates (the sowing of grain as casting of flames) challenges the “rules” of meaning dictated by ostensive theory, we are forced to make a new connection where there was none, between the conventional and metaphorical names for the object. For Ricoeur, the figurative (sowing around a flame) acts as hermeneutic medium in that it negates and displaces the original term, signifying a “new kind of object” which is in fact a new form (logos) of being. The metaphorical statement allows us to say that an object is and is not what we usually call it. The sense-based aspect is then “divorced” from predication and subsequently, logos is emptied of its objective meaning; the new object may be meaningful but not clear under the conditions of strict denotation or natural knowledge.
We take note that the “new object” (theoretically speaking) has more than figurative existence; the newly formed subject-predicate relation places the copula at the center of the name-object (ROM 18). Ricoeur’s objective is to create a dialectically driven process which produces a new ‘object-domain’ or category of being. Following the movement of the Hegelian Aufhebung, (through the aforementioned negation and displacement) the new name has opened up a new field of meaning to be re-appropriated into our reflective consciousness. This is how Ricoeur deconstructs first-order reference in order to develop an ontology of sacred language based on second-order reference.
We are led to the view that myths are modes of discourse whose meanings are phenomenological spaces of openness, creating a nearly infinite range of interpretations. Thus we see how metaphor enables being, as Aristotle notes, to “be said in many ways.”
Ricoeur argues that second-order discursivity “violates” the pre-existing first order of genus and species, in turn causing a kind of upheaval among further relations and rules set by the categories: namely subordination, coordination, proportionality or equality among object properties. Something of a unity of being remains, yet for Ricoeur this non-generic unity or enchainement, corresponds to a single generic context referring to “Being,” restricting the senses or applications of transferred predicates in the metaphoric context.
The notion of a “non-generic unity” raises, perhaps, more philosophical problems than it answers. How are we to explain the mechanics which blend descriptors from one object domain and its sets of perceptions, to a domain of foreign objects? Ricoeur addresses the epistemic issues surrounding the transfer of names from one category to another in spatiotemporal experience by importing Kant’s theory of object construction, found in the Critique of Pure Reason. In the “Transcendental Schematism”, Kant establishes the objective validity of the conceptual categories we use to synthesize the contents of experience. In this section, Kant elevates the Aristotelian categories from grammatical principles to formal structures intrinsic to reason. Here, he identifies an essential problem for knowledge: how are we to conceive a relationship between these pure concept-categories of the understanding and the sensible objects given to us in space and time? With the introduction of the schematism, Kant seeks a resolution to the various issues inherent to the construction of mental representations (a position shared by contemporary cognitive scientists; see below). For Ricoeur, this serves to answer the problem of how metaphoric representations of reality can actually “refer” to reality (even if only at the existential level of experience).
Kant states “the Schematism” is a “sensible condition under which alone pure concepts of the understanding can be employed” (CPR/A 136). Though the doctrine is sometimes said to be notoriously confusing due to its circular nature, the schemata are meant as a distinctive set of mediating representations, rules, or operators in the mind which themselves display the universal and necessary characteristics of sensible objects; these characteristics are in turn synthesized and unified by the activity of the transcendental imagination.
In plainer terms, the schematic function is used by the imagination to guide it in the construction of images. It does not seem to be any kind of picture of an object, but rather the “form” or “listing” of how we produce the picture. For Ricoeur, the schematism lends the structural support for assigning an actual truth-value or cognitive contribution to the semantic innovation produced by metaphor. The construction of new meaning via new forms of predication entails a re-organization and re-interpretation of pre-existing forms, and the operations of the productive imagination enable the entire process.
In the work Figuring the Sacred, for example, Ricoeur, answering to his contemporary Mircea Eliade ( The Sacred and The Profane), moves metaphor beyond the natural “boundedness” of myths and symbols. While these manifest meaning, they are still constrained in that they must mirror the natural cosmic order of things. Metaphor, on the other hand, occupies the center of a “hermeneutic of proclamation;” it has the power to proclaim because it is a “free invention of discourse.” Ricoeur specifically explicates biblical parables, proverbs, and eschatological statements as extended metaphorical processes. Thus, “The Kingdom of God will not come with signs that you can observe. Do not say, ‘It is here; it is there.’ Behold the kingdom of God is among you” (Luke 17:20-21). This saying creates meaning by breaking down our ordinary or familiar temporal frameworks applied to interpretation of signs (of the kingdom). The quest for signs is, according to Ricoeur, “overthrown” for the sake of “a completely new existential signification” (FS 59).
This discussion follows from the earlier work in The Rule of Metaphor, where the mechanics of representation behind this linguistic act of “re-description” are further developed. The act points us towards a novel ontological domain of human possibility, enabled through new cognitive content. The linguistic act of creating a metaphor in essence becomes a hermeneutic act directed towards a gap which must be bridged, that between the abstract (considerations of reflection) understanding (Verstehen) and the finite living out of life. In this way Ricoeur’s theory, often contrasted with that of Derrida, takes metaphor beyond the mechanics of substitution.
In general, Derrida’s deconstructive philosophy can be read as a radically alternative way of reading philosophical texts and arguments, viewing them in a novel way through the lens of a rhetorical methodology. This will amount to the taking apart of established ways in which philosophers define perception, concept formation, meaning, and reference.
Derrida, from the outset, will call into question the assumption that the formation of concepts (logos) somehow escapes the primordiality of language and the fundamentally metaphorical-mythical nature of philosophical discourse. In a move which goes much further than Ricoeur, Derrida argues for what Guiseseppe Stellardi so aptly calls the “reverse metaphorization of concepts.” The reversal is such that there can be no final separation between the linguistic-metaphorical and the philosophical realms. These domains are co-constitutive of one another, in the sense that either one cannot be fully theorized or made to fully or transparently explain the meaning of the other. The result is that language acquires a certain obscurity, ascendancy, and autonomy. It will permanently elude our attempts to fix its meaning-making activity in foundational terms which necessitate a transcendent or externalized (to language) unified being.
Derrida’s White Mythology offers a penetrating critique of the common paradigm involving the nature of concepts, posing the following questions: “Is there metaphor in the text of philosophy, and if so, how?” Here, the history of philosophy is characterized as an economy, a kind of “usury” where meaning and valuation are understood as metaphorical processes involving “gain and loss.” The process is represented through Derrida’s well-known image of the coin:
I was thinking how the Metaphysicians, when they make a language for themselves, are like … knife-grinders, who instead of knives and scissors, should put medals and coins to the grindstone to efface … the value… When they have worked away till nothing is visible in these crown pieces, neither King Edward, the Emperor William, nor the Republic, they say: ‘These pieces have nothing either English, German, or French about them; we have freed them from all limits of time and space; they are not worth five shillings any more ; they are of inestimable value, and their exchange value is extended indefinitely.’ (WM 210).
The “usury” of the sign (the coin) signifies the passage from the physical to the metaphysical. Abstractions now become “worn out” metaphors; they seem like defaced coins, their original, finite values now replaced by a vague or rough idea of the meaning-images that may have been present in the originals.
Such is the movement which simultaneously creates and masks the construction of concepts. Concepts, whose real origins have been forgotten, now only yield an empty sort of philosophical promise – that of “the absolute”, the universalized, unlimited “surplus value” achieved by the eradication of the sensory or momentarily given. Derrida reads this process along a negative Hegelian line: the metaphysicians are most attracted to “concepts in the negative, ab-solute, in-finite, non-Being” (WM 121). That is, their love of the most abstract concept, made that way “by long and universal use”, reveals a preference for the construction of a metaphysics of Being. This is made possible via the movement of the Hegelian Aufhebung. The German term refers to a dynamic of sublation where the dialectical, progressive movement of consciousness overcomes and subsumes the particular, concrete singularities of experience through successive moments of cognition. Derrida levels a strong criticism against Hegel’s attempts to overcome difference, arguing that consciousness as understood by Hegel takes on the quality of building an oppressive sort of narrative, subsuming the particular and the momentary under an artificial theoretical gaze. Derrida prefers giving theoretical privilege to the negative; that is, to the systematic negation of all finite determinations of meaning derived from particular aspects of particular beings.
Echoing Heidegger, Derrida conceives of metaphysical constructs as indicative of the Western “logocentric epoch” in philosophy. They depend for their existence on the machinery of binary logic. They remain static due to our adherence to the meaning of ousia (essence), the definition of being based on self-identitical substance, which can only be predicated or expressed in either/or terms. Reference to being, in this case, is constrained within the field of the proper and univocal. Both Heidegger and Derrida, and to some degree Ricoeur seek to free reference from these constraints. Unlike Heidegger, however, Derrida does not work from the assumption that being indicates some unified primordial reality.
For Derrida, there lies hidden within the merely apparent logical unity (with its attendant binary oppositions) or logocentricity of consciousness a white mythology, masking the primitive plurivocity of being which eludes all attempts to name it. Here we find traces of lost meanings, reminiscent of the lost inscriptions on coins. These are “philosophemes,” words, tropes or modes of figuration which do not express ideas or abstract representations of things (grounded in categories), but rather invoke a radically plurivocal notion of meaning. Having thus dismantled the logic of either/or with difference (difference), Derrida gives priority to ambiguity, in “both/and” and “neither/nor” modes of thought and expression. Meaning must then be constituted of and by difference, rather than identity, for difference subverts all preconceived theoretical or ontological structures. It is articulated in the context of all linguistic relations and involves ongoing displacement of a final idealized and unified form of meaning; such displacement reveals through hints and traces, the reality and experience of a disruptive alterity in meaning and being. Alterity is “always already there” by virtue of the presence of the Other.
With the introduction of “the white mythology,” Derrida’s alignment with Nietszche creates a strong opposition to traditional Western theoria. Forms of abstract ideation and theoretical systems representing the oppressive consciousness of the “white man,” built in the name of reason/logos, are in themselves a collection of analogies, existing as colorless dead metaphors whose primitive origins lie in the figurative realms of myths, symbol, and fable.
Derrida’s project, resulting as it does in the deconstruction of metaphysics, runs counter to Ricoeur’s tensive theory. In contrast to Heidegger’s restrained criticism Derrida’s deconstruction appears to Ricoeur “unbounded.” That is, Ricoeur still assumes a distinction between the speculative and the poetic, where the poetic “drives the speculative” to explicate a surplus of meaning. The surplus, or plurivocity is problematic from Derrida’s standpoint. The latter argues that the theory remains logocentric in that it remains true to the binary mode of identity and difference which underlie metaphysical distinctions such as “being and non-being.” For Ricoeur, metaphors create a new space for meaning based on the tension between that which is (can be properly predicated of an object) and that which “is not” (which cannot be predicated of an object). Derrida begs to differ: in the final analysis, there can be no such separation, systematic philosophical theory or set of conceptual structures through which we subsume and “explain” the cognitive or existential value of metaphor.
Derrida’s reverse metaphorization of concepts does not support a plurivocal characterization of meaning and being, it does not posit a wider referential field; for Derrida metaphors and concepts remain in a complex, always ambiguous relation to one another. Thus he seems to do away with “reference,” or the distinction between signifier and signified, moving even beyond polysemy (the many potential meaning that words carry). The point here is to preserve the flux of sense and the ongoing dissemination of meaning and otherness.
The dispute between Ricoeur and Derrida regarding the referential power of metaphor lies in where they position themselves with regard to Aristotle. Ricoeur’s position, in giving priority to the noun-phrase instead of the singular name, challenges Aristotle while still appealing to the original taxonomy (categories) of being based on an architectonic system of predication. For Ricoeur, metaphoric signification mimics the fundamentally equivocal nature of being—we cannot escape the ontological implications of Aristotle’s statement: being can be “said in many ways.” Nevertheless, Ricoeur maintains the distinction between mythos and logos, for we need the tools provided by speculative discourse to explain the polysemic value of metaphors.
Derrida’s deconstruction reaches back to dismantle Aristotle’s theory, rooted as it is in the ontology of the proper name/noun (onoma) which signifies a thing as self-identical being (homousion). This, states Derrida, “reassembles and reflects the culture of the West; the white man takes his own mythology, Indo-European mythology, his own logos, that is, the mythos of his idiom, for the universal form of that he must still wish to call Reason” (WM 213).
The original theory makes metaphor yet another link in the logocentric chain—a form of metaphysical oppression. If the value of metaphor is restricted to the transference of names, then metaphor entails a loss or negation of the literal which is still under the confines of a notion of discourse which upholds the traditional formulations of representation and reference in terms of the mimetic and the “proper” which are, in turn, based on a theory of perception (and an attendant metaphysics) that gives priority to resemblance, identity, or what we can call “the law of the same.”
Contemporary phenomenological theories of metaphor directly challenge the straightforward theory of reference, replacing the ordinary propositional truth based on denotation with a theory of language which designates and discloses its referents. These interactionist theories carry certain Neo-Kantian features, particularly in the work of the analytic philosophers Nelson Goodman and Max Black. They posit the view that metaphors can reorganize the connections we make between our perceptions of the world. Their theories reflect certain phenomenological assumptions about the ways in which figurative language expands the referential field, allowing for the creation of novel meanings and creating new possibilities for constructing models of reality; in moving between the realms of art and science, metaphors have an interdisciplinary utility. Both Goodman and Black continue to challenge the traditional theory of linguistic reference, offering instead the argument that reference is enabled by the manipulation of predicates in figurative modes of thinking through language.
Recent studies underscore the connections between metaphors, mapping, and schematizing aspects of cognitive organization in mental life. Husserl’s approach to cognition took an anti-naturalist stance, opposed to defining consciousness as an objective entity and therefore unsuited to studying the workings of subjective consciousness; instead his phenomenological stance gave priority to subjectivity, since it constitutes the necessary set of pre-conditions for knowing anything at all as an object or a meaning. Recently, the trend has been renewed and phenomenology has made some productive inroads into the examination of connectionist and embodied approaches to perception, cognition and other sorts of dynamic and adaptive (biological) systems.
Zahavi and Thompson, for example, see strong links between Husserlian phenomenology and philosophy of mind with respect to the phenomena of consciousness, where the constitutive nature of subjective consciousness is clarified specifically in terms of the forms and relations of different kinds of intentional mental states. These involve the unity of temporal experience, the structural relations between intentional mental acts and their objects, and the inherently embodied nature of cognition. Those who study the embodied mind do not all operate in agreement with traditional phenomenological assumptions and methods. Nevertheless, some “naturalized” versions in the field of consciousness studies are now gaining ground, offering viable solutions to the kind of problematic Cartesian dualistic metaphysics that Husserl’s phenomenology suggests.
In recent years, the expanding field of cognitive science has explored the role of metaphor in the formation of consciousness (cognition and perception). In a general sense, it appears that contemporary cognitivist, constructivist, and systems (as in self-organizing) approaches to the study of mind incorporate metaphor as a tool for developing an anti-metaphysical, anti-positivist theory of mind, in an attempt to reject any residual Cartesian and Kantian psychologies. The cognitive theories, however, remain partially in debt to Kantian schematism and its role in cognition.
There is furthermore in these theories an overturning of any remaining structuralist suppositions (that language and meaning might be based on autonomous configurations of syntactic elements). Many cognitive scientists, in disagreement with Chomsky’s generative grammar, study meaning as a form of cognition that is activated in context of use. Lakoff and Johnson, in Philosophy in the Flesh, find a great deal of empirical evidence for the ways in which metaphors shape our ordinary experience, exploring the largely unconscious perceptual and linguistic processes that allow us to understand one idea or domain of experience, both conceptual and physical, in terms of a “foreign” domain. The research follows the work of Srini Narayanan and Eleanor Rosch, cognitive scientists who also examine schemas and metaphors as key in embodied theories of cognition. Such theories generally trace the connective interplay between our neuronal makeup, or physical interactions with the environment, and our own private and social human purposes.
In a limited sense, the stress on the embodied nature of cognition aligns itself with the phenomenological position. Perceptual systems, built in physical response to determinate spatio-temporal and linguistic contexts, become phenomenological “spaces” shaped through language use. Yet these researchers largely take issue with Continental phenomenology and traditional philosophy in a dramatic and far-reaching way, objecting to the claim that the phenomenological method of introspection makes adequate space for our ability to survey and describe all available fields of consciousness in the observing subject. If it is the case that we do not fully access the far reaches of hidden cognitive processes, much of the metaphorical mapping which underlies cognition takes place at an unconscious level, which is sometimes referred to as “the cognitive unconscious.”(PIF 12-15)
Other philosophers of mind, including Stefano Arduini, and Antonio D’Amasio, work along similar lines in cognitive linguistics, cognitive science, neuroscience, and artificial intelligence. Their work investigates the ways in which metaphors ground various first and second-order cognitive and emotional operations and functions. Their conclusions share insights with the Continental studies conceiving of metaphor as a “refiguring” of experience. There is then some potential for overlap with this cognitive-conceptual version of metaphor, where metaphors and schemata embody emergent transformative categories enabling the creation of new fields of cognition and meaning.
Arduini, in his work, has explored what he calls the “anthropological ability” to build up representations of the world. Here rhetorical figures are realized on the basis of conceptual domains which create the borders of experience. We have access to a kind of reality that would otherwise be indeterminate, for human beings have the ability to conceptualize the world in imaginative terms through myth, symbol, the unconscious, or any expressive sign. For Arduini, figurative activity does not depict the given world, but allows for the ability to construct world images employed in reality. To be figuratively competent is to use the imagination as a tool which puts patterns together in inventive mental processes. Arduini then seems to recall Nieztsche; anthropologically speaking, humans are always engaging in some form of figuration or form of language, which allows for “cognitive competence” in that it chooses among particular forms which serve to define the surrounding contexts or environments. Again, metaphor is foundational to the apprehension of reality; it is part of the pre-reflective or primordial apparatus of experience, perception, and first- through second-order thought, comprising an entire theoretical approach as well as disciplines such as evolutionary anthropology (see Tooby and Cosmides).
The work of Gilles Fauconnier and Mark Turner extends that of Lakoff and Johnson outlined above. For Fauconnier, the task of language is to construct, and for the linguist and cognitive scientist it is “a window into the mind.” Independently and together, Fauconnier and Turner’s collaboration results in a theory of conceptual blending in which metaphorical forms take center stage. Basically, the theory of conceptual blending follows from Lakoff and Johnson’s work on the “mapping” or projective qualities of our cognitive faculties. For example, if we return to take Shakespearean line “in me thou seest the glowing of such fire”, the source is fire, whose sets of associations are projected onto the target – in this case the waning aspect of the narrator. Their research shows that large numbers of such cross-domain mappings are expressed as conceptual structures which have propositional content: for example, “life is fire, loss is extinction of fire.” There exist several categories of mappings across different conceptual domains, including spatio-temporal orientation, movement, and containment. For example: “time flies” or “this relationship is smothering.”
Turner’s work in The Literary Mind, takes a slightly different route, portraying these cognitive mechanisms as forms of “storytelling.” This may, superficially, seem counterintuitive to the ordinary observer, but Turner gives ample evidence for the mind’s ability to do much of its everyday work using various forms of narrative projection (LM 6-9). It is not too far a reach from this version of narrative connection back to the hermeneutic and cognitive-conceptual uses of metaphor outlined earlier. If we understand parables to be essentially forms of extended metaphor, we can clearly see the various ways in which they contribute to the making of intelligible experience.
The study of these mental models sheds light on the phenomenological and hermeneutic aspects of reality-construction. If these heuristic models are necessary to cognitive functioning, it is because they allow us to represent higher-order aspects of reality which involve expressions of human agency, intentionality, and motivation. Though we may be largely unaware of these patterns, they are based on our ability to think in metaphor, are necessary, and are continuously working to enable the structuring of intentional experience – which cannot always be adequately represented by straightforward first-order physical description. Fauconnier states:
We see their status as inventions by contrasting them with alternative representations of the world. When we watch someone sitting down in a chair, we see what physics cannot recognize: an animate agent performing an intentional act. (MTL 19-20)
Turner, along with Fauconnier and Lakoff, connects parabolic thought with the image-schematic or mapping between different domains of encounter with our environments. Fauconnier’s work, correlating here with Turner’s, moves between cognitive-scientific and phenomenological considerations; both depict mapping as a constrained form of projection, a complex mental manipulation which moves across mental structures which correspond to various phenomenological spaces of thought, action, and communication.
Metaphorical mapping allows the mind to cross and conflate several domains of experience. The cross-referencing, reminiscent of Black’s interactionist dynamics, amounts to a form of induction resulting from projected relations between a source structure, a pattern we already understand, onto a target structure, that which we seek to understand.
Mapping as a form of metaphoric construction leads to other forms of blending, conceptual integration, and novel category formation. We can, along with Fauconnier and the rest, describe this emergent evolution of linguistic meaning in dialectical terms, arguing that it is possible to mesh together two images of virus (biological and computational) into a third integrated idea that integrates and expands the meaning of the first two (MTL 22). Philosophically speaking, we seem to have come full circle back to the Hegelian theme which runs through the phenomenological analysis of metaphor as a re-mapping of mind and reality.
The Continental theories of metaphor that have extrapolated and developed variations on the theme expressed in Nietzsche’s apocryphal pronouncement that truth is “a mobile army of metaphors.” The notion that metaphorical language is somehow ontologically and epistemologically prior to ordinary propositional language has since been voiced by Heidegger, Ricoeur, and Derrida. For these thinkers metaphor serves as a foundational heuristic structure, one which is primarily designed to subvert ordinary reference and in some way dismantle the truth-bearing claims of first-order propositional language. Martin Heidegger’s existential phenomenology does away with the assumption that true or meaningful intentional statements reflect epistemic judgments about the world; that is, they do not derive referential efficacy through the assumed correspondence between an internal idea and an external object. While there may be a kind of agreement between our notions of things and the world in which we find those things, it is still a derivative agreement emerging from a deeper ontologically determined set of relations between things-in-the-world, given or presented to us as inherently linked together in particular historical, linguistic, or cultural contexts.
The role of metaphor in perception and cognition also dominates the work of contemporary cognitive scientists, linguists, and those working in the related fields of evolutionary anthropology and computational theory. While the latter may not be directly associated with Continental phenomenology, aspects of their work support an “anti-metaphysical” position and draw upon common phenomenological themes which stress the embodied, linguistic, contextual, and symbolic nature of knowledge. Thinkers and researchers in this camp argue that metaphoric schemas are integral to human reasoning and action, in that they allow us to develop our cognitive and heuristic capacities beyond simple and direct first order experience.
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Last updated: September 14, 2013 | Originally published: