The period designated by historians of philosophy as the “Middle Platonic” begins with Antiochus of Ascalon (ca. 130-68 B.C.) and ends with Plotinus (204-70 A.D.), who is considered the founder of Neoplatonism. The Middle Platonic philosophers inherited the exegetical and speculative problems of the Old Academy, established by Plato and continued by his successors Speusippus (ca. 407-339 B.C.), Xenocrates (ca. 396-314 B.C.) , and Polemo (ca. 350-267 B.C.). Many of these problems centered about the interpretation of Plato’s so-called Unwritten Doctrines, inspired by Pythagorean philosophy and involving a primordial, generative pair of first principles—the One and the Dyad—and how to square this doctrine with the account of creation given in the Timaeus dialogue. This was also the main concern of the Neopythagorean philosophy that emerged with the work of Ocellus Lucanus in the second century B.C., whose treatise On the Nature of the Universe shows the influence of both Platonic and Aristotelian conceptions.
The Academy took a new turn after the founding of the Stoic school by Zeno of Citium (334-262 B.C.), a pupil of Polemo. Arcesilaus (ca. 315-241 B.C.) is regarded as the founder of the New Academy, known for its skepticism. Later, Antiochus asserted the fundamental harmony of the Platonic, Peripatetic (Aristotelian), and Stoic philosophies, and Eudorus of Alexandria (fl. ca. 25 B.C.) elucidated the highly influential teleological dogma of Platonism: “likeness to god as far as possible” (Plato, Theaetetus 176b). Other important Middle Platonists were Philo of Alexandria (ca. 30 B.C.-45 A.D.), who interpreted Hebrew Scripture along Platonic lines, exercising an immense influence on developing Christianity; Plutarch of Chaeronea (ca. 45-125 A.D.) whose treatise De Iside et Osiride (“On Isis and Osiris”), with its Greco-Egyptian syncretism, is an important example of the religious tendencies of later Middle Platonic philosophy; and Numenius of Apamea (fl. 150-176 A.D.) whose highly syncretic philosophy exercised a profound influence on Plotinus, who was accused of plagiarizing Numenius.
In addition to these “mainstream” philosophers, the Middle Platonic period includes the more esoteric systems of the Gnostics, the Corpus Hermeticum and the Chaldaean Oracles. All of these involved an “astral piety” with a notion of planetary powers and intra-cosmic daemons mediating between humanity and the highest cosmic deities.
Table of Contents
- Plato’s “Unwritten Doctrines”
- The Old Academy
- Skepticism and the New Academy
- The Beginning of Middle Platonism
- Neopythagorean Philosophy
- Later Middle Platonism
- “Esoteric” Platonism
- References and Further Reading
Platonic philosophy did not originate solely with the Dialogues of Plato. There is ample evidence from antiquity that Plato taught certain doctrines within the Academy that he did not write down; moreover, these doctrines were sufficiently vague as to cause divergent interpretations even among the first three successors of Plato in the Academy. It is these doctrines — perhaps even moreso than the Dialogues (excepting the Timaeus) – from which are derived the problems and approaches characteristic of Middle Platonic thought. A basic outline of these doctrines follows.
Drawing upon Pythagorean mathematical theory, Plato began his metaphysical schema with a pair of opposed first principles, the One and the Indefinite Dyad. The One is the active principle which imposes limit on the indefinite or unlimited Dyad, thereby laying the ground for the orderly construction of the cosmos. Through this influence of the One upon the Dyad numbers are generated, that is, the Decad, which in turn generates all other numbers. The most important of these primordial numbers is the tetraktys, numbers one through four, the sum total of which is ten, the Decad. The tetraktys also was interpreted by Plato as generating the four mathematical dimensions, with the number one corresponding to the point, two to the line, three to the plane, and four to the solid. Between the Ideal-Numbers or Decad Plato places the World-Soul, corresponding roughly to the Demiurge of the Timaeus. The World-Soul mediates between the Ideal realm and matter, projecting the four dimensions on base matter in order to form the four elements, Fire, Air, Water, and Earth. This basic schema of a first and second principle, and third intellectual and craftsmanly principle responsible for forming the cosmos, was to have an immense influence on the history of Greek philosophy, especially the period reviewed in this article. The following cryptic passage from the Platonic Second Letter (generally accepted as from Plato’s hand in antiquity) had a profound effect on the imagination of Platonic and Pythagorean philosophers of the Middle and Neoplatonic periods. This passage, though more than likely written by a student of Plato, nevertheless provides a hint of what the teacher’s more esoteric teachings may have been like.
Upon the king of all do all things turn; he is the end of all things and the cause of all good. Things of the second order turn upon the second principle, and those of the third order upon the third (312e, tr. G.R. Morrow, in J.M. Cooper, ed., 1997).
Among the many problems inherited by Plato’s successors and their students and colleagues are included the questions of whether the creation of the cosmos, as described in the Timaeus, took place in time or is atemporal, and the manner in which Demiurge of that dialogue relates to the World-Soul of the unwritten doctrines.
The term “Old Academy” is used to refer to the educational institution established by Plato in Athens, and run by his three immediate successors. This is to differentiate it from the “New Academy,” so-called because of its turn toward a more sceptical mode of philosophizing.
After the death of Plato the headship of the Academy passed to his nephew Speusippus (ca. 407-339 B.C.), according to Plato’s wishes. Speusippus seems to have revised Plato’s doctrine of the One and the Dyad by placing the One above Intellect, declaring that it is superior to Being and “free[ing] it even from the status of a principle” (fragment in Klibansky 1953, tr. Dillon 1977, p. 12). In this he differed, as Dillon observes, “with all official Platonism up to Plotinus” (p. 18). The result of this difference is that the Dyad is now considered the sole productive source of multiplicity, from which all other levels of reality derive. Speusippus elaborated a multi-layered cosmic schema in ten stages or “grades” (Zeller 1955, p. 169) of Being: 1.) the supreme One beyond Being, 2.) the Indefinite Dyad or the Many (producer of multiplicity), 3.) Number (beginning with three, the first stage of multiplicity), 4.) the Soul, source of all geometrical extension, 5.) the celestial bodies, 6.) all ensouled beings, including irrational animals and plants, 7.) Thought, and the seven planets and the seven Greek vowels, 8.) instinct and the passions, 9.) motion, 10.) the Good, and repose. By locating the Good at the end of this emanative process – which is properly understood, as Zeller (1955, p. 169) writes, as “eternal principles of things and their stages of development” – Speusippus is not denying the ontological supremacy of the One, rather he is recognizing the One as the most simplex and primordial of all realities, and as “the cause of goodness and being for all other things” (Dillon 1977, p. 12). According to Speusippus the cosmos is eternally generated; therefore, he interpreted the creation account in the Timaeus as intended for purposes of instruction, and not to be taken literally. In the sphere of ethics Speusippus seems to have taught that happiness is leading a moral life, which likely meant for him a median between pleasure and pain, both of which, according to Aulus Gellius (Noctes Atticae IX, 5.4), Speusippus considered to be evils.
Xenocrates (ca. 396-314 B.C.) succeeded Speusippus as headmaster of the Academy, and held that post for a quarter of a century (339-314 B.C.), until his death. He departed from Speusippus in identifying the One as Intellect or Nous, which he also named “Father”; the Dyad he called “Mother.” There is evidence that Xenocrates identified the Dyad with primordial Matter (fragment 28; Dillon 1977, p. 24), and considered it an “evil and disorderly principle” (Dillon, p. 26). Xenocrates divided the sensible universe into the realm above the moon (the supra-lunar) and the realm below the moon (the sub-lunar). It is unclear whether he added a further division to include a purely intelligible realm, or considered the One and the Dyad as occupying the highest sphere above the stars. Above the moon there exists the seven planets, which Xenocrates considered to be divine, along with the stars and the pure fire that is the base element of the universe. The realm below the moon he believed to be occupied by daemons. He held a theory that there are two types of gods, Olympians and Titans, the former born of heaven and the latter of earth (fragments 18 and 20; Dillon, pp. 26-27, also see Zeller 1955, p. 170). Theophrastus, the pupil of Aristotle, gave credit to Xenocrates for his exhaustive account of the cosmos, distinguishing him from Speusippus and others who only provided an account of the One and the Dyad, barely touching upon anything else besides numbers and geometrical shapes. Xenocrates, he says, discoursed not only on divine things and mathematicals, but on objects of sense-perception as well (Theophrastus, Metaphysics 6a.23-6b.9). Perhaps the most important contribution of Xenocrates to the history of Platonism (and all of philosophy as well) is the doctrine that the Ideas are thoughts in the mind of the One (Dillon, p. 29). Xenocrates made a distinction between practical and scientific wisdom, and taught that happiness is to be found in virtue and the means conducive to it (Zeller, p. 170).
Xenocrates was succeeded by Polemo (ca. 350-267 B.C.), who became headmaster of the Academy upon the latter’s death in 314. Eduard Zeller, in his seminal work on the history of Greek philosophy, remarks that there is a scarcity of original thinking in the work of Polemo (Zeller 1955, p. 170). This is unfair, not only because we do not possess any works of Polemo by which to accurately judge him, but because if one looks carefully at the surviving evidence, Polemo’s importance for the emergence and development of Stoic philosophy will be seen. While it is true that Polemo’s metaphysical schema was likely dependent upon his predecessors, with little or no development, he did make at least two important contributions to ethics, both of which influenced emerging Stoicism. The first is the concept of self-sufficiency (autarkheia), which Polemo identified as the key to happiness. He understood self-sufficiency in respect of virtue, and not in terms of material wealth or bodily pleasure, teaching that one could be happy even in the absence of all physical comfort, provided that one had achieved virtue. The second is the concept of conciliation or appropriation (oikeiôsis), which was of immense importance for later Stoic philosophers. The basic presumption of this doctrine is that all living beings strive for conciliation with their environment, and that this necessarily involves an existence in accordance with nature which, for human beings, is a virtuous existence. There is evidence in Cicero that Polemo taught such a doctrine, but we have no way of knowing whether he actually used the term oikeiôsis.
Besides the headmasters of the Old Academy discussed above, other pupils of Plato made contributions to Platonic philosophy. The astronomer and mathematician Philip of Opus, believed by most scholars to be the author of the pseudo-Platonic dialogue Epinomis, taught that the greatest wisdom is to be attained through contemplation of the divine celestial bodies. However, he placed importance as well on the intermediary capacity of the daemons in this endeavor. Following Plato in the Laws (896e-898d) he taught a doctrine of an evil World-Soul. Eudoxus of Cnidus was a pupil of Plato as well as of the Pythagorean Archytas. He believed that the Forms reside in material mixtures, and that pleasure is the highest good. It is likely that Plato wrote his Philebus in response to Eudoxus’ theory of pleasure. Heraclides of Pontus was an astronomer who borrowed the Pythagorean theory of the diurnal revolution of the earth, and revised it with his own theory that Mercury and Venus revolve around the sun. He held a materialistic view of the soul, believing it to be composed of aether, the purest element. Finally, Crantor of Soloe (ca. 330-270 B.C.) achieved fame as author of the first commentary on Plato’s Timaeus, and for his widely read treatise On Grief, an early example of the consolation genre of writing found much later in Boethius. Against the Stoics he argued that all pain, including grief, is a necessity, and is to be controlled rather than eradicated (Dillon, p. 42, Zeller pp. 171-172). He followed Plato and the Pythagoreans in regarding life as a punishment, and philosophy as practice for death.
The designation “New Academy” is intended to represent the shift away from exegesis of Plato’s doctrines and metaphysical speculation, toward a more sceptical mode of philosophizing. The following two philosophers are its major representatives.
Scholars generally consider the “New Academy” to have begun with Arcesilaus (ca. 315-240 B.C.) who, under the influence of Pyrrhonian skepticism called into question the idea that knowledge and certainty is obtainable through sense-perception, denying that even reason or understanding is capable of arriving at uncontestable truth. In this he was attacking Stoic cosmology and theology, with its belief in an eternally ordered universe pervaded by reason. His skepticism was so thorough that he refused even to declare the validity of his own sceptical stance. He did not, however, do away with all criteria for living a proper life, considering perception as linked to the will, and rational activity as following a judgment based on probability of desired effect.
Carneades (214-129 B.C.) followed Arcesilaus in his sceptical approach, and honed the latter’s notion of probability, recognizing three “grades” of probability involving increasing levels of validation based on mutual confirmation of related representations (Zeller, p. 264). Carneades, like Arcesilaus, attacked Stoic doctrine, especially the idea of “conceptual representations” (phantasia katalêptikê), arguing that there exists no representation that cannot be convincingly reproduced by artificials means; therefore, we can never be certain that the representation we are experiencing is true or authentic. He likely followed Arcesilaus in the realm of ethics, adopting judgment based on probability as the guide for practical life.
Scholars generally consider the Middle Platonic period to have begun with the work of Antiochus of Ascalon (d. 68 B.C.), who was responsible for overhauling the increasingly stifling skepticism of the New Academy. His teacher was Philo of Larissa (fl. 88-79 B.C.), who also taught Cicero. We will examine briefly the teachings of Philo, before moving on to Antiochus. We will then discuss Posidonius who, though a Stoic rather than a Platonist, contributed much to the development of Middle Platonic philosophy.
Unlike his predecessors in the New Academy, Philo of Larissa did not consider knowledge an impossibility, although he did follow them in criticizing the Stoic doctrine of “conceptual representations” as the key to knowledge. However, he sought not to deny all possibility of knowledge, but rather to establish a middle course between mere probability, and knowledge. He believed that there is a level of obviousness where skepticism must give way to conviction, although this conviction must not be regarded as absolute knowledge. Philo’s main concern was with ethics, and he used his middle ground approach to formulate a detailed ethical theory in a manner never attempted by Arcesilaus or Carneades.
The fundamental agreement of Platonic, Stoic, and Peripatetic philosophy was asserted by Antiochus of Ascalon, who returned to the basic approach, if not the actual doctrines, of the Old Academy. This notion of agreement of the earlier philosophers on matters of doctrine served as a way for Antiochus to get past the skepticism of his teacher, in order to establish his own philosophical stance. What we know of Antiochus’ doctrines is contained in various writings of Cicero, usually placed in the mouth of Antiochus’ influential pupil Varro. No writings of Antiochus survive; therefore, as with all of the philosophers discussed so far – with the exception of Plato – we must rely solely on reports by contemporaries, near contemporaries, and later writers. Nevertheless, it is possible to reconstruct with some confidence the doctrines put forth by Antiochus.
Antiochus, likely for the first time since the advent of academic skepticism, busied himself with the interpretation of Plato’s dialogues, notably the Timaeus, as the Old Academics had done, thereby providing us with the first example of what would later become a full-fledged systematic approach in the later Middle Platonists. Antiochus rejected the Aristotelian “fifth element” and returned to the four basic elements – Fire, Air, Water, and Earth – as the primary material principles of the cosmos. Matter (hulê) is the substrate of these elements. Following Stoic philosophy, Antiochus taught that the stars and planets, as well as minds, are composed of the purest fire. Even god is composed of this fire and does not transcend the cosmos, but occupies its highest reaches. He combined the Demiurge of the Timaeus and the World-Soul of the Unwritten Doctrines into an intra-cosmic, unitive, rational force which he termed Logos. Antiochus denied that the Platonic Ideas or Forms transcend the cosmos, asserting instead that they are conceptions common to all humanity, constructed by way of analogies (similitudines, analogiai), and existing only within the mind of each rational being, including god (Cicero, De oratore 8 ff.). Like Xenocrates earlier, Antiochus understood the Ideas as thoughts in the mind of god (Dillon, pp. 94-95).
With the rise of Stoicism as the most influential dogmatic philosophy of the Hellenistic era, the problem of fate versus free will came to the fore, and Antiochus responded by rejecting fate (heimarmenê) as an efficient cause, relegating it to the class of “material cause” (aition prokatarktikon), along with time, matter, and other things that are necessary, but not sufficient, to produce an effect. This allowed for efficient causes to arise from human initiative, and preserved the freedom of human activity, or at least response, within an ordered cosmos.
Again following Xenocrates, Antiochus expressed a belief in daemons, who inhabit the sub-lunar realm (the supra-lunar realm being reserved for the divine celestial bodies). He also appears to have believed in divination, not only through the motion of the celestial bodies, but by way of dreams, oracles, beasts, and even inanimate objects (Cicero, De divinatione I.12 ff.; Dillon, p. 89).
While not a strikingly brilliant philosopher – at least as far as we can tell from surviving accounts of his doctrines – Antiochus is responsible for articulating themes that would later become prominent in Platonic philosophy. His notion of the Ideas as thoughts in the mind of god was accepted as authentic Platonic doctrine by Philo of Alexandria, who gave it his own unique spin, as we shall see; the problem of the Demiurge and the World-Soul was taken up by Numenius in rather gnosticizing fashion, as we will discuss; and Antiochus’ teaching regarding divination and daemons is a precedent of the Neoplatonic system of Iamblichus (who, due to his later date, will not be discussed in this article).
Although not a Platonist, strictly speaking, but a Stoic, Posidonius (135-51 B.C.) nevertheless exercised an immense influence on the development of Middle Platonic thought. Among his many works, all unfortunately lost except for a few scant fragments, is a commentary on the Timaeus, which was likely the main source of his influence on Platonism. Posidonius recognized two principles in the cosmos, one active and one passive: god and matter, respectively. In this he was following Plato’s doctrine of the mixing bowl, as put forth in the Timaeus. In his cosmology, Posidonius posited, as did Platonists like Xenocrates and Antiochus, a bipartite cosmos consisting of a supra- and a sub-lunar realm. He considered the supra-lunar realm to be imperishable, and the sub-lunar perishable, dissolving into the void (kenon) outside the cosmos during the conflagration (ekpurôsis), after which it is reconstituted anew (this being a variation of standard Stoic doctrine going back to Chrysippus). Posidonius understood human beings as forming a bridge between these two realms, and theorized that souls originate in the sun and travel to earth by way of the moon (Zeller, pp. 269-270). Some of these souls become humans while others become daemons or heroes, a doctrine developed in his treatise On Heroes and Demons, which had an immense influence on later Platonists, especially Plutarch.
Posidonius believed that the cosmos is held together by cosmic sympathy (sumpatheia), and this formed the basis for his ideas concerning fate and divination (cf. Cicero, De divinatione I, and De fato). He believed the cosmos to be controlled by three forces, Zeus, Nature, and Fate, and that human beings cannot escape the causality that is the source of cosmic unity. This led Posidonius naturally to a belief in astrology, and there is ample evidence that he practiced it as well (fragments 111, 112, Edelstein-Kidd). He also theorized regarding other forms of divination, and from his doctrine of cosmic sympathy arrived at the conclusion that all life and events in the cosmos are connected, making divination from an animal’s liver, for example, possible. Posidonius asserted the immortality of the soul and its ability to exist apart from the body. In ethics he largely followed Plato, teaching that the passions are not to be eradicated but controlled (Zeller, p. 270, Dillon, pp. 109-112).
During the late second century and early first century B.C. a number of writings began to appear that were attributed to various historical followers of Pythagoras. This renewed interest in Pythagorean philosophy likely grew out of the desire to find harmony between the three major philosophical schools of the era. The writings compromising the Pseudo-Pythagorica, as the collection of about ninety treatises by fifty authors is often called, contain elements of Platonism, Stoicism, and Peripatetic philosophy, as well as typical Pythagorean number theory and cosmological motifs, such as the eternity of the world. There is little, in fact, to differentiate Neopythagoreanism from Middle Platonism, as one can easily find Pythagorean elements in the work of thinkers commonly designated as Platonists, and vice-versa. Following John Dillon in his definitive study of Middle Platonism, however, I am making the distinction for the sake of scholarly rigor.
Of the writings of Ocellus Lucanus (second century B.C.) we possess a treatise On the Nature of the Universe and a fragment of a lost treatise On Laws. Ocellus was concerned with maintaining the doctrine of the eternity of the world against the Stoic doctrine of periodic conflagration and reconstitution of the universe. Since there are only two types of generation – from a lesser to a greater state and vice-versa – Ocellus argued that it is just as absurd to state that the universe began in a lesser state and progressed to a greater, as it is to state the opposite, for both statements imply either a growth or a diminution, and since the cosmos is whole and self-contained (so he insisted) there is no place into which it can either grow or diminish. Posidonius’ doctrine of a void into which the cosmos periodically dissolves held no place in Ocellus’ philosophy.
Although positing the eternity of the cosmos, Ocellus nevertheless admitted the obvious, that generation and dissolution occurs here on earth. Like Xenocrates and other Platonists, Ocellus understood the cosmos as divided in two parts, the supra-lunar and the sub-lunar, the gods existing in the former and daemons and humans in the latter. It is only in the sub-lunar regions, he argued, that generation and decay occurs, for it is in this region that “nonessential” beings undergo alteration according to nature. The generation that occurs in the sub-lunar realm is produced by the supra-lunar realm, the primary cause being the sun, and the secondary causes the planets. He apparently did not believe in a transcendent realm beyond the material cosmos.
Ocellus’ work is one of the earliest examples of Hellenistic-era astrological doctrine. At the end of his On the Nature of the Universe he entreats prospective parents to be attentive in choosing times of conception, so that their children may be born noble and graceful; and in the fragment On Laws he declares that the active supra-lunar realm governs the passive sub-lunar realm. In his ethical doctrine Ocellus adhered to strict Pythagorean asceticism, holding that sexual intercourse is to be reserved for reproductive purposes only, and that alchoholic beverages are to be avoided.
Scholars are not certain whether the eponymous Timaeus Locrus of Plato’s dialogue ever really existed. In any case, the treatise On the World and the Soul attributed to this person is an early to mid-first century B.C. work containing an epitome of the Timaeus dialogue, though with some omissions. Given the renewed interest in Pythagorean philosophy in this period, it is likely that the work was widely read. Though containing clear Pythagorean motifs, such as a table of musical tones and their respective numbers, and a section elaborating the geometrical construction of the cosmos, the treatise is, as Thomas Tobin (1985) has demonstrated, a Middle Platonic interpretation of the highly Pythagorean-influenced Timaeus dialogue.
According to “Timaeus” the universe has two causes: Mind, which governs rational beings, and Necessity, which governs bodies and all irrational beings. Interpreting Plato literally, “Timaeus” affirmed the temporal creation of the cosmos, and while stating that the cosmos is capable of being destroyed by the one who created it (the Demiurge), he denied that it would ever actually be destroyed, since it is divine and the Demiurge, being good and divine himself, would never destroy divinity. In what is possibly a later addition to the text, “Timaeus” assigns numerical values to the various proportions produced by the mixture of the Same and the Different (these being the two opposing forces, productive of all motion, growth, and change in the cosmos, as discussed in the Timaeus dialogue). The substratum of all generated things is matter, and their reason-principle or logos is ideal-form. “Timaeus” then proceeds with an account of the geometrical proportions of the cosmos, finally declaring that the image of the cosmos is the dodecahedron, since that is the closest approximation to the perfect sphere, which is the image of purely intellectual reality.
According to “Timaeus,” the Demiurge initiated the creation of souls, but then handed over completion of the task to Nature (hypostatized in the feminine) who completed their creation and introduced them into into the cosmos, some by way of the sun, others the moon, and yet more from the planets that wander according to the principle of the Different (the source of the irrational part of the soul). Each soul, however, received a portion of the principle of Sameness, which became the rational part of the soul. A soul who received more of this principle would have a happier fate than one receiving less. Here again, as in Ocellus, we have a relatively early witness of astrological doctrine within Hellenistic philosophy. The ethical doctrine of “Timaeus” involved a taming of the passions and the moderation of bodily pleasures, the final goal being a state of repose conducive to the contemplation of divine things.
Several fragments purporting to be from the hand of Plato’s contemporary, the Pythagorean Archytas of Tarentum (though in fact composed some time during the late second or early first century B.C.) are of importance for Middle Platonic philosophy, notably the fragments of a treatise On First Principles where a principle is posited above the One and the Dyad, out of which the primordial pair is said to have emerged. “Archytas” places mind above soul as the most divine part in man, though he departs from standard Pythagoreanism by assigning the circle rather than the tetragon as the representation of the soul, since the soul is self-moved (the circle, with no definite beginning or end point, symbolized endless movement). He believed that there is a space outside of the material cosmos in which the cosmos is contained. Time, according to “Archytas” is continuous, not a series of units or parts as in number, speech, and music, and he apparently made some distinction between psychic time (pertaining to the soul) and natural time, though what this distinction entailed is not clear. In ethics he is no innovator, simply stating the standard notion that happiness depends on virtue, but virtue is independent of all other things.
Eudorus of Alexandria (fl. ca. 50-25 B.C.) was much concerned with ethics, which he considered the first subject of philosophy to be studied. He defined ethics not in terms of existence in accordance with nature, but rather in terms of striving for a proper end (telos), which he considered to be “likeness to god as far as possible” (homoiôsis theô kata to dunaton). This phrase is from Plato’s Theaetetus (176b) where the qualification “as far as possible” simply means to the extent that a mortal can achieve a divine state. Eudorus, however, interpreted it as referring to the intellect, that part of the soul most closely akin to the divine (cf. Dillon, pp. 122-123). This conception of ethics led Eudorus to depart from earlier Platonists like Antiochus who considered physical pleasures as contributing to, or at least enhancing, the happiness that depends on virtue, and declare that true happiness is of the intellect alone, although he does seem to have allowed a preliminary role for physical pleasure in achieving happiness (Dillon, p. 124).
In metaphysics and cosmology Eudorus follows largely Pythagorean lines, though some Stoic conceptions are present in his thought. He departed from earlier Pythagorean philosophy and, in a move likely inspired by “Archytas,” posited a supreme principle above the One and the Dyad, even positing this principle as the producer of matter. Traditional Pythagorean philosophy posited a primordial pair of principles, Limit and Unlimited, with no supreme One above this pair. The monism of Eudorus’ doctrine was particularly attractive to the Jewish Platonist Philo of Alexandria in his quest to square Old Testament theology with Platonic philosophy.
Eudorus rejected the Aristotelian “fifth element” and followed Stoic cosmology in positing pure fire as the base element of he heavens. He considered the stars and planets to be divine, and insisted that the world is eternal. Eudorus brought together the apparently opposing views of Xenocrates and Crantor regarding the origin of numbers; the former stating that they are produced by the One and the Dyad, the latter that they are produced in the mind of the World-Soul as he contemplates the Forms. Eudorus taught that number was generated simultaneously with the World-Soul, who was responsible for translating the smallest multiplicity (the number three) into solid bodies (the number four).
Finally, we must note Eudorus’ revision of Aristotle’s Categories, which was to exercise an immense influence on later Platonists, especially Porphyry, who endeavored to find a harmony of doctrine in Plato and Aristotle. Eudorus interpreted substance (ousia) as strictly material substance, and concluded that Aristotle’s categories only apply to the physical world, not to the purely intellectual realm, where Platonists have always located supreme reality.
Notable Middle Platonists after Eudorus include Moderatus of Gades (first century A.D.), a self-conscious Pythagorean who considered Plato a mere student of Pythagoras. During the same period Thrasyllus, Nero’s court astrologer, prepared a new edition of Plato’s Dialogues, arranged in tetralogies, as well as an edition of the collected works of Democritus. Interesting in a different manner is Apollonius of Tyana, who had the reptuation of a magician and wonder-worker, and is a prime example of the prophet-figures influenced by Platonism, Pythagoreanism, and sundry other intellectual streams. Another example of such a figure is Simon Magus (mid-first century A.D.) who wandered about working miracles with a prostitute claiming to be Divine Wisdom Herself. Simon was considered the first Gnostic by the early Christian heresiologists.
The most important Middle Platonists after Eudorus are Philo of Alexandria (ca. 30 B.C. – 45 A.D.) and Plutarch of Chaeronea (ca. 45-125 A.D.). Numenius of Apamea (fl. ca. 150-176 A.D.), though more of a Neopythagorean than a Platonist (to the extent that such a distinction can be made in this period), had a profound influence on the emergence of Neoplatonism, not least in the deep and abiding influence his thought had on the philosophical development of Plotinus, who was actually accused of plagiarizing Numenius. Finally, we will discuss Albinus (fl. ca. 149-157) whose handbook of Platonic philosophy is an interesting example of Middle Platonic eclecticism (in the best sense of that term).
The work of Philo of Alexandria (also called Philo Judaeus) is the most prominent and philosophically accomplished example of the Jewish-Hellenistic syncretism that flourished at Alexandria beginning at least as early as the translation of the Hebrew Scriptures into Greek (the Septuagint), during the reign of Ptolemy II Philedelphus (285-247 B.C.). We already detect the influence of Hellenistic philosophy on Jewish thought in the biblical book of Ecclesiastes, and the later apocryphal work Wisdom of Sirach (ca. 30 B.C.) displays Platonic and Pythagorean affinities. So it is clear that by Philo’s time Jewish thinkers of the Diaspora were quite comfortable with Greek philosophy. In the work of Philo himself there is an attempt to square Old Testament theology with the Greek philosophical tradition, leading Philo to posit Moses as the first sage and teacher of the venerable ancients of the Greek tradition. The work of Philo was to have an immense influence on emerging Christian philosophy, especially in the work of Origen.
According to Philo, God transcends all first principles, including the Monad, is incorporeal and cannot even be said to occupy a space or place; He is eternal, changeless, self-sufficient and free from all constraint or necessity (cf. Tripolitis 1978, pp. 5-6 ff.). God freely willed the creation of the cosmos, first in a purely intellectual manner, and then, through the agency of His Logos (Philo’s philosophical term for the Wisdom figure of Proverbs 8:22) He brought forth the physical cosmos. Philo describes the Logos in a two-fold manner, first as the sum total of the thoughts of God, and then as a hypostatization of those thoughts for the purpose of physical creation. Thus we see Philo linking the cosmos to the intellectual realm by way of a mediating figure rather like the Platonic World-Soul. Borrowing a term from Stoic philosophy, Philo calls the thoughts of the Logos “rational seeds” (logoi spermatikoi), and describes them as having a role in the production of the cosmos which, he insists, was brought into being out of non-being by the agency of God.
Philo adhered to standard Platonism when he declared that the cosmos is a copy of the purely intellectual realm. However, he taught, following biblical doctrine, that the cosmos was created in time, but went on to state that, although having a temporal creation, the cosmos will exist eternally, since it is the result of God’s outpouring of love. The rational beings dwelling in the cosmos are divided by Philo into three types: the purely intellectual souls (created first by God), all animals (created second), and finally man (last of all rational creation, combining the attributes of the first two). Of the purely intellectual and incorporeal souls, Philo recognized varying degrees of perfection; some of the souls aid humanity, for example, providing guidance and giving signs, while other fell into vice themselves, and aim to lead man astray. These are the beings called angels by the Jews and daemons by the Greeks.
Philo’s ethical doctrine emphasized the free will of human beings. According to Philo, the meaning of the biblical statement that humanity is created in the image and likeness of God is that although sometimes constrained by external forces, all human souls are capable of overcoming these constraints and attaining freedom. He further adds, in a formulation that was to have a profound influence on Origen, that God aids souls in their quest for freedom in proportion to their love and devotion for Him and for their fellows.
Plutarch was intensely interested in religion, and his philosophy bears the stamp of a profound religious piety. Like Eudorus, Plutarch understood the highest goal of existence as achieving likeness to god, yet he had little confidence in the ability of human reason to adequately contemplate and understand divinity, believing instead in the possibility of divine revelations. Plutarch considered all the religions of his time as bearing witness to one eternal truth, though expressed in different ways. His ability to use allegory in order to prove this assertion is most evident in his treatise On Isis and Osiris.
Plutarch did not, like Archytas and Eudorus, posit a principle higher than the Pythagorean One, which Plutarch also called, in Platonic fashion, the Good. The Dyad was considered by Plutarch as a disruptive or even downright evil principle, which the One or Monad had to struggle to control. This tension at the highest ontological level translates into a dualistic cosmology where the principle of reason is described as being in constant strife with unreason. The rational principle, Logos, is both transcendent and immanent. In its former aspect the Logos is understood by Plutarch as the sum-total of thoughts in the mind of god; in its latter aspect, Logos is understood allegorically as Osiris, whose body is routinely torn apart by Typhon, only to be reassembled ever again by Isis. Osiris’ body parts are interpreted as the Ideas dispersed throughout the material realm, and rationally maintained by Isis in her demiurgic role as cosmic steward.
Plutarch departed from standard Pythagorean doctrine in declaring the creation of the cosmos in time. In keeping with his Zoroastrian-style dualism, Plutarch posited a simultaneous intellectual conception of the created cosmos in the minds of both the One and its evil counterpart, the Dyad. Thus we see a dualism at the highest level of his thought; however, a dualism that is not akin to Gnosticism, for Plutarch’s opposing principles are equi-primordial, unlike the subversive Sophia in Gnostic mythology, who introduces a disruptive element into the intellectual realm.
Plutarch accepted the immortality of the soul, excepting only the notion of transmigration or reincarnation, and made the distinction, found again later in Origen, between mind (nous) and soul (psukhê). In the realm of ethics, Plutarch defended free will against fatalism, understanding divine providence (pronoia) as involving a co-operation between human will and divine agency (cf. Dillon, pp. 199-203 ff.; also Zeller, pp. 306-308), another notion later adopted by Origen.
Numenius has been called both a pythagorizing Platonist and a platonizing Pythagorean. However, the key to his attitude toward philosophy is summed up in his own statement that “Plato pythagorizes” (P. Henry 1991, p. lxx). He took the mysterious passage about the three kings in the Platonic Second Letter as coming from Socrates, and he likely used this passage as support for the triad of gods which he posited as first principles. Plato and Pythagoras were considered by him as the twin sources of philosophical truth, with which the traditions of the Hebrews, Egyptians, the Zoroastrian Magi, and even the Brahmins were all in agreement.
Numenius’ triad of gods begins with the First God, called also the Good, who is eternal, immutable, and at rest, concerned only with the intellectual realm. He is likened by Numenius to the owner of a farm who, after having sown the fields, leaves it up to his farmhands to cultivate the crops. The Second God, called Mind and Demiurge is responsible for translating the things of the intellectual realm to the realm of matter, thereby establishing a cosmos. In this capacity the Second God is called World-Soul. However, once this Soul comes into contact with matter, the source of all evil according to Numenius, it becomes divided into a rational and an irrational part, the former remaining in contemplation of the divine realm, and the latter immersing itself in the material realm. It is not clear whether Numenius intended to posit two World-Souls (one good, one evil) or if he had in mind simply a division within that Soul of an irrational and a rational part. If Numenius’ triad involves a strict separation of three distinct divinities (and this is a matter of interpretation) then we should speak of a separate World-Soul that is evil. If the triad is intended to imply a three-fold series of activities emanating from the divine realm, then we are correct in assuming that Numenius posited a single World-Soul with two warring parts. Due to the fragmentary nature of his surviving writings, however, it is impossible to know for sure what he intended.
Human souls were described by Numenius as divine fragments of the Demiurge, each one a microcosm of both the intellectual and the physical realm (Tripolitis, pp. 26-30). He taught that all souls contain both a rational and an irrational element, the former derived from the Second God, the latter from association with the material realm. Numenius taught that souls enter the cosmos by way of the Tropic of Cancer, acquiring various characteristics as they pass through the seven planetary spheres. The soul that leads a virtuous life – which for Numenius meant living a contemplative life detached from bodily things – will re-ascend to heaven (the sphere of the fixed stars) by way of the Tropic of Capricorn. The soul that fails to lead a correct life will enter Hades (located by Numenius in the mists above the world) where it will undergo chastisement until reincarnated in another body suitable to its nature. Numenius taught that certain souls may become so corrupted that they will enter the bodies of animals. In a doctrine that likely influenced Origen (in his doctrine of multiple ages), Numenius taught that the series of reincarnations are finite, and will eventually lead the soul back to the divine realm, though how this is accomplished for a soul existing in animal bodies is not entirely clear, since such a soul is presumably not susceptible to any rational exhortations to virtue.
No overtly ethical fragments of Numenius’ works survive, but we do know that he considered existence in this realm a struggle, with the irrational part of the soul in constant strife with the rational. Salvation from this state only takes place when the soul leaves the material realm for the divine. One is reminded of St. Paul’s lament in Romans 7:18-23 where he describes the war taking place between his flesh (body, matter) and his mind. His mind knows the good, he says, but his flesh continually prevents him from achieving this good. It is possible that Numenius read St. Paul, but more likely that the two thinkers simply were responding to a shared intellectual milieu consisting not only of Platonic philosophy, but Gnostic and Hermetic doctrines as well.
The influence of Numenius extended well beyond his life-time; his doctrines are recorded in the writings of later Neoplatonists like Porphyry and Proclus, and Plotinus himself was at one point accused of plagiarizing Numenius (Porphyry, Life of Plotinus 17). In the case of Plotinus, we see a clear Numenian influence regarding the triadic arrangement of principles, although Plotinus developed this basic notion in a quite original way. Plotinus also responded to Numenius’ doctrine of an evil World-Soul, developing in the process a quite sophisticated doctrine concerning matter and the nature of evil.
Albinus (fl. ca. 149-157) left behind two complete works, excellent sources of first-century A.D. Platonism, the Isagogê (an introduction to Platonic philosophy) and the Didaskalikos (a summary of Plato’s philosophy). As an interpreter of Plato, Albinus relied heavily on Aristotle and, to a lesser extent, Stoicism. Like Numenius, Albinus posited a triadic set of principles: First God (also Mind and Good), Second God or Universal Intellect, and World-Soul. The First God is not described as creating the others, but rather as generating them from his mind as he thinks upon his own thoughts (cf. Tripolitis, pp. 31-36). This conception of divine emanation is present later in the philosophy of Plotinus and, in a more developed fashion, in Proclus. The First God is described along the lines of Aristotle’s Unmoved Mover, and is said to produce motion through the desire he inspires in the second and third gods. Albinus employs negative or apophatic language when describing the First God, a method of theologizing that would become of immense importance for later Christian Neoplatonists, especially Pseudo-Dionysius.
Individual human souls, according to Albinus, were created in the same manner as the second and third gods, that is, by a hypostatization of thoughts in the divine mind. Once generated, the souls enter the sphere of the fixed stars, where each soul is allotted its own star and set in a chariot or vehicle (okhêma). Following the myth of the soul in the Phaedrus, Albinus states that the duty of the soul in the material realm is to place unreason in subjection to reason, and to steer one’s chariot to the rim of heaven where one’s allotted star is waiting to receive the perfected soul.
Although Albinus describes the life of the soul as one of constant strife between the rational and the irrational parts, he does not posit, as did Numenius, an evil World-Soul, nor does he totally degrade all material embodiment as the source of evil. Albinus described the union of body and soul as akin to that of fire and asphalt, meaning that the one is the vehicle of the other. In the realm of ethics Albinus held the by-now-standard Platonic line of “likeness to god” as the highest goal of existence. He taught a doctrine of reincarnation including the entrance of the soul into animal bodies. As in Numenius, it is unclear how souls, once so incarnated, will ever attain to the reason requisite for salvation (cf. R.E. Witt 1937, p. 139).
Albinus anticipated Plotinus in the prime role he allotted to contemplation in the ideal existence of the soul, and Origen in his doctrine of the intellectual generation of souls by the godhead.
This final section will be devoted to a brief discussion of a branch or offshoot of Middle Platonic thought that I hesitantly labelled “esoteric,” in spite of the fact that these schools of thought or sects (or whatever one should call them) were quite widespread during this period, Gnosticism especially. However, though widespread, they were veiled in mystery and secrecy, leading John Dillon to refer to them in the perhaps more apt phrase “the Platonic Underworld.” We will be discussing three examples of this “underworld”: Hermeticism, Gnosticism, and the Chaldaean Oracles. The writings comprising the Corpus Hermeticum, so-called because of its supposed derivation from the teachings of the legendary sage Hermes Trismegistus, bear the marks of a variety of philosophies, Platonism and Neopythagoreanism being the most prominent. Hermetic ideas are found in Christianity as early as the writings of St. Paul, and Gnostic elements are to be discerned in John’s Gospel as well as in Paul. The earliest Christian theologians were Gnostics, and the most prominent among them, Valentinus, nearly became pope. The systems of the Gnostics, especially Valentinus, attempted (among other things) to solve certain problems of Platonic and related philosophies by employing mythological language, astrological symbolism, and elements of alchemy and ritual magic. Finally, the Chaldaean Oracles, a mysterious composition melding Platonic and Neopythagorean philosophy with a revelatory religiosity, was a major source of inspiration for later Neoplatonists.
Hermeticism is a loose label for collections of texts on various subjects bearing the name Hermes Trismegistus, “Thrice-great Hermes,” who was believed to have been a sage of remote antiquity. According to the third-century B.C. historian Manetho of Sebennytos, a tradition existed in which Thoth-Hermes was said to have written down his teachings on tablets before the Flood. These tablets were said to be kept by the Egyptian priests, who later translated them into Greek. The earliest Hermetic writings are called the “technical Hermetica” and can be dated back to the early- to mid-second century B.C. These texts contain astrological material and information on the magical properties of gems. The co-called “philosophical Hermetica,” that is, the treatises comprising what today is called the Corpus Hermeticum, began to be written down a bit later, the earliest probably in the mid-first century B.C.
The most important treatise in this collection (at least for the history of Platonism) is the Poimandres. This text begins with the appearance of Poimandres (a name suggesting “Shepherd of Men” in Greek), the Divine Intellect, who reveals to the unknown author of the text a vision displaying the generation of the cosmos. The cosmos is described as beginning with a darkness coiling downward from the light (the intellectual realm) like a snake. It is at first indiscernible and disturbing, but then divine reason descends upon it and imposes order, and the earth comes into being. This account is dependent on both Plato’s Timaeus and the book of Genesis (especially as these two works were interpreted by Philo, whom our author likely read). The image of the descending darkness implies an evil or irrational principle, or World-Soul, as in Numenius, that must be brought under control by reason. Other affinities with Numenius, as well as Albinus, include the direct generation of souls by the Demiurge, and the descent and ascent of souls through the planetary spheres. One important difference is that both Numenius and Albinus considered the highest attainment of the soul as “likeness to god.” The Poimandres, however, declares that the souls who make the ascent to the divine realm actually become gods themselves, an idea that was to become central in the Eastern Orthodox Christian tradition, with its concept of deification or theôsis. It is highly likely that Numenius was acquainted with, if not the Poimandres itself, another text or texts similar in content. He was also most certainly familiar with Gnosticism, to a discussion of which we now turn.
The writings called “gnostic” vary in content, style, date, and region of origin, to such a degree that certain modern scholars have called for a moratorium on the term (cf. M.A. Williams 1996). Yet there are certain basic elements common to most so-called Gnostic systems, as opposed to stray texts the provenance of which is unknown or dubious. The most important of these systems is that of Basilides and Valentinus, two early Christian theologians who are influenced heavily by Middle Platonic thought. (For a more in-depth discussion, see Gnosticism.)
The system of Basilides (fl. ca. 132-135 A.D.) begins with the engendering of Intellect (Nous) by the First (unengendered) Parent. From this Intellect, Logos is generated, and Logos in turn generates Prudence (phronêsis) who then generates Wisdom (Sophia) and Power (dunamis). This is a mythological elaboration of the standard Middle Platonic emanation schemas that we have encountered in Eudorus and later philosophers, like Numenius, who have posited a supreme principle above Intellect. Basilides apparently attempted to “flesh out” the standard triadic schemas of the more mainstream Middle Platonists by adding certain anthropomorphic attributes like “prudence” to the mix. Basilides was among the first Christian thinkers besides John the Evangelist to explicitly identify Jesus as the earthly manifestation of the Divine Intellect. He also dabbled in astrology, revising practices current in his time to suit his own peculiar cosmology. Using numerology, he identified the ruler of the celestial realm as “Abrasax” or “Abraxas,” a name used in the practice of ritual magic, the numerical value of which is (according to Greek numerology) 365, corresponding to the number of “heavens” believed by Gnostics and other to exist above the familiar spheres of the seven planets.
Valentinus (ca. 100-175 A.D.) begins his system, in Pythagorean fashion, not with a unity but a primal duality, the members of which he calls the Ineffable and Silence. The primal duality produces a second duality called the Parent and Truth, from which spring a quartet consisting of Logos, Life, Primal Man, and the Church. As a Christian, Valentinus held a rather peculiar notion of the nature and role of Christ in the cosmos, considering Him to have been engendered along with a “shadow” (matter) that it was His responsibility to control. Here again we see an elaboration on a particular aspect of Middle Platonism, namely the manner in which unwieldy matter is brought under control by a rationalizing force. Valentinus was apparently the first Christian theologian to refer to the Trinity in terms of persons, and he affirmed the eternity and immortality of souls, implying a notion of pre-existence of souls such as we find later in Origen.
Gnosticism had an immense influence not only on the development of Christianity but on emerging Neoplatonism as well. Plotinus, for example, was forced to respond to the increasingly vocal, it seems, Gnostics attending his lectures. Later, Iamblichus posited a One even higher than the Plotinian One, in a manner similar to Gnostics like Basilides and Valentinus who, as we have seen, separated their highest principles from all others by positing an unengendered parent, and a primal duality productive of a second duality, respectively.
The writings known as the Chaldaean Oracles were very likely composed by a certain Julian the Theurgist, who served in the Roman army during Marcus Aurelius’ campaign against the Quadi, and claimed to have saved the Roman camp from fiery destruction by causing a rainstorm (Dillon, pp. 392-393). The circumstances surrounding the writing of the Oracles is mysterious, the most likely explanation being that Julian uttered them after inducing a sort of trance akin to that of the classical oracles of Greece (E.R. Dodds 1973, p. 284). There is much Platonic content in the Oracles, resembling very closely the philosophy of Numenius, which is why they are of interest in this survey of Middle Platonism.
The metaphysical schema of the Chaldaean Oracles begins with an absolutely transcendent deity called Father, with whom resides Power, a productive principle, it seems, whence proceeds Intellect. This Intellect has a two-fold function, to contemplate the Forms of the purely intellectual realm of the Father, and to craft and govern the material realm. In this latter capacity the Intellect is Demiurge. The Oracles further posits a barrier between the intellectual and the material realm, personified as Hecate. In the capacity of barrier, or more properly “membrane” (hupezôkôs humên), Hecate separates the two “fires,” that is, the purely intellectual fire of the Father, and the material fire from which the cosmos is created, and mediates all divine influence upon the lower realm. From Hecate is derived the World-Soul, which in turn emanates Nature, the governor of the sub-lunar realm (Dillon, p. 394-395). From Nature is derived Fate, which is capable of enslaving the lower part of the human soul. The goal of existence then is to purify the lower soul of all contact with Nature and Fate, by living a life of austerity and contemplation. Salvation is achieved by an ascent through the planetary spheres, during which the soul casts off the various aspects of its lower soul, and becomes pure intellect.
It is evident, even from a brief survey such as this one, that the thinkers comprising the philosophy generally referred to as Middle Platonism held widely varying and sometimes even divergent ideas, not only on relatively minor points like the role of physical pleasure in happiness, but on major points like the eternity of the world or the number of first principles. A student encountering Middle Platonism for the first time, armed only with a knowledge of Plato’s Dialogues, will likely wonder why we even call some of these thinkers Platonists at all. That is understandable. However, it must be remembered that Plato did not bequeath a set of doctrines on his students and successors; his legacy is rather a series of problems that have exercised the minds of philosophers for over two millennia. Platonism, therefore, should not be thought of a simple elucidation of Plato’s doctrines, but rather as a creative engagement with Plato’s texts and with certain doctrines handed down by the Academy as belonging to Plato. Middle Platonism ends with Origen of Alexandria and his younger contemporary Plotinus, both of whom were deeply indebted to many of the philosophers discussed in this article, yet moved in directions uniquely their own. It is with them that Neoplatonism begins.
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St. Elias School of Orthodox Theology
Last updated: June 28, 2005 | Originally published: January/9/2004
Categories: Ancient Philosophy