Emile Meyerson, a chemist and philosopher of science, proposed that the explanations of science are governed by two fundamental principles of reason, namely, the principle of lawfulness and the principle of causality. While the contents of explanations change through history as the explanatory theories of science move from early atomism and qualitative theories to relativity physics and quantum mechanics, the form of thought stays the same, Meyerson said. The following article provides an overview of his life, influence, philosophy of science, and writings.
Meyerson studies the theories of science from the point of view of psychology. His work spans a 2500-year period of developments in science, and he claims that the goal of reason to explain and control nature is the same now as always because of the action of two innate psychological principles. Meyerson then extends their range to the realm of common sense. His study generates two main questions. The first concerns the accuracy of what he says about the mind, while the second applies his discovery to the course of future developments in science. Can the proper use of these psychological principles help us avoid bad science?
Meyerson calls his two innate psychological principles “lawfulness and causality.” The first principle of reason leads us to expect the regularity of natural events. We expect to find that the relationship between conditions and property behavior in nature remains constant. In his words, “our acts are performed in view of an end which we foresee; but this foresight would be entirely impossible if we did not have the absolute conviction that nature is well ordered, that certain antecedents determine and will always determine certain consequences” (IR 19). The second innate principle, causality, leads us to expect identities between the antecedent and consequent of a change. This principle underlies the success of scientific laws.
Emile Meyerson was born in Lublin Poland on February 12, 1859. In 1870, he traveled to Heidelberg, Germany, to study chemistry with Wilhelm Bunsen and Hermann Kopp, and to Berlin to study chemistry with Liebermann. He came to France at age 22 and spent two years (1882-1884) at the Schulzenberger laboratory of the College de France to complete his studies in chemistry. In 1884 he served as Director of a dye factory in Argenteuil, but after a bitter disappointment with applied chemistry (see, Frédéric Lefevre, ‘Une heure avec M. Emile Meyerson’ In Les Nouvelles Littéraires, Saturday, Nov. 6, 1926) he left in 1889 to read philosophy at the Nationale. He read Renouvier (who taught him how to apply a scientific background to philosophy), Kant (who taught him that the thing in itself was unknowable) and Descartes (who taught him about the mathematical nature of science). He read in the history of science for 19 years before publishing his first book in 1908. During this period he supported himself by working as foreign news correspondent with l’agence Havas (Meyerson was fluent in the major European languages.) He became a naturalized French citizen after the war. The greatest influences on his thought are Auguste Comte, Boutroux and Bergson, Poincaré and Duhem, Descartes and Kant. Meyerson labels himself an ‘antipositivist’. He spent afternoons at the library reading the history of science, and evenings at home in conversation with the leading thinkers of the day; notably Lévy-Brühl, Brunschvicg, Lalande, and Langevin (plagued by insomnia Meyerson rarely slept more than four hours a day.) Whenever Einstein was in Paris, he would make it a point to visit Meyerson. In 1897, Meyerson was appointed Director General of the Jewish Colonization Association (JCA). He viewed the appointment as an opportunity to encourage the establishment of a Jewish settlement in Palestine. Meyerson shared Spencer’s belief that the rules of natural selection that govern the animal world should apply equally to human societies. On Saturday, December 2, 1933, in Paris, France, Meyerson died in his sleep of a heart attack. He had been unwell for some time. An article by André George commemorating Meyerson’s contribution to the philosophy of science appeared in Les Nouvelles Littéraires Dec 9, 1933.
The Central Zionist Archives (CZA) in Jerusalem contains 5.6 metres (35 boxes) of material and many thousands of documents on Meyerson. See ‘Personal Papers’ A 408 Emile Meyerson. (Rochelle Rubinstein, 2004).
The work of Emile Meyerson is an investigation into the psychological principles that accompany scientific theories. His work forms an important chapter in the history of science. From the first appearance of Identité et réalité in 1908, Emile Meyerson has been acclaimed as one of the most stimulating thinkers of our time. The title ‘Profound Philosopher,’ which Bergson conferred upon him in 1909, never left him. Einstein published an article in 1928 in which he expressed approval and admiration for what Meyerson said about the psychology of relativity physics. George Boas and André Metz are two of a long list of philosophers that wrote major books on his philosophy. Boas spent time with Meyerson getting to know him personally, while Metz is a life-long disciple. J. Lowenberg hailed him as a new Kant and thought that Meyerson had provided an important refutation of positivism. L. Lichtenstein at the University of Leipzig and C. De Koninck at Laval University developed courses on his philosophy. Scholars such as Blumberg, Bachelard, Brunschvieg, Lalande, Maritain, Schlick, and Sée, have been impressed by his work. Many doctoral dissertations are written on Meyerson’s work. André Bonnard, Charles De Koninck, T. R. Kelly, Joseph La Lumia, George Mourélos, Henri Sée, C.G. Sterling, O. Stumper, and W. A. Wallace have each written a book on his philosophy. Meyerson’s study of the history of scientific developments influenced modern French historiography of science (Alexandre Koyré, Hélène Metzger…)
References to Meyerson’s work are abbreviated IR (trans.) for Identity and Reality; ES for De l’explication dans les sciences; DR for La déduction relativiste; CP for Du cheminement de la pensée; RD for Réel et déterminisme dans la physique quantique. These along with Essais, a posthumous publication of his major articles, make up the whole of his work.
Meyerson’s work is a study of scientific inductions, past and present. He examined the works of science to determine the psychological nature of scientific thought. Whereas Auguste Comte had argued that the ‘principle of lawfulness’ (the description of phenomena) governs the whole of thought, Meyerson’s evidence suggested to him that this was not the whole of thought. Science, he says, attempts equally to explain phenomena. This explanation consists in the identification of antecedent and consequent. His empirical study of scientific theories, old and new, proposes that two innate principles of reason regulate how the scientist views reality. The first rational principle predisposes a scientist to expect that nature shall attend herself with some degree of regularity. The second principle, leads a scientist to expect that the identification of antecedent and consequent shall explain the phenomena of observation. The name he reserves for these two psychological principles is lawfulness and causality, respectively. Meyerson claimed that the principles of reason were factual rather than normative.
Meyerson said that Comte did not pursue explanations in science because he limited the psychology of thought to the first of these principles. Comte did this because he was convinced that a too detailed investigation of nature would be counter-productive and lead to incoherent or sterile results. For instance, he protested strongly against the “abuse of microscopic research and the exaggerated merit still too often accorded to a means of investigation so dubious.” (IR 21). Comte expressed horror of all explanatory theory. Meyerson expressed the fundamental distinction between the principles of reason (and between Comte and himself) as follows:
The law states simply that, conditions happening to be modified in a determined manner, the actual properties of the substance must undergo an equally determined modification; whereas according to the causal principle there must be equality between causes and effects—that is, the original properties plus the change of conditions must equal the transformed properties. (ibid.,41).
According to Meyerson, the ways of reason provide evidence that both principles are in use whenever we think. In other words, science expresses a belief that its proportionality relationships (the principle of lawfulness) are grounded in an underlying structure (the principle of causality) or what Meyerson calls ‘ontology’. Thus, he says, description or lawfulness is not the only business of science. The concern for structure cannot remain foreign to science. Meyerson’s argument was based on a detailed study of the psychological principles that accompany all scientific inductions, past and present.
Meyerson’s research proposes that his work (which is essentially philosophy of mind; see Essais 59-105) shows that the psychological need to identify phenomena (the effect of the causal postulate) explains the developments of science. For instance, he says it generates the atomic theories of science. The focus of explanation is on positing the persistence of identities (to think is to identify), not on the nature of the persistent residuum. While science no longer thinks of the atom as being an irreducible unit, the causal postulate pushes the search for identities to an investigation for smaller constituents within the atom. Meyerson suggested that the same rational tendency to identify matter created the principles of conservation and ultimately lead to the elimination of time. The identification of antecedent and consequent of a change eliminated the difference between them, and therefore time. He claimed (following Spencer) that matter as eternal is just as it has to be to satisfy the ways of reason. Meyerson writes that the causal postulate creates the concept of the unity of matter and leads to ‘the assimilation of this latter with space’ (IR Ch. 7). The causal postulate ultimately leads to the annihilation of the external world. Meyerson explained this feat as a two-step movement of the causal postulate. The first movement of explanation identifies antecedent and consequent and thereby explains differences away. This step halts the movement of time because when nothing happens (a consequence of the identification of antecedent and consequent) time does not exist. Eternal matter is reduced to space. However, the march of the causal postulate is ongoing as the explanations of reason and the search for identities enter a second phase. In this case, Meyerson claims that the sufficient reason of matter is traced to the space that envelops it. The causal postulate establishes identity between matter and space. At this point nothing is left because space now empty of contents vanishes in turn.
The causal postulate and the tendency to reduce the whole of reality to an all-inclusive identity proposition failed. Science reacted, says Meyerson, and this reaction was expressed by Carnot’s principle (Meyerson calls Carnot the ‘hero of science’). The ‘irrationals’ of science such as transitive action and impact arise because reality does not lend itself to the (Eleatic) goal of total identification. We do not have the identities of antecedent and consequent supposed by the causal postulate. Carnot’s principle saves science. He reminds us that it costs energy to do work and the fully reversible reaction of rational mechanics is an illusion. Meyerson described the ‘irrationals’ of science as places of recalcitrance in reality, places that refuse to lend themselves to the formula of identification.
At this point, Meyerson introduced the distinction between identification and identities. We hope for full explanations (identification) of reality but achieve only partial explanations (identities). Meyerson fuses the convergence and divergence of reason and reality into what he terms the ‘plausible propositions’ of science (ibid., 148). He says that all scientific theories are generated this way as they reveal a mix of an a priori tendency to identify and the a posteriori elements of experience that resist total identification. The ‘plausible’ propositions of science are best expressed through mathematics since it provides a mechanism to preserve diversity while expressing identity. For instance, the proposition 7 plus 5 equals 12 expresses identity while accounting for the differences between antecedent and consequent. Meyerson attributes the discovery of this application (the mathematical method) to René Descartes.
CP extends the causal postulate to the world of common sense. The world we see upon awakening each morning is the result of the activity of the causal postulate. Reason must have its identities and cannot tolerate the fleetingness of sensations. We create the world as a place to house sensations in their absence. The world of common sense arises out of the hypostasis of sensations. This action provides an ontological foundation for science. Science purifies the world of common sense by subjecting it to additional layers of identification. Meyerson said that the constructs of science—electrons, atoms—are more real than the objects of common sense because they arise out of several coatings of identification.
The formula of identification recognizes that diversity is itself an irrational. Reason cannot know the real without reducing it to something other than itself. Meyerson is in full agreement with the Kantian view that reality is essentially unknowable or noumenal. The thing in itself cannot be known since the ways of reason spontaneously transform diversity into identity (RD 21.) The explanatory structure of science depends on the discovery of identities in diversity. But that discovery leads to the (Kantian) conclusion that reality in itself is unknowable. Does this mean that (lawfulness) description remains the only business of science? Not at all! Meyerson does not change his mind about the insufficiencies of positivistic epistemology. He reminds us that the causal postulate is factual rather than normative. The point about causality is that something must persist. The irrational nature of diversity means that some aspect of reality will always remain unknown. Error comes out of hastily constructed theories, theories with few instances of identifications, not the causal postulate. The principles of lawfulness and causality are the core structure of reason. To explain is to identify. Meyerson says that to identify is to discover sufficient reasons, as was clear to Leibniz; “Things are thus because they were already previously thus” (IR 43). Meyerson said there is no evidence to suggest that the way we think will ever change. In the past, the human mind has never modified its essence. Thus, this form of thought will shape the future of scientific developments. However, he explained the evolution of science as a two-pronged movement of reason. First, science is an attempt to generate a theory of everything through the discovery of increasingly comprehensive identity propositions. Second, we experience changes in the relationship between reason and reality. For instance the shift from the Newtonian view of homogeneous space to the heterogeneous space of relativity physics (see DR) arose because the concept space has been shown to obtain a posteriori. Experience (now) teaches us that space is not the same everywhere and therefore the concept cannot come from reason (is not a priori). Meyerson’s criticism of positivistic epistemology (and the ‘Copenhagen’ view of quantum theory) earned Einstein’s approval because it explained how the forms of reason lead to the reducibility of matter and time to heterogeneous space (see ‘the success of relativism’ In DR Ch. 16—133: ‘La réussite du relativisme’.)
Kenneth A. Bryson
Cape Breton University
Last updated: June 27, 2005 | Originally published: