Metaethics is a branch of analytic philosophy that explores the status, foundations, and scope of moral values, properties, and words. Whereas the fields of applied ethics and normative theory focus on what is moral, metaethics focuses on what morality itself is. Just as two people may disagree about the ethics of, for example, physician-assisted suicide, while nonetheless agreeing at the more abstract level of a general normative theory such as Utilitarianism, so too may people who disagree at the level of a general normative theory nonetheless agree about the fundamental existence and status of morality itself, or vice versa. In this way, metaethics may be thought of as a highly abstract way of thinking philosophically about morality. For this reason, metaethics is also occasionally referred to as “second-order” moral theorizing, to distinguish it from the “first-order” level of normative theory.
Metaethical positions may be divided according to how they respond to questions such as the following:
- What exactly are people doing when they use moral words such as “good” and “right”?
- What precisely is a moral value in the first place, and are such values similar to other familiar sorts of entities, such as objects and properties?
- Where do moral values come from—what is their source and foundation?
- Are some things morally right or wrong for all people at all times, or does morality instead vary from person to person, context to context, or culture to culture?
Metaethical positions respond to such questions by examining the semantics of moral discourse, the ontology of moral properties, the significance of anthropological disagreement about moral values and practices, the psychology of how morality affects us as embodied human agents, and the epistemology of how we come to know moral values. The sections below consider these different aspects of metaethics.
Table of Contents
- History of Metaethics
- The Normative Relevance of Metaethics
- Semantic Issues in Metaethics
- Ontological Issues in Metaethics
- Psychology and Metaethics
- Epistemological Issues in Metaethics
- Anthropological Considerations
- Political Implications of Metaethics
- References and Further Reading
Although the word “metaethics” (more commonly “meta-ethics” among British and Australian philosophers) was coined in the early part of the twentieth century, the basic philosophical concern regarding the status and foundations of moral language, properties, and judgments goes back to the very beginnings of philosophy. Several characters in Plato’s dialogues, for instance, arguably represent metaethical stances familiar to philosophers today: Callicles in Plato’s Gorgias (482c-486d) advances the thesis that Nature does not recognize moral distinctions, and that such distinctions are solely constructions of human convention; and Thrasymachus in Plato’s Republic (336b-354c) advocates a type of metaethical nihilism by defending the view that justice is nothing above and beyond whatever the strong say that it is. Socrates’ defense of the separation of divine commands from moral values in Plato’s Euthyphro (10c-12e) is also a forerunner of modern metaethical debates regarding the secular foundation of moral values. Aristotle’s grounding of virtue and happiness in the biological and political nature of humans (in Book One of his Nicomachean Ethics) has also been examined from the perspective of contemporary metaethics (compare, MacIntyre 1984; Heinaman 1995). In the classical Chinese tradition, early Daoist thinkers such as Zhuangzi have also been interpreted as weighing in on metaethical issues by critiquing the apparent inadequacy and conventionality of human attempts to reify moral concepts and terms (compare, Kjellberg & Ivanhoe 1996). Many Medieval accounts of morality that ground values in religious texts, commands, or emulation may also be understood as defending certain metaethical positions (see Divine Command Theory). In contrast, during the European Enlightenment, Immanuel Kant sought a foundation for ethics that was less prone to religious sectarian differences, by looking to what he believed to be universal capacities and requirements of human reason. In particular, Kant’s discussions in his Groundwork on the Metaphysics of Morals of a universal “moral law” necessitated by reason have been fertile ground for the articulation of many contemporary neo-Kantian defenses of moral objectivity (for example, Gewirth 1977; Boylan 2004).
Since metaethics is the study of the foundations, if any, of morality, it has flourished especially during historical periods of cultural diversity and flux. For example, responding to the cross-cultural contact engendered by the Greco-Persian Wars, the ancient Greek historian Herodotus reflected on the apparent challenge to cultural superiority posed by the fact that different cultures have seemingly divergent moral practices. A comparable interest in metaethics dominated seventeenth and eighteenth-century moral discourse in Western Europe, as theorists struggled to respond to the destabilization of traditional symbols of authority—for example, scientific revolutions, religious fragmentation, civil wars—and the grim pictures of human egoism that thinkers such as John Mandeville and Thomas Hobbes were presenting (compare, Stephen 1947). Most famously, the eighteenth-century Scottish philosopher David Hume may be understood as a forerunner of contemporary metaethics when he questioned the extent to which moral judgments might ultimately rest on human passions rather than reason, and whether certain virtues are ultimately natural or artificial (compare, Darwall 1995).
Analytic metaethics in its modern form, however, is generally recognized as beginning with the moral writings of G.E. Moore. (Although, see Hurka 2003 for an argument that Moore’s innovations must be contextualized by reference to the preceding thought of Henry Sidgwick.) In his groundbreaking Principia Ethica (1903), Moore urged a distinction between merely theorizing about moral goods on the one hand, versus theorizing about the very concept of “good” itself. (Moore’s specific metaethical views are considered in more detail in the sections below.) Following Moore, analytic moral philosophy became focused almost exclusively on metaethical questions for the next few decades, as ethicists debated whether or not moral language describes facts and whether or not moral properties can be scientifically or “naturalistically” analyzed. (See below for a more specific description of these different metaethical trends.) Then, in the 1970s, largely inspired by the work of philosophers such as John Rawls and Peter Singer, analytic moral philosophy began to refocus on questions of applied ethics and normative theories. Today, metaethics remains a thriving branch of moral philosophy and contemporary metaethicists frequently adopt an interdisciplinary approach to the study of moral values, drawing on disciplines as diverse as social psychology, cultural anthropology, comparative politics, as well as other fields within philosophy itself, such as metaphysics, epistemology, action theory, and the philosophy of science.
Since philosophical ethics is often conceived of as a practical branch of philosophy—aiming at providing concrete moral guidance and justifications—metaethics sits awkwardly as a largely abstract enterprise that says little or nothing about real-life moral issues. Indeed, the pressing nature of such issues was part of the general migration back to applied and normative ethics in the politically-galvanized intellectual climate of the 1970s (described above). And yet, moral experience seems to furnish myriad examples of disagreement concerning not merely specific applied issues, or even the interpretations or applications of particular theories, but sometimes about the very place of morality in general within multicultural, secular, and scientific accounts of the world. Thus, one of the issues inherent in metaethics concerns its status vis-à-vis other levels of moral philosophizing.
As a historical fact, metaethical positions have been combined with a variety of first-order moral positions, and vice versa: George Berkeley, John Stuart Mill, G.E. Moore, and R.M. Hare, for instance, were all committed to some form of Utilitarianism as a first-order moral framework, despite advocating radically different metaethical positions. Likewise, in his influential book Ethics: Inventing Right and Wrong, J.L. Mackie (1977) defends a form of (second-order) metaethical skepticism or relativism in the first chapter, only to devote the rest of the book to the articulation of a substantive theory of (first-order) Utilitarianism. Metaethical positions would appear then to underdetermine normative theories, perhaps in the same way that normative theories themselves underdetermine applied ethical stances (for example, two equally committed Utilitarians can nonetheless disagree about the moral permissibility of eating meat). Yet, despite the logically possible combinations of second and first-order moral positions, Stephen Darwall (2006: 25) notes that, nevertheless, “there do seem to be affinities between metaethical and roughly corresponding ethical theories,” for example, metaethical naturalists have almost universally tended to be Utilitarians at the first-order level, though not vice versa. Notable exceptions to this tendency—that is, metaethical naturalists who are also first-order deontologists—include Alan Gewirth (1977) and Michael Boylan (1999; 2004). For critical responses to these positions, see Beyleveld (1992), Steigleder (1999), Spence (2006), and Gordon (2009).
Other philosophers envision the connection between metaethics and more concrete moral theorizing in much more intimate ways. For example, Matthew Kramer (2009: 2) has argued that metaethical realism (see section four below) is itself actually a first-order moral view as well, noting that “most of the reasons for insisting on the objectivity of ethics are ethical reasons.” (For a similar view about the first-order “need” to believe in the second-order thesis that moral values are “objective,” see also Ronald Dworkin 1996.) Torbjörn Tännsjö (1990), by contrast, argues that, although metaethics is irrelevant to normative theorizing, it may still be significant in other psychological or pragmatic way, for example, by constraining other beliefs. Nicholas Sturgeon (1986) has claimed that the first-order belief in moral fallibility must be grounded in some second-order metaethical view. And David Wiggins (1976) has suggested that metaethical questions about the ultimate foundation and justification of basic moral beliefs may have deep existential implications for how humans view the question of the meaning of life.
The metaethical question of whether or not moral values are cross-culturally universal would seem to have important implications for how foreign practices are morally evaluated at the first-order level. In particular, metaethical relativism (the view that there are no universal or objective moral values) has been viewed as highly loaded politically and psychologically. Proponents of such relativism often appeal to the alleged open-mindedness and tolerance about first-order moral differences that their second-order metaethical view would seem to support. Conversely, opponents of relativism often appeal to what Thomas Scanlon (1995) has called a “fear of relativism,” citing an anxiety about the first-order effects on our moral convictions and motivations if we become too morally tolerant. (See sections five and eight below for a more detailed discussion of the psychological and political dimensions of metaethics, respectively.) Russ Shafer-Landau (2004) further draws attention to the first-order rhetorical uses of metaethics, for example, Rudolph Giuliani’s evocation of the dangers of metaethical relativism following the terrorist events in the United States on September 11, 2001.
One of the central debates within analytic metaethics concerns the semantics of what is actually going on when people make moral statements such as “Abortion is morally wrong” or “Going to war is never morally justified.” The metaethical question is not necessarily whether such statements themselves are true or false, but whether they are even the sort of sentences that are capable of being true or false in the first place (that is, whether such sentences are “truth-apt”) and, if they are, what it is that makes them “true.” On the surface, such sentences would appear to possess descriptive content—that is, they seem to have the syntactical structure of describing facts in the world—in the same form that the sentence “The cat is on the mat” seems to be making a descriptive claim about a cat on a mat; which, in turn, is true or false depending on whether or not there really is a cat on the mat. To put it differently, the sentence “The cat is on the mat” seems to be expressing a belief about the way the world actually is. The metaethical view that moral statements similarly express truth-apt beliefs about the world is known as cognitivism. Cognitivism would seem to be the default view of our moral discourse given the apparent structure that such discourse appears to have. Indeed, if cognitivism were not true— such that moral sentences were expressing something other than truth-apt propositions—then it would seem to be difficult to account for why we nonetheless are able to make logical inferences from one moral sentence to another. For instance, consider the following argument:
1. It is wrong to lie.
2. If it is wrong to lie, then it is wrong to get one’s sibling to lie.
3. Therefore, it is wrong to get one’s sibling to lie.
This argument seems to be a valid application of the logical rule known as modus ponens. Yet, logical rules such as modus ponens operate only on truth-apt propositions. Thus, because we seem to be able to legitimately apply such a rule in the example above, such moral sentences must be truth-apt. This argument in favor of metaethical cognitivism by appeal to the apparent logical structure of moral discourse is known as the Frege-Geach Problem in honor of the philosophers credited with its articulation (compare, Geach 1960; Geach 1965 credits Frege as an ancestor of this problem; see also Schueler 1988 for an influential analysis of this problem vis-à-vis moral realism). According to proponents of the Frege-Geach Problem, rejecting cognitivism would force us to show the separate occurrences of the sentence “it is wrong to lie” in the above argument as homonymous: according to such non-cognitivists, the occurrence in sentence (1) is an expression of a non-truth-apt sentiment about lying, whereas the occurrence in sentence (2) is not, since it’s only claiming what one would express conditionally. Since this homonymy would seem to threaten to undermine the grammatical structure of moral discourse, non-cognitivism must be rejected.
Despite this argument about the surface appearance of cognitivism, however, numerous metaethicists have rejected the view that moral sentences ultimately express beliefs about the world. A historically influential forerunner of the alternate theory of non-cognitivism can be found in the moral writings of David Hume, who famously argued that moral distinctions are not derived from reason, but instead represent emotional responses. As such, moral sentences express not beliefs which may be true or false, but desires or feelings which are neither true nor false. This Humean position was renewed in twentieth-century metaethics by the observation that not only are moral disputes often heavily affect-laden in a way many other factual disputes are not, but also that the kind of facts which would apparently be necessary to accommodate true moral beliefs would have to be very strange sorts of entities. Specifically, the worry is that, whereas we can appeal to standards of empirical verification or falsification to adjudicate when our non-moral beliefs are true or false, no such standards seem applicable in the moral sphere, since we cannot literally point to moral goodness in the way we can literally point to cats on mats.
In response to this apparent disanalogy between moral and non-moral statements, many metaethicists embraced a sort of neo-Humean non-cognitivism, according to which moral statements express non-truth-apt desires or feelings. The Logical Positivism of the Vienna Circle adopted this metaethical position, finding anything not empirically verifiable to be semantically “meaningless.” Thus, A.J. Ayer (1936) defended what he called metaethical emotivism, according to which moral expressions are indexed always to the speaker’s own affective state. So, the moral utterance “Abortion is morally wrong” would ultimately mean only that “I do not approve of abortion,” or, more accurately (to avoid even the appearance of having descriptive content), “Abortion—boo!” C.L. Stevenson (1944) further developed metaethical non-cognitivism as involving not merely an expression of the speaker’s personal attitude, but also an implicit endorsement of what the speaker thinks the audience ought to feel. R.M. Hare (1982) similarly analyzed moral utterances as containing both descriptive (truth-apt) as well as ineliminably prescriptive elements, such that genuinely asserting, for instance, that murder is wrong involves a concomitant emotional endorsement of not murdering. Drawing on the work of ordinary-language philosophers such as J.L. Austin, Hare distinguished the act of making a statement (that is, the statement’s “illocutionary force”) from other acts that may be performed concomitantly (that is, the statement’s “perlocutionary force”)— as when, for example, stating “I do” in the context of a marriage ceremony thereby effects an actual legal reality. Similarly, Hare argued that in the case of moral language, the illocutionary act of describing a war as “unjust” may, as part and parcel of the description itself, also involve the perlocutionary force of recommending a negative attitude or action with respect to that war. For Hare, the prescriptive dimension of such an assertion must be constrained by the requirements of universalizability—hence, Hare’s metaethical position is referred to as “universal prescriptivism.”
More recently, sophisticated versions of non-cognitivism have flourished that build into moral expression not only the individual speaker’s normative endorsement, but also an appeal to a socially-shared norm that helps contextualize the endorsement. Thus, Alan Gibbard (1990) defends norm-expressivism, according to which moral statements express commitments not to idiosyncratic personal feelings, but instead to the particular (and, for Gibbard, evolutionarily adaptive) cultural mores that enable communication and social coordination.
Non-cognitivists have also attempted to address the Frege-Geach Problem discussed above, by specifying how the expression of attitudes functions in moral discourse. Simon Blackburn (1984), for instance, has famously argued that non-cognitivism is a claim only about the moral, not the logical parts of discourse. Thus, according to Blackburn, to say that “If it is wrong to lie, then it is wrong to get one’s sibling to lie” can be understood as expressing not an attitude toward lying itself (which is couched in merely hypothetical terms), but rather an attitude toward the disposition to express an attitude toward lying (that is, a kind of second-order sentiment). Since this still essentially involves the expression of attitudes rather than truth-apt assertions, it’s still properly a type of non-cognitivism; yet, by distinguishing expressing an attitude directly from expressing an attitude about another (hypothetical) attitude, Blackburn thinks the logical and grammatical structure of our discourse is preserved. Since this view combines the expressive thesis of non-cognitivism with the logical appearance of moral realism, Blackburn dubs it “quasi-realism”. For a critical response to Blackburn’s attempted solution to the Frege-Geach Problem, see Wright (1988). For an accessible survey of the history of the debate surrounding the Frege-Geach Problem, see Schroeder (2008), and for attempts to articulate new hybrid theories that combine elements of both cognitivism as well as non-cognitivism, see Ridge (2006) and Boisvert (2008).
One complication in the ongoing debate between cognitivist versus non-cognitivist accounts of moral language is the growing realization of the difficulty in conceptually distinguishing beliefs from desires in the first place. Recognition of the mingled nature of cognitive and non-cognitive states can arguably be found in Aristotle’s view that how we perceive and conceptualize a situation fundamentally affects how we respond to it emotionally; not to mention Sigmund Freud’s commitment to the idea that our emotions themselves stem ultimately from (perhaps unconscious) beliefs (compare, Neu 2000). Much contemporary metaethical debate between cognitivists and non-cognitivists thus concerns the extent to which beliefs alone, desires alone, or some compound of the two—what J.E.J. Altham (1986) has dubbed “besires”—are capable of capturing the prescriptive and affective dimension that moral discourse seems to evidence (see Theories of Emotions).
A related issue regarding the semantics of metaethics concerns what it would even mean to say that a moral statement is “true” if some form of cognitivism were correct. The traditional philosophical account of truth (called the correspondence theory of truth) regards a proposition as true just in case it accurately describes the way the world really is independent of the proposition. Thus, the sentence “The cat is on the mat” would be true if and only if there really is a cat who is really on a mat. According to this understanding, moral expressions would similarly have to correspond to external features about the world in order to be true: the sentence “Murder is wrong” would be true in virtue of its correspondence to some “fact” in the world about murder being wrong. And indeed, several metaethical positions (often grouped under the title of “realism” or “objectivism”—see section four below) embrace precisely this view; although exactly what the features of the world are to which allegedly true moral propositions correspond remains a matter of serious debate. However, there are several obvious challenges to this traditional correspondence account of moral truth. For one thing, moral properties such as “wrongness” do not seem to be the sort of entities that can literally be pointed to or picked out by propositions in the same way that cats and mats can be, since the moral properties are not spatial-temporal objects. As David Hume famously put it,
Take any action allow’d to be vicious: Wilful murder, for instance. Examine it in all lights, and see if you can find that matter of fact, or real existence, which you call vice. In which-ever way you take it, you find only certain passions, motives, volitions and thoughts. There is no other matter of fact in the case. (Hume 1740: 468)
Other possible ontological models for what moral “facts” might look like are considered in section four below. In later years, however, several alternative philosophical understandings of truth have proliferated which might allow moral expressions to be “true” without requiring any correspondence to external facts per se. Many of these new theories of moral truth hearken to a suggestion by Ludwig Wittgenstein in the early twentieth-century that the meaning of any term is determined by how that term is actually used in discourse. Building on this insight about meaning, Frank Ramsey (1927) extended the account to truth itself. Thus, according to Ramsey, the predicate “is true” does not stand for a property per se, but rather functions as a kind of abbreviation for the indirect assertion of other propositions. For instance, Ramsey suggested that to utter the proposition “The cat is on the mat” is to say the same thing as “The sentence ‘the cat is on the mat’ is true.” The phrase “is true” in the latter utterance adds nothing semantically to what is expressed in the former, since in uttering the former, the speaker is already affirming that the cat is on the mat. This is an instance of the so-called disquotational schema, that is, the view that truth is already implicit in a sentence without the addition of the phrase “is true.” Ramsey wielded this principle to defend a deflationary theory of truth, wherein truth predicates are stripped of any metaphysically substantial property, and reduced instead merely to the ability to be formally represented in a language. Saying that truth is thus stripped of metaphysics is not to say that it is determined by usage in an arbitrary or unprincipled way. This is because, while the deflationary theory defines “truth” merely as the ability to be represented in a language, there are always syntactic rules that a language must follow. The grammar of a language thus constrains what can be properly expressed in that language, and therefore (on the deflationary theory) what can be true. Deflationary truth is in this way constrained by what may be called “warranted assertibility,” and since deflationary truth just is what can be expressed by the grammar of a language, we can say more strongly that truth is warranted assertibility.
Hilary Putnam (1981) has articulated an influential challenge to the deflationary account. He argues that deflationary truth is unable to accommodate the fact that we normally think of truth as eternal and stable. But if truth just is warranted assertibility (or what Putnam calls “rational acceptability”), then it becomes mutable since warranted assertibility varies depending on what information is available. For instance, the proposition “the Earth is flat” could have been asserted with warrant (that is, accepted rationally) a thousand years ago in a way that it could not be today because we now have more information available about the Earth. But, though warranted assertibility changed in this case, we wouldn’t want to say that the truth of the proposition “the Earth is flat” changed. Based on these problems, philosophers like Putnam refine the deflationary theory by substituting a condition of ideal warrant or justification, that is, where warranted assertibility is not relative to what specific information a speaker may have at a specific moment, but to what information would be accessible to an ideal epistemic agent. What kind of information would such an ideal speaker have? Putnam characterizes the ideal epistemic situation as involving information that is both complete (that is, involving everything relevant) and consistent (that is, not logically contradictory). These two conditions combine to affect a convergence of information for the ideal agent— a view Putnam calls “internal realism.”
This tradition of deflating truth—of what Jamie Dreier has described as “sucking the substance out of heavy-duty metaphysical concepts” (Dreier 2004: 26)—has received careful exposition in recent years by Crispin Wright. Wright (1992) defends a theory of truth he calls “minimalism.” Though indebted in fundamental ways to the tradition—from Wittgenstein to Ramsey to Putnam—discussed above, Wright’s position differs importantly from these accounts. Wright agrees with Putnam’s criticism of traditional deflationary theories of truth, namely that they make truth too variable by identifying it with something as mutable as warranted assertibility. However, Wright disagrees with Putnam that truth is constrained by the convergence of information that would be available to an epistemically ideal agent. This is because Wright thinks that it is apparent to speakers of a language that something may be true even if it is not justified in ideal epistemic conditions. Wright calls this apparentness a “platitude.” Platitudes, says Wright, are what ordinary language users pre-theoretically mean, and Wright identifies several specific platitudes we have concerning truth, for example, that a statement can be true without being justified, that truth-apt propositions have negations that are also thereby truth-apt, and so forth. Such platitudes serve the same purpose of checking and balancing truth that warranted assertibility or ideal convergence served in the theories of Ramsey and Putnam (Wright calls this check and balance “superassertability”). As Wright puts it, “If an interpretation of “true” satisfies these platitudes, there is, for minimalism, no further, metaphysical question whether it captures a concept worth regarding as truth” (1992: 34). Wright’s theory of minimalist truth has been extraordinarily influential in metaethics, particularly by non-cognitivists eager to accommodate some of the logical structure that moral discourse apparently evidences, but without viewing moral utterances as expressing beliefs that must literally correspond to facts. Such a non-cognitivist theory of minimalist moral truth is defended by Simon Blackburn (1993), who characterizes the resultant view as “quasi-realism” (as discussed in section 3a above). For a critical discussion of the extent to which non-cognitivist views such as Blackburn’s quasi-realism can leverage Wright’s theory of minimalism, see the debate between Michael Smith (1994) and John Divers and Alexander Miller (1994).
If moral truth is understood in the traditional sense of corresponding to reality, what sort of features of reality could suffice to accommodate this correspondence? What sort of entity is “wrongness” or “goodness” in the first place? The branch of philosophy that deals with the way in which things exist is called “ontology”, and metaethical positions may also be divided according to how they envision the ontological status of moral values. Perhaps the biggest schism within metaethics is between those who claim that there are moral facts that are “real” or “objective” in the sense that they exist independently of any beliefs or evidence about them, versus those who think that moral values are not belief-independent “facts” at all, but are instead created by individuals or cultures in sometimes radically different ways. Proponents of the former view are called realists or objectivists; proponents of the latter view are called relativists or subjectivists.
Realism / objectivism is often defended by appeal to the normative or political implications of believing that there are universal moral truths that transcend what any individual or even an entire culture might think about them (see sections two and eight). Realist positions, however, disagree about what precisely moral values are if they are causally independent from human belief or culture. According to some realists, moral values are abstract properties that are “objective” in the same sense that geometrical or mathematical properties might be thought to be objective. For example, it might be thought that the sentence “Dogs are canines” is true in a way that is independent from what humans think about it, without thereby believing that there is a literal, physical thing called “dogs”— for, dogs-in-general (rather than a particular dog, say, Fido) is an abstract concept. Some moral realists envision moral values as real without being physical in precisely this way; and because of the similarity between this view and Plato’s famous Theory of Forms, such moral realists are also sometimes called moral Platonists. According to such realists, moral values are real without being reducible to any other kinds of properties or facts: moral values instead, according to these realists, are ontologically unique (or sui generis) and irreducible to other kinds of properties. Proponents of this type of Platonist or sui generis version of moral realism include G.E. Moore (1903), W.D. Ross (1930), W.D. Hudson (1967), Iris Murdoch (1970, arguably), and Russ Shafer-Landau (2003). Tom Regan (1986) also discusses the effect of this metaethical position on the general intellectual climate of the fin de siècle movement known as the Bloomsbury Group.
Other moral realists, though, conceive of the ontology of moral properties in much more concrete terms. According to these realists, moral properties such as “goodness” are not purely abstract entities, but are always instead realized and embodied in particular physical states of affairs. These moral realists often draw analogies between moral properties and scientific properties such as gravity, velocity, mass, and so forth. These scientific concepts are commonly thought to exist independent of what we think about them, and yet they are not part of an ontologically distinct world of pure, abstract ideas in the way that Plato envisioned. So too might moral properties ultimately be reducible to scientific features of the world in a way that preserves their objectivity. An early proponent of such a naturalistic view is arguably Aristotle himself, who anchored his ethics to an understanding of what biologically makes human life flourish. For a later Aristotelian moral realism, see Paul Bloomfield (2001). However, for questions about the extent to which Aristotelianism can truly pair with moral realism, see Robert Heinaman (1995). Note also that several other metaethicists who share broadly Aristotelian conceptions of human needs and human flourishing nonetheless reject realism, arguing that even a shared human nature still essentially locates moral values in human sensibility rather than in some trans-human moral reality. For examples of such naturalistic moral relativism, see Philippa Foot (2001) and David B. Wong (2006). Similar claims about the ineliminable roles that human sensibility and language play in constituting moral reality have looked less to Aristotle and more to Wittgenstein; although, as with the former, there may be some discomfort allowing views that closely link morality with human sensibilities to be called genuinely “realist.” For examples, see in particular David Wiggins (1976) and Sabina Lovibond (1983). Other notable theorists who have advanced Wittgensteinian accounts of the constitutive role that language and context play in our understanding of morality include G.E.M. Anscombe (1958) and Alasdair MacIntyre (1981), although both are explicitly agnostic about whether this commits them to moral realism or relativism.
The naturalistic tradition of moral realism is continued by contemporary theorists such as Alan Gewirth (1980), Deryck Beyleveld (1992), and Michael Boylan (2004) who similarly seek to ground moral objectivity in certain universal features of humans. Unlike Aristotelian appeals to our biological and social nature, however, these theorists adopt a Kantian stance, which appeals to the capacities and requirements of rational agency—for example, what Gewirth has called “the principle of generic consistency.” While these neo-Kantian theories are more focused on questions about the justification of moral beliefs rather than on the existence of belief-independent values or properties, they may nonetheless be classed as moral realisms in light of their commitment to the objective and universal nature of rationality. For commentary and discussion of such theories, see in particular Steigleder (1999), Boylan (1999), Spence (2006), and Gordon (2009).
Other naturalistic theories have looked to scientific models of property reductionism as a way of understanding moral realism. In the same way that, for instance, our commonsense understanding of “water” refers to a property that, at the scientific level, just is H2O, so too might moral values be reduced to non-moral properties. And, since these non-moral properties are real entities, the resultant view about the values that reduce to them can be considered a form of moral realism—without any need to posit trans-scientific, other-worldly Platonic entities. This general approach to naturalistic realism is often referred to as “Cornell Realism” in light of the fact that several of its prominent advocates studied or taught at Cornell University. Geoff Sayre-McCord (1988) has also famously dubbed it “New Wave Moral Realism.” Individual proponents of such a view may have divergent views concerning how the alleged “reduction” of the moral to the non-moral works precisely. Richard Boyd (1988), for instance, defends the view that the reductive relationship between moral and non-moral properties is a priori and necessary, but not thereby singular; moral properties might instead reduce to a “homeostatic cluster” of different overlapping non-moral properties.
Several other notable examples of scientifically-minded naturalistic moral realism have been defended. Nicholas Sturgeon (1988) has similarly argued in favor of a reduction of moral to non-moral properties, while emphasizing that a reduction at the level of the denotation or extension of our moral terms need not entail a corresponding reduction at the level of the connotation or intension of how we talk about morality. In other words, we can affirm that values just are (sets of) natural properties without thereby thinking we can or should abandon our moral language or explanatory/justificatory processes. David Brink (1989) has articulated a similar type of naturalistic moral realism which emphasizes the epistemological and motivational aspects of Cornell Realism by defending a coherentist account of justification and an externalist theory of motivation, respectively. Peter Railton (1986) has also offered a version of naturalistic moral realism according to which moral properties are reduced to non-moral properties; however, the non-moral properties in question are not so much scientific properties (or clusters of such properties), but are instead constituted by the “objective interests” of ideal epistemic agents or “impartial spectators.” Yet another variety of naturalistic moral realism has been put forward by Frank Jackson and Philip Pettit (1995). According to their view of “analytic moral functionalism,” moral properties are reducible to “whatever plays their role in mature folk morality.” Jackson’s (1998) refinement of this position—which he calls “analytic descriptivism”—elaborates that the “mature folk” properties to which moral properties are reducible will be “descriptive predicates” (although Jackson allows for the possibility that these descriptive predicates need not be physical or even scientific).
A helpful way to understand the differences between all these varieties of moral realism—namely, the Platonic versus the naturalistic versions— is by appeal to a famous argument advanced by G.E. Moore at the beginning of twentieth-century metaethics. Moore—himself an advocate of the Platonic view of morality—argued that moral properties such as “good” cannot be solely defined by scientific, natural properties such as “biological flourishing” or “social coordination” for the simple reason that, given such an alleged definition, we could still always sensibly ask whether such scientific properties were themselves truly good or not. The apparent ability to always keep the moral status of any scientific or natural thing an “open question” led Moore to reject any analysis of morality that defined moral values as anything other than simply “moral,” period. Any attempt to violate this ban must result, Moore believed, in the committing of a “naturalistic fallacy.” Moral Platonists or non-naturalistic realists tend to view Moore’s Open Question Argument as persuasive. Naturalistic realists, by contrast, argue that Moore’s argument is unconvincing on the grounds that not all truths— moral or otherwise— necessarily need to be true solely by definition. After all, such realists will argue, scientific statements such as “Water is H2O” is true even though people can (and did for a long time) question this definition.
Michael Smith (1994) has referred to this realist strategy of defining moral properties as naturalistic properties which humans discover, rather than which are simply true by definition, as “synthetic ethical naturalism.” One argument against this form of moral realism has been developed by Terry Horgan and Mark Timmons (1991), on the basis of a thought-experiment called Moral Twin Earth. This thought-experiment asks us to imagine two different worlds, the actual Earth as we know it and an alternate-reality Earth in which the same moral terms as those on the actual Earth are used to refer to the same natural/scientific properties (as the naturalistic moral realist wants to say). However, Horgan and Timmons point out that we can at the same time imagine that the moral terms on our actual Earth refer to, say, properties that maximize overall happiness (as Utilitarianism maintains), while also imagining that the moral terms used on hypothetical Moral Twin Earth refer to properties of universal rationality (as Kantian normative theorists maintain). But this would show that the moral terms used on actual Earth versus those used on Moral Twin Earth have different meanings, because they refer to different normative theories. This implies that it would be the normative theories themselves that are causing the difference in the meaning of the moral terms, not the natural properties since those are identical across the two worlds. And since naturalistic (a.k.a. Cornell) moral realism maintains that moral properties are identical at some level to natural properties, Horgan and Timmons think this thought-experiment disproves naturalistic realism. In other words, if the naturalistic realists were correct about the reduction of moral to non-moral predicates, then the Earthlings and Twin Earthlings would have to be interpreted not as genuinely disagreeing about morality, but as instead talking past one another altogether; and, according to Horgan and Timmons, this would be highly counter-intuitive, since it seems on the surface that the two parties are truly disagreeing.
Centrally at issue in the Moral Twin Earth argument is the question of how precisely naturalistic realists envision moral properties being “reduced” to natural, scientific properties in the first place. Such realists frequently invoke the metaphysical relationship of supervenience to account for the way that moral properties might connect to scientific properties. For one property or set of properties to supervene on another means that any change in one must necessarily result in a corresponding change in the other. For instance, to say that the color property of greenness supervenes on grass is to say that if two plots of grass are identical in all biological, scientific ways, then they will be green in exactly the same way too. Simon Blackburn (1993: 111-129), however, has raised a serious objection to using this notion to explain moral supervenience. Blackburn claims that if moral properties did supervene on natural properties, then we should be able to imagine two different worlds (akin to Horgan and Timmons’ Moral Twin Earth) where killing is morally wrong in one world, but not wrong in the other world— all we would have to do is imagine two worlds in which the natural, scientific facts were different. And if we can coherently imagine these two worlds, then there is no reason why we should not also be able to imagine a third “mixed” world in which killing is sometimes wrong and sometimes not. But Blackburn does not think we can in fact imagine such a strange morally mixed world— for, he believes that it is part of our conception of morality that moral wrongness or rightness does not just change haphazardly from case to case, all things being equal. As Blackburn says, “While I cannot see an inconsistency in holding this belief [namely, the view that moral propositions report factual states of affairs upon which the moral properties supervene in an irreducible way], it is not philosophically very inviting. Supervenience becomes, for the realist, an opaque, isolated, logical fact for which no explanation can be proffered” (1993: 119). In this way, Blackburn is not objecting to the supervenience relation per se, but rather to attempts to leverage this relation in favor of moral realism. For a critical examination of supervenience in principle, see Kim (1990); Blackburn attempts to refurbish his notion of supervenience in response to Kim’s critique in Blackburn (1993: 130-148).
Apart from the debate between naturalistic versus non-naturalistic moral realists, some metaethicists have explored the possibility that moral properties might be “real” without needing to be fully independent from human sensibility. According to these theories of moral realism, moral values might be akin to so-called “dispositional properties.” A dispositional property (sometimes understood as a “secondary quality”) is envisioned as a sort of latent potential or disposition, inherent in some external object or state of affairs, that becomes activated or actualized through involvement on the part of some other object or state of affairs. Thus, for example, the properties of being fragile or looking red are thought to involve a latent disposition to break under certain conditions or to appear red in a certain light. The suggestion that moral values might be similarly dispositional was made famous by John McDowell (1985). According to this view, moral properties such as “goodness” can still be real at the level of dispositional possibility (in the same way that glass is still fragile even when it is not breaking, or that blood is red even in the darkness), while still only being expressible by reference to the features (actual moral agents, in the case of morality) that would actualize those dispositions. For similar metaethical positions that seek to articulate a model of moral values which are objective, yet relational to aspects of human sensibility, see David Wiggins (1976), Sabina Lovibond (1983), David McNaughton (1988), Mark Platts (1991), Jonathan Dancy (2000), and DeLapp (2009). Arguments against this form of dispositional moral realism typically attempt to leverage alleged disanalogies between moral properties and other, non-moral dispositional properties (see especially Blackburn 1993).
Other metaethical positions reject altogether the idea that moral values— whether naturalistic, non-naturalistic, or dispositional—are real or objective in the sense of being independent from human belief or culture in the first place. Such positions instead insist on the fundamentally anthropocentric nature of morality. According to such views, moral values are not “out there” in the world (whether as scientific properties, dispositional properties, or Platonic Forms) at all, but are created by human perspectives and needs. Since these perspectives and needs can vary from person to person or from culture to culture, these metaethical theories are usually referred to as either “subjectivism” or “relativism” (sometimes moral nihilism as well; although, this is a more normatively loaded term). Many of the reasons in favor of metaethical relativism concern either a rejection of the realist ontological models discussed above, or else by appeal to psychological, epistemological, or anthropological considerations (see sections 5, 6, 7 below).
Most forms of metaethical relativism envision moral values as constructed for different, and sometimes incommensurable human purposes such as social coordination, and so forth. This view is explicitly endorsed by Gilbert Harman (1975), but may also be implicitly associated in different ways with any position that conceives of moral value as constructed by divine commands (Adams 1987; see also Divine Command Theory), idealized human rationality (Korsgaard 1996) or perspective (Firth 1952), or a social contract between competing interests (Scanlon 1982; Copp 2007). For this reason, the view is also sometimes known as moral constructivism (compare, Shafer-Landau 2003: 39-52). Furthermore, metaethical relativism must be distinguished from the non-cognitivist metaethical views considered above in section three. Non-cognitivism is a semantic thesis about what moral utterances mean—namely, that moral utterances are neither true nor false at all, but instead express prescriptive endorsements or norms. Metaethical subjectivism/relativism/constructivism, by contrast, acknowledges the semantic accuracy of cognitivism—according to which moral utterances are either true or false— but insists that such utterances are always, as it happens, false. That is, metaethical subjectivism/relativism/constructivism is a thesis about the (lack of) moral facts in the world, not a thesis about what we humans are doing when we try to talk about such facts. And since metaethical subjectivism/relativism/constructivism thinks that our cognitivist moral language is systematically false, it may also be known as moral error theory (Mackie 1977) or moral fictionalism (Kalderon 2005).
Although metaethical relativism is often depicted as embracing a valueless world of moral free-for-all, more sophisticated versions of the theory have attempted to place certain boundaries on morality in a way that still affirms the fundamental human-centeredness of values. Thus, David B. Wong (1984; 2006) has defended a view he calls pluralistic moral relativism according to which moral values are constructed differently by different social groups for different purposes; but in such a way that the degree of relativity will be nonetheless constrained by a generally uniform biological account of human nature and flourishing. A similar conception of metaethical relativism that is nonetheless grounded in some notion of universal human biological characteristics may be found in Philippa Foot (2001).
One of the most pressing questions within analytic metaethics concerns how morality engages our embodied human psychologies. Specifically, how (if at all) do moral judgments move us to act in accordance with them? Is there any reason to be moral for its own sake, and can we give any psychologically persuasive reasons to others to act morally if they do not already acknowledge such reasons? Is it part of the definition of moral concepts such as “right” and “wrong” that they should or should not be pursued, or is it possible to know that, say, murder is morally wrong, but nonetheless not recognize any reason not to murder?
Those who argue that the psychological motivation to act morally is already implicit in the judgment that something is morally good, are commonly called motivational internalists. Motivational internalists may further be divided into weak motivational internalists or strong motivational internalists, according to the strength of the motivation that they think true moral judgments come pre-packaged with. Thus, the Socratic view that evil is always performed out of ignorance (for no one, goes the argument, would knowingly do something that would morally damage their own character or soul) may be seen as a type of strong motivational internalism. Weaker versions of motivational internalism may insist only that moral judgments supply their own impetus to act accordingly, but that this impetus can (and perhaps often does) get overruled by countervailing motivational forces. Thus, Aristotle’s famous account of “weakness of the will” has been interpreted as a weaker sort of motivational internalism, according to which a person may recognize that something is morally right, and may even want at some level to do what is right, but is nonetheless lured away from such action, perhaps through stronger temptations.
Apart from what actually motivates people to act in accordance with their moral judgments, however, there is the somewhat different question about whether such judgments also supply their own intrinsic reasons to act in accordance with them. Reasons-externalists assert that sincerely judging that something is morally wrong, for instance, automatically supplies a reason for the judger that would justify her acting on the basis of that judgment, that is, a reason that is external to or independent of what the judger herself feels or wants. This need not mean that such a justification is an objectively adequate justification (that would hinge on whether one was a realist or relativist about metaethics), only that it would make sense as a response to the question “Why did you do that?” to say “Because I judged that it was morally right” (compare, McDowell 1978; Shafer-Landau 2003). According to reasons-internalists, however, judging and justifying are two conceptually different matters, such that someone could make a legitimate judgment that an action was morally wrong and still fail to recognize any reason that would justify their not performing it. Instead, sufficiently justifying moral reasons must exist independently and internally to a person’s psychological makeup (compare, Foot 1972; Williams 1979).
Closely related to the debates between internalism and externalism is the question of the metaethical status of alleged psychopaths or sociopaths. According to some moral psychologists, such individuals are characterized by a failure to distinguish moral values from merely conventional values. Several metaethicists have pointed to the apparent existence of psychopaths as support for the truth of either motivational or reasons-externalism; since psychopaths seem to be able to judge that, for instance, murder or lying are morally wrong, but either feel little or no motivation to refrain from these things, or else do not recognize any reason that should justify refraining from these things. Motivational internalists and reasons-externalists, however, have also sought to accommodate the challenge presented by the psychopath, for example, by arguing that the psychopath does not truly, robustly know that what she is doing is wrong, but only knows how to use the word “wrong” in roughly the way that the rest of society does.
A separate issue related to the internalist/externalist debate concerns the apparent psychological uniqueness of moral judgments. Specifically, at least according to the motivational internalist and reasons-externalist, moral judgments are supposed to supply, respectively, their own inherent motivations or justifying reasons, that is, their own intrinsic quality of “to-be-pursuedness.” Yet, this would seem to render morality suspiciously unique—or what J.L. Mackie (1977) calls “metaphysically queer”— since all other, non-moral judgments (for example, scientific, factual, or perceptual judgments) do not seem to provide any inherent motivations or justifications. The objection is not that non-moral judgments (for example, “This coffee is decaffeinated”) supply no motivational or justificatory force, but merely that any such motivation or justificatory force hinges on other psychological factors independent of the judgment itself (that is, the judgment about the coffee being decaffeinated will only motivate or provide a reason for you to drink it if you already have the desire to avoid caffeine). Unlike the factual judgment about the coffee, though, the moral judgment that an action is wrong is supposed to be motivating or reasons-giving regardless of the judger’s personal desires or interests. Motivational internalists or reasons-externalists have responded to this alleged “queerness” by either embracing the uniqueness of moral judgments, or else by attempting to articulate other examples of non-moral judgments which might also inherently supply motivation or reasons.
Not only has psychology been of interest to metaethicists, but metaethics has also been of interest to psychologists. The movement known as experimental philosophy (compare, Appiah 2008; Knobe and Nichols 2008)— which seeks to supplement theoretical philosophical claims with empirical attention to how people actually think and act— has yielded numerous suggestive findings about a variety of metaethical positions. For example, drawing on empirical research in social psychology, several philosophers have suggested that moral judgments, motivations, and evaluations are highly sensitive to situational variables in a way that might challenge the universality or autonomy of morality (Flanagan 1991; Doris 2002). Other moral psychologists have explored the possibilities of divergences in moral reasoning and valuation with respect to gender (Gilligan 1982), ethnicity (Markus and Kitayama 1991; Miller and Bersoff 1992), and political affiliation (McCrae 1992; Haidt 2007).
The specific debate between metaethical realism and relativism has also recently been examined from experimental perspectives. It has been argued that an empirically-informed analysis of people’s actual metaethical commitments (such as they are) is needed as a check and balance on the many frequent appeals to “commonsense morality” or “ordinary moral experience.” Realists as well as relativists have often used such appeals as a means of locating a burden of proof for or against their theories, but the actual experimental findings about lay-people’s metaethical intuitions remain mixed. For examples of realists assuming folk realism, see Brink (1989: 25), Smith (1994: 5), and Shafer-Landau (2003: 23); for examples of relativists assuming folk relativism, see Harman (1985); and for examples of relativists assuming folk realism, see Mackie (1977) and Joyce (2001: 70). William James (1896: 14) offered an early psychological description of humans as “absolutists by instinct,” although James’ specific metaethical commitments remain unclear (compare, Suckiel 1982). On the one hand, Shaun Nichols (2004) has argued that metaethical relativism is particularly pronounced among college undergraduates. On the other hand, William Rottschaefer (1999) has argued instead that moral realism is empirically supported by attention to effective child-rearing practices.
Another psychological topic that has been of interest to metaethicists is the nature and significance of moral emotions. One aspect of this debate has been the perennial question of whether it is fundamentally rationality which supplies our moral distinctions and motivations, or whether these are instead generated or conditioned by passions and sentiments which are separate from reason. (See section 5a above for more on this debate.) In particular, this debate was one of the dividing issues in eighteenth-century ethics between the so-called Intellectualist School (for example, Ralph Cudworth, William Wollaston, and so forth), which stressed the rational grasp of certain “moral fitnesses” on the one hand, and the Sentimentalist School (for example, Shaftesbury, David Hume, and so forth), which stressed the role played by our non-cognitive “moral sense” on the other hand (compare, Selby-Bigge 1897; see also Darwall 1995 for an application of these views to contemporary metaethical debates about moral motivation and knowledge).
Aside from motivational and epistemological issues, however, moral emotions have been of interest to metaethicists in terms of the apparent phenomenology they furnish. In particular, attention has been given to which metaethical theory, if any, better accommodates the existence of self-regarding “retributive emotions,” such as guilt, regret, shame, and remorse. Martha Nussbaum (1986) and Bernard Williams (1993), for example, have drawn compelling attention to the powerful emotional responses characteristic of Greek tragedy, and the so-called moral luck that such experiences seem to involve. According to Williams (1965), sensitivity to moral dilemmas will reveal a picture of the moral sphere according to which even the best-intentioned actions may leave moral “stains” or “remainders” on our character. Michael Stocker (1990) extends this analysis of moral emotions to more general scenarios of ineliminable conflicts between values, and Kevin DeLapp (2009) explores the specific implications of tragic emotions for theories of moral realism. By contrast, Gilbert Harman (2009) has argued against the moral (let alone metaethical) significance of guilt feelings. Patricia Greenspan (1995), however, has leveraged the phenomenology of guilt (particularly as she identifies it in cases of unavoidable wrong-doing) as a defense of moral realism. For more perspectives on the nature and significance of moral dilemmas, see Gowans (1987). For more on the philosophy of emotions in general, see Calhoun & Solomon (1984).
Analytic metaethics also explores questions of how we make moral judgments in the first place, and how (if at all) we are able to know moral truths. The field of moral epistemology can be divided into questions about what moral knowledge is, how moral beliefs can be justified, and where moral knowledge comes from.
Moral epistemology explores the contours of moral knowledge itself—not the specific content of individual moral beliefs, but the conceptual characteristics of moral beliefs as a general epistemic category. Here, one of the biggest questions concerns whether moral knowledge involves claims about generic moral values such “goodness” or “wrongness” (so-called “thin” moral concepts) or whether moral knowledge may be obtained at the somewhat more concrete level of concepts such as “courage”, “intemperance”, or “compassion” (which seem to have a “thicker” descriptive content). The general methodology of the thick-thin distinction was popularized by Clifford Geertz (1973) following the introduction of the terminology by Gilbert Ryle (1968). Its specific application to metaethics, however, is due largely to Bernard Williams’ (1985) famous argument that genuine (that is, action-guiding) moral knowledge can only exist at the thicker level of concrete moral concepts. This represents what Williams called the “limits of philosophy,” since philosophical theorizing aims instead at more abstract, thin moral principles. Furthermore, according to Williams, this epistemological point about the thickness of moral knowledge has important implications for the ontology of moral values; namely, Williams defends a kind metaethical relativism on the grounds that, even if thin moral concepts such as “goodness” are universal across different societies, the more specific thick concepts that he thinks really matter to us morally are specified in often divergent ways, for example, two societies that both praise “goodness” may nonetheless have quite different understandings of what counts as “bravery”.
Emphasis on thick moral concepts has been prevalent in virtue ethics in general. For example, Alasdair MacIntyre (1984) has famously defended the neo-Aristotelian view that ethics must be grounded in a “tradition” that is coherent and stable enough to thickly specify virtues and virtuous role-models. Indeed, part of the challenge that MacIntyre sees facing contemporary societies is that increased cross-cultural interconnectedness has fomented a fragmentation of traditional virtue frameworks, engendering a moral cacophony that threatens to undermine moral motivation, knowledge, and even our confidence in what counts as “rational” (MacIntyre 1988). More recently, David B. Wong (2000) has offered a contemporary Confucian response to MacIntyre-style worries about moral fragmentation in democratic societies, arguing that pluralistic societies may still retain a coherent tradition in the form of civic “rituals” such as voting.
A related metaethical issue concerns the scope of moral judgments and the extent to which such judgments may ever legitimately be made universally or whether they ought instead to be indexed to particular situations or contexts; this view is commonly known as moral particularism (compare, Hooker and Little 2000; Dancy 2006).
Metaethical positions may also be divided according to how they envision the requirements of justifying moral beliefs. Traditional philosophical accounts of epistemological justification are requisitioned and modified specifically to accommodate moral knowledge. A popular version of a theory of moral-epistemic justification may be called metaethical foundationalism—the view that moral beliefs are epistemically justified by appeal to other moral beliefs, until this justificatory process terminates at some bedrock beliefs whose own justifications are “self-evident.” By contrast, metaethical coherentism requires for the epistemic justification of a moral belief only that it be part of a network of other beliefs, all of which are jointly consistent (compare, Sayre-McCord 1985; Brink 1989). Mark Timmons (1996) also defends a form of metaethical contextualism, according to which justification is determined either by reference to some relevant set of epistemic practices and norms (a view Timmons calls “normative contextualism” and which also bears strong similarity with the movement known as virtue epistemology), or else by reference to some more basic beliefs (a view Timmons calls “structural contextualism” and which seems very similar to foundationalism). Kai Nielsen (1997) has offered another account of contextualist ethical justification with reference to internal systems of religious belief and explanation (see Religious Epistemology).
Early 21st century work in metaethics has gone into exploring precisely what is involved in the “self-evidence” envisioned by foundationalist accounts of moral justification. Roger Crisp (2002) notes that most historical deployments of “self-evidence” in moral epistemology tended to associate it with obviousness or certainty. For instance, the ethical intuitionism of much of the early part of the 20th century (particularly following Moore’s Open Question Argument, as discussed above) tended to adopt this stance toward moral truths (compare, Stratton-Lake 2002). It was this understanding of metaethical foundationalism which led J.L. Mackie (1977) to object to what he saw as the “epistemological queerness” of realist or objectivist ontology. In later years, though, more sophisticated versions of metaethical foundationalism have sought interpretations of the “self-evidence” of basic, justifying moral beliefs in a way that need not involve dogmatic or naive assumptions of obviousness; but might instead require only that such basic moral beliefs are epistemically justified non-inferentially (Audi 1999; Shafer-Landau 2003). One candidate for what it might mean for a moral belief to be epistemically justified non-inferentially has involved an appeal to the model of perceptual beliefs (Blum 1991; DeLapp 2007). Non-moral perceptual beliefs are typically viewed as decisive vis-à-vis justification, provided the perceiver is in appropriate, reliable perceptual conditions. In other words, according to this view, the belief “There is a coffee mug in front of me” is epistemically justified just in case one takes oneself to be perceiving a coffee mug and provided that one is not suffering from hallucinations, merely using one’s peripheral vision, or in a dark room. (See also epistemology of perception.)
Although not addressing this issue of moral perception, Russ Shafer-Landau (2003) has argued on a related note that, ultimately, the difference between metaethical naturalism versus non-naturalism (as described in section 4a) might not be so much ontological or metaphysical, as it is epistemological. Specifically, according to Shafer-Landau, metaethical naturalists are those who require that the epistemic justification of moral beliefs be inferred on the basis of other non-moral beliefs about the natural world; whereas metaethical non-naturalists allow for the epistemic justification of moral beliefs to be terminated with some brute moral beliefs that are themselves sui generis.
Aside from the questions of the scope, source, and justification of moral beliefs, another epistemological facet of metaethics concerns the explanatory role that putative moral properties play with respect to moral beliefs. A useful way to frame this issue is by reference to Roderick Chisholm’s (1981) influential point about direct attribution. Chisholm noted that we refer to external things by attributing properties to them directly. Using this language, we may frame the metaethical question as whether or not our attribution of moral properties to actions, characters, and so forth, is “direct” (that is, external). Gilbert Harman (1977) has famously argued that our attribution of moral properties is not direct in this way. According to Harman, objective moral properties, if they existed, would be explanatorily impotent, in the sense that our specific, first-order moral beliefs can already be sufficiently accounted for by appealing to naturalistic, psychological, or perceptual factors. For example, if we were to witness people gleefully torturing a defenseless animal, we would likely form the belief that their action is morally wrong; but, according to Harman, we could adequately explain this moral evaluation solely by citing various sociological, emotional, behavioral, and perceptual causal factors, without needing to posit any mysterious additional properties that our evaluation is also channeling. This explanatory impotence, Harman believes, constitutes a serious disanalogy between, on the one hand, the role that abstract metaethical properties play in actual (first-order) moral judgments and, on the other hand, the role that theoretical scientific entities play in actual (first-order) perceptual judgments. For example, imagine that we were witnessing the screen-representation of a particle accelerator, instead of people torturing an animal. Although we do not literally see a subatomic particle on the screen (rather, we see a bunch of pixels which we interpret as referring to a subatomic particle) any more than we literally see “wrongness” floating around the animal-torturers, the essential difference between the two cases is that the additional abstract belief that there really are subatomic particles is necessary to explain why we infer them on the basis of screen-pixels; whereas, according to Harman, the alleged property of objective “wrongness” is unnecessary to explain why we disapprove of torture. Nicholas Sturgeon (1988), however, has argued contrary to Harman that second-order metaethical properties do play legitimate explanatory roles, for the simple reason that they are cited in people’s justification of why they find the torturing of animals morally wrong. Thus, for Sturgeon, what will count as the “best explanation” of a phenomenon—namely, the phenomenon of morally condemning the torturing of an animal—must be understood in the broader context of our overall explanatory goals, one of which will be to make sense of why we think that torturing animals is objectively wrong in the first place.
Although much of analytic metaethics concerns rarified debates that can often be highly abstracted from actual, applied moral concerns, several metaethical positions have also drawn heavily on cultural anthropological considerations to motivate or flesh-out their views. After all, as discussed above in section one, it has often been actual, historical moments of cultural instability or diversity that have stimulated metaethical reflection on the nature and status of moral values.
One of the most influential anthropological aspects of metaethics concerns the apparent challenge that pervasive and persistent cross-cultural moral disagreement would seem to present for moral realists or objectivists. If, as the realist envisions, moral values were truly universal and objective, then why is it the case that so many different people seem to have such drastically different convictions about what is right and wrong? The more plausible explanation of the fact that people persistently disagree about moral matters, so the argument goes, is simply that there are no objective moral truths capable of settling their dispute. As opposed to the apparent convergence in other, non-moral realms of dispute (for example, scientific, perceptual, and so forth), moral disagreement seems both ubiquitous and largely resistant to rational adjudication. J.L. Mackie (1977) leverages these features of moral disagreement to motivate what he calls The Argument from Relativity. This argument begins with the descriptive, anthropological observation that different cultures endorse different moral values and practices, and then argues as an inference to the most likely explanation of this fact that metaethical relativism best accounts for such cross-cultural discrepancies.
Mackie refers to such cross-cultural moral differences as “well-known” and, indeed, it seems prima facie obvious that different cultures have different practices. Mackie’s argument, however, seeks a diversity of practices that is not merely descriptively different on the surface, but that is deeply morally different, if not ultimately incommensurable. James Rachels (1986) describes the difference between surface, descriptive difference versus deep, moral difference by reference to the well-worn example of the traditional Inuit practice of leaving elders to die from exposure. Although at the surface level of description, this practice seems radically different from contemporary Western attitudes toward the ethical treatment of the elderly (pervasive elder-abuse notwithstanding), the underlying moral justification for the practice—namely, that material resources are limited, the elders themselves choose this fate, the practice is a way for elders to die with dignity, and so forth—sounds remarkably similar in spirit to the familiar sorts of moral values contemporary Westerners invoke.
Cultural anthropology itself has generated controversy regarding the extent as well as the metaethical significance of moral differences at the deep level of fundamental justifications and values. Responding to both the assumption of cultural superiority as well as the Romantic attraction to viewing exotic cultures as Noble Savages, early twentieth-century anthropologists frequently adopted a methodology of relativism, on the grounds that accurate empirical information would be ignored if a cultural difference was examined with any a priori moral bias. An early exponent of this anthropological relativism was William Graham Sumner (1906) who, reflecting on what he referred to as different cultural folkways (that is, traditions or practices), claimed provocatively that, “the folkways are their own warrant.” Numerous anthropologists who were influenced by Franz Boas (1911) adopted a similar refusal to morally evaluate cross-cultural differences, culminating in an explicit embrace of metaethical relativism by anthropologists such as Ruth Benedict (1934) and Melville Herskovits (1952).
Several notable philosophers in the Continental tradition have also affirmed the sociological and anthropological relativism mentioned above. Specifically, the deconstructivism of Jacques Derrida, with its suspicion regarding “logocentric” biases, might be understood as a warning against metaethical objectivism. Instead, a deconstructivist might argue that ethical meaning (like all meaning) is characterized by what Derrida called différance, that is, an intractable un-decidability. (See Derrida (1996), however, for the possibility of a less relativistic deconstructivist ethics.) Other contemporary Continental approaches have similarly eschewed realism. For example, Mary Daly (1978) has defended a radical feminist critique of the sexual biases inherent in how we talk about values. For other perspectives on the possible tensions between feminism and the metaethics of cultural diversity, see Okin (1999) and Nussbaum (1999: 29-54). Michel Foucault (1984) is also well-known for his general criticism of the uses and abuses of power in the construction and expression of moral valuations pertaining to mental health, sexuality, and criminality. Similar critiques concerning the transplantation of a particular set of cultural values to other cultural contexts have been expressed by a number of post-colonialists and literary theorists, who have theorized about the imperialism, silencing (Spivak 1988), Orientalism (Said 1978), and cultural hybridity (Bhabha 1994) such moral universalism may involve.
For all the apparent cross-cultural moral diversity, however, there have also been several suggestions against extending anthropological relativism to the metaethical level. First, a variety of empirical studies seem to suggest that the degree of moral similarity at the deep level of fundamental justifications and values may be greater than Boas and his students anticipated. Thus, for example, Jonathan Haidt (2004) has argued that cross-cultural differences show strong evidence of resolving around a finite number of basic moral values (what Haidt calls “modules”). From a somewhat more abstract perspective, Thomas Kasulis (2002) has also defended the view that cross-cultural differences can be sorted into two fundamental “orientations.” However, the congealing of cross-cultural differences around a small, finite number of basic values need not prove moral realism—for, those basic values may themselves still be ultimately relative to human needs and perspectives (compare, Wong 2006).
There are also several theoretical challenges to inferring metaethical relativism from anthropological differences. For one thing, as Michele Moody-Adams (1997) has argued, metaethical assessments about the degree or depth of moral differences are “empirically underdetermined” by the anthropological description of the practices themselves. For example, anthropological data about the moral content of a culturally different practice may be biased on behalf of the cultural informant who supplies the data or characterization. Similar critiques of cross-cultural moral relativism have leveraged what is known as The Principle of Charity—the hermeneutic insight that differences must at least be commensurable enough to even be framed as “different” from one another in the first place. Thus, goes the argument, if cross-cultural moral differences were so radically different as to be incomparable to one another, we could never truly morally disagree at all; we would instead be simply “talking past” one another (compare Davidson 2001). Much of our ability to translate between the moral practices of one culture and another—an ability central to the very enterprise of comparative philosophy—presupposes that even moral differences are still recognizably moral differences at root.
In addition to accommodating or accounting for the existence of moral disagreements, metaethics has also been thought to provide some insight concerning how we should respond to such differences at the normative or political level. Most often, debates concerning the morally appropriate response to moral differences have been framed against analyses concerning the relationship between metaethics and toleration. On the one hand, tolerating practices and values with which one might disagree has been a hallmark of liberal democratic societies. Should this permissive attitude, however, be extended indiscriminately to all values and practices with which one disagrees? Are some moral differences simply intolerable, such that it would undermine one’s own moral convictions to even attempt to tolerate them? More vexingly, is it conceptually possible or desirable to tolerate the intolerance of others (a paradox sometimes referred to as the Liberal’s Dilemma)? Karl Popper (1945) famously argued against the toleration of intolerance, which he saw as an overly-indulgent extension of the concept and one which would undermine the “open society” he believed to be a prerequisite for toleration in the first place. By contrast, John Rawls (1971) has argued that toleration—even of intolerance—is a constitutive part of justice (derivable from what Rawls calls the “liberty principle” of justice), such that failure to be tolerant would entail failure to satisfy one of the requirements of justice. Rawls emphasizes, however, that genuine toleration need not lead to utopia or agreement, and that it is substantially different from a mere modus vivendi, that is, simply putting up with one another because we are powerless to do otherwise. According to Rawls, true toleration requires that we seek to bring our differences into an “overlapping consensus,” which he claims will be possible due to an inherent incompleteness and “looseness in our comprehensive views” (2001: 193).
The value of toleration is often claimed as an exclusive asset of individual metaethical theories. For example, metaethical relativists frequently argue that only by acknowledging the ultimately subjective and conventional nature of morality can we make sense of why we should not morally judge others’ values or practices—after all, according to relativism, there would be no culture-transcendent standard against which to make such judgments. For this reason, Neil Levy claims that, “The perception that relativism promotes, or is the expression of, tolerance of difference is almost certainly the single most important factor in explaining its attraction” (2002: 56). Indeed, even metaethical realists (Shafer-Landau 2004: 30-31) often observe that undergraduate endorsements of relativism seem to be motivated by an anxiety about condemning foreign practices. Despite the apparent leeway with respect to moral differences that metaethical relativism would appear to allow, several realists have argued, by contrast, that relativism could equally be as compatible with intolerance. After all, goes the argument, if nothing is objectively or universally morally wrong, then a fortiori intolerant practices cannot be said to be universally or objectively wrong either. People or cultures who do not approve of an intolerant practice would only be reflecting their own culture’s commitment to toleration (compare Graham 1996). For this reason, several metaethicists have argued that realism alone can support the commitment to toleration as a universal value—such that intolerance can be morally condemned—because only realism allows for the existence of universal, objective moral values (compare, Shafer-Landau 2004: 30-33). Nicholas Rescher (1993) expresses a related worry about what he calls “indifferentism”—a nihilistic nonchalance regarding specific ethical commitments that might be occasioned by an embrace of metaethical relativism. Rescher’s own solution to the potential problem of indifferentism (he calls his view “contextualism” or “perspectival rationalism”) involves the recognition of the reasons-giving nature of circumstances, such that different situations may supply their own “local” justifications for particular political or moral commitments.
The question of which metaethical theory—realism or relativism—can lay better claim to toleration, however, has been complicated by reflection on what “toleration” truly involves and whether it is always, in fact, a moral value. Andrew Cohen (2004), for instance, has argued that “toleration” by definition must involve some negative evaluation of the practice or value that is tolerated. Thus, on this analysis, it would seem that one may only tolerate that which one finds intolerable. This has led philosophers such as Bernard Williams (1996) to question whether toleration—understood as requiring moral disapproval—is even possible, let alone whether it is truly a moral value itself. (For more discussion on toleration, see Heyd 1996.) In a related vein, Richard Rorty (1989) has argued that what a society finds intolerant is itself morally constitutive of that society’s identity, and that recognition of the metaethical contingency of one’s particular social tolerance might itself provide an important sense of political “solidarity.” For these reasons, other philosophers have considered alternative understandings of toleration that might be more amenable to particular metaethical theories. David B. Wong (2006: 228-272), for example, has developed an account of what he calls accommodation, according to which even relativists may still share a higher-order commitment to the need for different practices and values to be arranged in such a way as to minimize social and political friction.
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Kevin M. DeLapp
U. S. A.
Last updated: November 13, 2011 | Originally published: October 13, 2011