If Aristotle had not been a student of Plato, then would Aristotle have chosen to start his school at Lyceum? If you believe God knows the answer to this question, you probably believe God has middle knowledge.
Middle knowledge is a form of knowledge first attributed to God by the sixteenth century Jesuit theologian Luis de Molina (pictured to the left). It is best characterized as God’s prevolitional knowledge of all true counterfactuals of creaturely freedom. This knowledge is seen by its proponents as the key to understanding the compatibility of divine providence and creaturely (libertarian) freedom (see Free Will).
Table of Contents
- Scientia Media
- Objections to Middle Knowledge
- Rejection of Libertarian Freedom
- The Truth of Counterfactuals of Creaturely Freedom
- The Usefulness of Middle Knowledge
- References and Further Readings
Before an examination of the theory of middle knowledge can be offered, several assumptions must be set forth. Each of these assumptions is important for an understanding of the doctrine of middle knowledge and its usefulness for theological reflection.
First, it is assumed that for an action to be free, it must be determined by the agent performing the action. This means that God cannot will a free creature to act in a particular way and the act still be free. Free actions must be self-determinative. This assumption may appear self-evident to some, and quite controversial to others. While it must be admitted that God could certainly desire a creature act in a particular way and the choice remain free, it is difficult to see how He could cause the choice and it still be free in a meaningful way. Proponents of middle knowledge do not deny that God may influence a free choice or persuade an agent to act in a particular way, but such influence and persuasion cannot be determinative if the action performed is to be free. In addition, middle knowledge requires freedom of a libertarian nature. That is, free creatures have the ability to choose between competing alternatives, and really could choose one or the other of the alternatives.
Second, it has become customary to speak of a logical priority in divine thoughts. This is not to deny the simplicity or omniscience of God, or to say that He gains knowledge that He did not previously possess. Rather, it is simply to acknowledge that dependency relationships exist between certain kinds of knowledge. It is also to acknowledge that something analogous to deliberation may take place in the divine mind. For example, in order for God to know that one plus one equals two, He must first comprehend the meaning of the concepts represented by the numbers, mathematical symbols, and formulaic expressions; they serve as a basis by which the truthfulness of the formula may be evaluated. But this is not to say that there was a time when God did not know 1+1=2. Thus, a relationship of logical priority, but not necessarily temporal priority exists between some of the content of divine knowledge.
Third, proponents of the doctrine of middle knowledge believe that things could have been different than they, in fact, are. There is much that is not necessary about the way the world is. For example, I could have married someone other than Stefana, the woman I did marry. Of course, that would depend upon my falling in love with someone else and that woman agreeing to my proposal of marriage. Although I find it difficult to imagine my falling in love with someone else (I love my wife very much), the point is that there is nothing about my marrying Stefana that is necessary. Stefana was free to reject my offer of marriage, I was free to never ask her out, we may never have existed, etc. Or, for another example, God could have made things differently. The sky could be yellow instead of blue, or the grass pink. God could have chosen to not create at all. Although this assumption should be self-evident, it is also supported by the Heisenberg Uncertainty Principle. Things could have been different.
Molina’s doctrine is called scientia media, or middle knowledge, because it stands in the middle of the two traditional categories of divine epistemology as handed down by Aquinas, natural and free knowledge. It shares characteristics of each and, in the logical order of the divine deliberative process regarding creation, it follows natural knowledge but precedes free knowledge.
Natural knowledge is that part of God’s knowledge which He knows by His very nature or essence, and since His essence is necessary, so is that which is known through it. That is, the content of natural knowledge includes all metaphysically necessary truths. For example, the statement, “All bachelors are unmarried” is both necessary and part of natural knowledge. Other examples include other tautologies, mathematical certainties (e.g., 1+1=2), and all possibilities (since all possibilities are necessarily so). Natural knowledge can therefore be thought of as including a virtually infinite number of propositions of the form, It is possible that p, as well as a number of propositions of the form, It is the case that p. Thus, natural knowledge, properly conceived, is that part of God’s knowledge which could not have been different from what it is. It follows from this fact that the content of God’s natural knowledge is independent of His will; God has no control over the truth of the propositions He knows by natural knowledge. Consider, for example, the mathematical truth, 1+1=2. No matter what God wills, it will always be true that the concepts represented by the symbols 1, 2, +, and =, when arranged in a formulaic expression, one plus one equals two. It is important to note that, because natural knowledge is independent from God’s will and, to some extent, places limits upon the kinds of things God can do, natural knowledge informs(ed) God’s decision(s) regarding His creative work. This also means that natural knowledge is prevolitional.
Free knowledge is that part of God’s knowledge which He knows by His knowledge of His own will, both His desires and what He will, in fact, do. The content of this knowledge is made up of truths which refer to what actually exists (or has existed, or will exist). For example, the statement, “John Laing exists,” although certainly true, is dependent upon God’s choice to create me (or, more properly, to actualize a world where I am brought about), and hence, is part of God’s free knowledge. Free knowledge can therefore be thought of as including a number of propositions of the form, It is the case that p (Note that propositions of the forms, It was the case that p, and It will be the case that p, can be reduced to a proposition which refers to the present). Since free knowledge comes from God’s creative act of will, two things follow. First, the content of that knowledge is contingent; it could have been different from what it, in fact, is. That is, free knowledge includes only metaphysically contingent truths, or truths that could have been prevented by God if He chose to create different situations, different creatures, or to not create at all. Second, free knowledge is postvolitional; it is dependent upon God’s will.
As previously noted, middle knowledge is so named because it comes between natural and free knowledge in God’s deliberations regarding the creative process. According to the theory, middle knowledge is like natural knowledge in that it is prevolitional, or prior to God’s choice to create. This, of course, also means that the content of middle knowledge is true independent of God’s will and therefore, He has no control over it. Yet, it is not the same as natural knowledge because, like free knowledge, its content is contingent. The doctrine of middle knowledge proposes that God has knowledge of metaphysically necessary states of affairs via natural knowledge, of what He intends to do via free knowledge, and in addition, of what free creatures would do if they were instantiated (via middle knowledge). Thus, the content of middle knowledge is made up of truths which refer to what would be the case if various states of affairs were to obtain. For example, the statement, “If John Laing were given the opportunity to write an article on middle knowledge for the Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy, he would freely do so,” although true, is certainly not necessarily so. I could easily have refrained from writing, if I were so inclined (or too busy, etc.). Likewise, its truth does not seem to be dependent upon God’s will in the same way that “John Laing exists” is. Even if God chose to not create me, the statement regarding my writing the article could still be true. In fact, its truth does not seem to be dependent upon God’s will at all, but rather upon my will. One of the basic assumptions of the doctrine of middle knowledge outlined above is that God cannot will a creature to freely choose anything. Thus, the content of middle knowledge can be thought of as including a virtually infinite number of propositions of the form, If person, P, were in situation, S, then P would freely perform action, A (or P(S®A)).
The theory of middle knowledge presents a picture of divine omniscience which includes not only knowledge of the past, present and future, but also knowledge of conditional future contingents (propositions which refer to how free creatures will choose in various circumstances), counterfactuals (propositions which refer to how things would actually be if circumstances were different than they are or will be), and counterfactuals of creaturely freedom (propositions which refer to what a free creature would have chosen (freely) to do if things had been different). This knowledge, together with natural knowledge, informs God’s decision about what He will do with reference to creation.
One of the most useful concepts for the explanation and evaluation of middle knowledge is that of possible worlds. The basic belief that things could have been different is commonly described as belief in many possible worlds. Each complete set of possible states of affairs (or way things could be) is a possible world, and although there is an extremely large number of possible worlds, it is not infinite (some states of affairs are impossible), and only one is actual (the way things are).
In the contemporary discussion of possible worlds, two concepts have proven particularly instructive: actualization and similarity. In popular piety, it is not unusual to refer to God creating the world. However, in possible worlds semantics, this is seen as semantically improper. Instead, God’s creative activity should be referred to as creating the heavens and the Earth, but actualizing a particular possible world (since possible states of affairs do not have a beginning, which the language of creation implies). According to the doctrine of Molinism, God can actualize a world where His will is brought about by the free decisions of creatures, but in order to make this claim, contemporary Molinists have had to distinguish between strong and weak actualization. Strong actualization refers to the efforts of a being when it causally determines the occurrence of an event (e.g., God causes something to happen), while weak actualization refers to the contribution of a being to the occurrence of an event by placement of a free creature in circumstances in which he will freely cause the event. Weak actualization has proven to be a powerful tool for understanding the relationship between God’s providence and human freedom. However, it must be noted that it implies that there may be some states of affairs that God cannot weakly actualize, which leads to the further conclusion that there may be some possible worlds that God cannot actualize.
A more controversial aspect of modern Molinism has been the use of possible worlds in determining the truth of counterfactuals. According to possible worlds semantics, a counterfactual is true in the actual world if it is true in the possible (but not actual) world that is most similar to the actual world. Not all Molinists have accepted this approach, noting the difficulty in determining comparative similarity among possible worlds.
Much of the current discussion of middle knowledge has developed in the context of debate over the validity of the doctrine. Three basic objections to Molinism have been proffered: 1) Rejection of Libertarian Free Will, 2) The Truth of Counterfactuals of Creaturely Freedom, and 3) The Usefulness of Middle Knowledge for God’s Creative Decision.
The principle objection to middle knowledge in Molina’s day was that it afforded creatures such a high view of freedom that God’s providence was compromised. Although Molina’s detractors were certainly motivated by political concerns, the strength of their theological and philosophical arguments cannot be denied. Today, this form of argument normally takes one of two forms. First, some theologians/philosophers have objected to the assumption that God cannot will the free actions of creatures. This argument will often be based on an appeal to mystery or the transcendence of God. God, it is said, works on a plane above that of creatures, and therefore can will an action of an individual while not impinging on his freedom. Second, and more commonly, some have objected to the concept of libertarian freedom and instead advocate compatibilist freedom. Whereas libertarian freedom is seen as the ability to choose between competing alternatives, compatibilist freedom is seen as the ability to choose in accordance with one’s desires. It is argued that libertarian freedom is radically indeterministic or even incoherent—if one’s desires are not determinative for his decision, then it appears that no decision can be made.
Proponents of libertarian freedom have responded that it is the individual’s will which is determinative for the choice made. They have also pointed out that proponents of compatibilist freedom must believe that God possesses libertarian freedom in order to avoid theological fatalism: either God was able to choose to create or not create, for example, or He had to create. Since most theologians want to avoid the claim that God could always act in only one way, they must admit the coherence of libertarian freedom. At this point, then, the complaint with libertarian creaturely freedom can only be one of veracity—that it simply does not accurately explain the creaturely decision-making process. Proponents of libertarian freedom have pointed out that this claim cannot be proven, and that from an existential standpoint, it seems to be false. It should be noted that the majority of philosophers hold to libertarian freedom and these objections have been primarily entertained in the theological arena.
The second type of objection to Molinism is really an attack on the belief, fundamental to the doctrine of middle knowledge, in counterfactuals of creaturely freedom. Many scholars have called into question the possibility that counterfactuals of creaturely freedom can be true. Various approaches have been taken to make this claim, from questioning the principle of conditional excluded middle, to arguing that true counterfactuals require determinism, to contending that counterfactuals of creaturely freedom have nothing which makes them true. Each will be presented, albeit only briefly.
The first approach to arguing that counterfactuals of creaturely freedom cannot be true has come in the form of an attack on the principle of conditional excluded middle. The principle of conditional excluded middle states that, given two conditional statements with the same antecedent and opposite consequents, one must be true (Either p®q or p®~q). It is thought that Molinism requires the principle to hold because counterfactuals of freedom are often presented in pairs. For example, consider the following pair of conditional statements:
(1) If John were to ask Stefana to marry him, she would accept; and
(2) If John were to ask Stefana to marry him, she would not accept.
Although, properly speaking, these are not counterfactuals, since I did ask Stefana to marry me, in the literature it has become customary to speak of all conditional statements of this sort as counterfactuals. According to the doctrine of middle knowledge, one of either (1) or (2) must be true, and God knew which would be true prior to His free knowledge. However, if conditional excluded middle can be shown to be false, then the contention that one of a pair of counterfactuals must be true, cannot be sustained.
David Lewis has provided an example of two conditional statements which (he claims) seem equally true:
(3) If Verdi and Bizet were compatriots, Bizet would be Italian;
(4) If Verdi and Bizet were compatriots, Bizet would not be Italian.
It is unclear which statement is correct, yet according to CEM, one must be true. (3) could be true. After all, if Bizet were Italian, he and Verdi would be compatriots. However, (4) could also be true (if Verdi were French). It seems just as likely for Verdi to have been French as Bizet to have been Italian and therefore, neither (3) nor (4) is true. The principle of conditional excluded middle fails, and so does middle knowledge.
Two basic responses have been offered by proponents of Molinism. First, some have questioned the accuracy of Lewis’ contention that (3) is just as likely to be true as (4). In deciding which is true, a judgment call has to be made regarding the relative similarity of possible worlds to the actual world, a. Suppose (3) is true in a possible world, b, and b is more similar, or closer, to a than any other possible world in which (3) is true. Suppose further that (4) is true in a possible world, g, and g is closer to a than any other possible world in which (4) is true. According to the standard possible worlds semantics, (3) is true if b is closer to a than g is, and (4) is true if g is closer to a than b is. However, Lewis argues that b and g may be equally similar to a and therefore, neither (3) nor (4) is true—they have an equal chance of being true.
However, it seems that this is not the case—the inability to determine which possible world, b or g, is closer to the actual world, a, appears to be due more to a lack of knowledge about the actual world than genuine indeterminacy regarding similarity among worlds. It may also be due to a lack of criteria regarding how similarity among possible worlds is to be determined. Thus, the inability to determine which of (3) or (4) is true may be due to epistemological uncertainty rather than equal likelihood.
Second, it has been pointed out that middle knowledge does not require the principle of excluded middle, but rather only the principle of bivalence. Lewis’ example does not present a problem for middle knowledge because the counterfactuals do not refer to creaturely activity and because two kinds of change are possible (Bizet could be Italian or Verdi could be French). In a counterfactual of creaturely freedom, only one sort of change is possible—either the creature performs the required action, or he/she does not. The only variable in the example given previously was Stefana’s action in response to the proposal. She could either accept, or not accept. Since only one variable exists, only the principle of bivalence is necessary.
The second approach to arguing that counterfactuals of creaturely freedom cannot be true has come in the form of an assertion that Molinism leads to determinism and therefore, the counterfactuals do not refer to free actions. Several forms of this argument have been offered.
The first form has been to question the amount of risk God takes. Since middle knowledge affords God comprehensive knowledge of the future (when taken with His free knowledge), and of how creatures will exercise their freedom when faced with decisions, and since that knowledge is used by God in determining how He will providentially guide the world, all risk on God’s part is removed; He cannot be surprised and further, He specifically planned for everything that will occur. Yet, the objectors argue, true creaturely freedom requires risk on the part of God. Molinism removes the risk, but is doing so, abrogates creaturely freedom.
The most common response by Molinists to this form of the argument is simply that it begs the question of compatibilism. It is based on the questionable presuppositions that divine risk is necessary for creaturely freedom to exist, and that risk is eliminated by divine foreknowledge. But these presuppositions seem to assume incompatibilism (of creaturely freedom and divine foreknowledge), which is what the argument is supposed to prove. In addition, Molinists have also argued that it is dependent upon a particular view of risk that may be questioned as well.
The second form of the argument contends that the individual referred to in a counterfactual of creaturely freedom does not have the power to bring about the truth or falsity of that counterfactual and therefore, does not have the required freedom to perform, or not perform, the given action. The reason it is argued that individuals do not have the power to bring about the truth of counterfactuals about them is that some counterfactuals are true regardless of what the individual actually does. Consider the example given earlier in this article:
(1) If John were to ask Stefana to marry him, she would accept; and
(2) If John were to ask Stefana to marry him, she would not accept.
(1) is true, but according to this argument, Stefana does not bring about its truth because it is true whether or not she accepts. Suppose John never proposes—in that case, Stefana neither accepts nor rejects the offer because it was never made. That is, the counterfactual is true independent of Stefana’s action and, therefore, she does not make it true. So, the argument goes, since Stefana does not have the power to bring it about that the counterfactual is true, then she does not have the power to bring it about that the counterfactual is false. But since the counterfactual is true, it seems that she therefore does not have the power to not accept the proposal if it is made and therefore, she is not free with respect to the marriage proposal.
The proponents of middle knowledge have responded to this form of the argument with a variety of answers, most of which are rather complex discussions of the concepts of individual power and entailment, relative similarity among possible worlds, and bringing about. The upshot of these arguments is that it is not at all clear (at least to the Molinists) that individuals do not have the power to bring about the truth (or falsity) of counterfactuals which refer to them. In fact, most Molinists have argued for the validity of the concept of counterfactual power over the past (power of an individual to act in such a way that certain things in the past would have been other than they were, if the person were going to act in that way, which they were not).
The third form of the argument builds upon the first and the second, specifically with reference to the way that God makes use of middle knowledge and the fixity of the past. Since God’s knowledge of counterfactuals of creaturely freedom informs His decision about which possible world to actualize, that knowledge and the true counterfactuals are part of the causal history of the actual world and therefore, are part of the fixed past. The problem this causes for Molinism is due to the fact that genuine freedom requires that the individual has the ability to either act in the specified manner or not act in the specified manner. In other words, if God considered (1) in his decision regarding actualization of this world, once He did actualize this world (in which (1) is true), then (1) became part of the history of this world and part of the fixed past. This leads to the suggestion that Stefana did not really have the ability to not accept the offer of marriage, if John were to propose (that is, to bring it about that (2) is true instead of (1)).
Molinists have responded to this objection by denying the central claim that events which had causal consequences in the past are hard facts about the past. Most Molinists believe that free agents have counterfactual power over the past (power to act such that, if one were to act in that way, the past would have been different from how it, in fact, was). If this sort of power is accepted as plausible, then the objection fails.
The third approach to arguing that counterfactuals of creaturely freedom cannot be true is the most popular and seems to serve as the basis for the other objections. It is typically referred to as the “grounding objection,” and is related to the question already posed regarding what causes counterfactuals to be true. According to the argument, there appears to be no good answer to the question of what grounds the truth of counterfactuals of creaturely freedom. They cannot be grounded in God because determinism would follow—the necessity of God’s being or His will would transfer to the counterfactuals. Additionally, the prevolitional character of middle knowledge speaks against grounding counterfactuals of creaturely freedom in the will of God. However, they also cannot be grounded in the individuals to which they refer for at least four reasons. First, counterfactuals of creaturely freedom are true prior to the existence of the individual to which they refer. Second, the existence of the individuals is dependent upon the will of God, and therefore, the truth of the counterfactuals would also be dependent upon the will of God (which has already been shown to be problematic). Third, counterfactuals, properly speaking, refer to non-actual states of affairs and therefore, the events to which they refer never happen, and fourth, psychological makeup cannot serve as grounding because this suggests that the actions performed are not free and thus, the propositions describing the decisions/actions cannot be deemed counterfactuals of freedom.
Molinists have responded to the grounding objection in a variety of ways, five of which will be surveyed here. The first response to the grounding objection has been to simply state that counterfactuals of freedom do not need to be grounded and that no satisfactory explanation of the grounding relation can be given. The upshot of this response is that counterfactuals of creaturely freedom seem to be brute facts about the possible worlds in which they are true or brute facts about the creatures to whom they refer.
The second response is similar in that it turns the grounding objection against the detractor of middle knowledge. Some of the proponents of middle knowledge have suggested that the grounding objection is based on the assumption that a causal connection must exist between the antecedent and consequent of a counterfactual of creaturely freedom in order for it to be true. This assumption, however, is problematic because it assumes libertarian freedom to be false. The grounding objection, then, begs the question of compatibilism.
The third Molinist response has been to compare contingent propositions which refer to the actual future (or futurefactuals) with contingent propositions which refer to counterfactual states of affairs, specifically regarding statements which include how free creatures will decide and would have decided. Those propositions which refer to the actual future are either true or false now, even though there is nothing in the present that can be pointed to as grounding their truth. In a similar fashion, counterfactuals are either true or false, even though there is nothing in the present that can be pointed to as grounding their truth.
The fourth response by proponents of middle knowledge builds upon the third and utilizes the standard possible worlds semantics. It may be argued that the truth of futurefactuals of creaturely freedom are grounded in the future occurrence or nonoccurrence of the event. In a similar fashion, the truth of counterfactuals of creaturely freedom may be grounded in the occurrence or nonoccurrence of the event in the closest possible-but-not-actual world to the actual world. Thus, there is something (an event) that may be pointed to as grounding the truth of the statement.
The fifth and final response of Molinists has been to build upon the suggestion that counterfactuals are brute facts about particular individuals, by arguing that the truth of counterfactuals are grounded in the individuals to which they refer as they exist in the precreative mind of God as ideas. Since the grounding is in the individual, contingency remains, yet since it is as the individual exists in the mind of God as an idea, the problems associated with grounding in the individual are avoided.
Although some of these responses may be deemed more successful than others, and while some may be seen as more of a shifting of the burden of proof than an answer to the specific objection, they do demonstrate that the demand for grounding is somewhat unclear. However, it must also be conceded that the efforts to answer the objection show that some sort of idea of grounding is at least conceivable.
The third major objection to middle knowledge is similar to the second in that it deals with the truth of counterfactuals of creaturely freedom. Several forms of this argument have been proffered, but in its most basic form, it claims that the priority inherent in the Molinist system creates a problem for the truth of counterfactuals of creaturely freedom—the verdict is that Molinist is either viciously circular, or counterfactuals of creaturely freedom are not true soon enough to aid God’s creative decision.
Proponents of this objection point out that, according to Molinism, the truth of counterfactuals of creaturely freedom must be prior to God’s creating activity because they inform His creative decision. However, under the standard possible worlds analysis, which counterfactuals are true is dependent upon which world is actual (counterfactuals are true if they are true in the closest possible-but-not-actual world to the actual world). Thus, which world is actual (and presumably, how close all possible worlds are to it) must be prior to God’s knowledge of the true counterfactuals. But this means that God’s creative decision must be prior to God’s creative decision! Thus, middle knowledge is circular.
A variation on this same argument ignores the possible worlds approach to determining counterfactual truth and instead begins with the view that a counterfactual is true by the action of the agent named in the counterfactual. This, however, also leads to a problem because it means that a truth regarding how the agent would act must be prior to the agent’s activity (presupposed in Molinism), but because the agent is free, he could refrain from acting and thereby cause the counterfactual to be false. Therefore, the truth of counterfactuals must be “up in the air” until the agent acts. But this means that God could not use counterfactuals of creaturely freedom to aid His creative decision because they would not be true soon enough for Him to use them (or if they were, the agents named could not refrain from acting and therefore, would not be free).
A whole host of answers have been presented by Molinists. The most obvious response is to reject the possible worlds analysis of counterfactuals—disallow the contention that the truth of counterfactuals is somehow dependent upon which world is actual. Other responses have included discussion of the use of “priority” or the “depends on” relation in the two arguments. In both cases, it appears that an equivocation has taken place. Last, both versions of the argument betray an assumption of the incompatibility of libertarian creaturely freedom and divine foreknowledge.
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John D. Laing
Southwestern Baptist Theological Seminary