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Metrocles was a Cynic philosopher from Maroneia in Thrace who flourished around 300 BCE. He began his study of philosophy as a pupil in Aristotle’s Lyceum, and later became a follower of Crates the Cynic. Metrocles’ sister Hipparchia was married to Crates.
The story of Metrocles’ conversion to Cynicism is reported by Diogenes Laertius. (It is important to remember that Diogenes is writing several centuries later, and that his accounts often contain inaccuracies, as well as some false stories which were passed down insofar as they were taken to be illustrative of a particular philosopher or tradition.) Metrocles had reportedly passed gas while practicing a speech, and was so distraught that he shut himself up at home, intending to commit suicide by abstaining from food. (VI.94.3-5) Crates the Cynic philosopher then visited him and made a dinner of lentils. (94.5-6) First, Crates tried to persuade Metrocles by means of reason that he had committed no offense, for something “monstrous” would have resulted had he not expelled the air according to nature. (94.7-10) Metrocles was finally turned from despair when Crates himself farted, because of the similarity of the two events. (94.10-12) Afterwards, Metrocles became skilled in philosophy as the student of Crates. (94.12-13)
This brief story illustrates the folly of adherence to social convention, which the Cynic rejects in favor of a life according to nature. The absurdity of young Metrocles’ exaggerated reaction to his violation of decorum stands in sharp contrast to Crates’ cheerful acceptance of the natural bodily functions. The lentils themselves are symbolically significant: not only were they useful for encouraging Crates’ flatulence, but they were often praised by Cynics as a humble, efficient food. The choice of this meal, which probably seemed crude by Metrocles’ formerly aristocratic standards, is a means of refusing the conventional preference for delicate, fancy foods in favor of a simple, self-sufficient approach to nutrition. The story is also a typical example of the Cynic use of humor to teach a moral lesson: Metrocles is not persuaded by Crates’ reasoned argument, but abandons his gloom only when he witnesses Crates performing the same impolite but natural deed, which one easily imagines would have provoked mirth.
- Diogenes Laertius, Lives of Eminent Philosophers, Vol. II, tr. R. D. Hicks (Cambridge: Harvard University Press) 1925 (reprint 1995), VI.96-98.
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