John Stuart Mill (1806-1873) profoundly influenced the shape of nineteenth century British thought and political discourse. His substantial corpus of works includes texts in logic, epistemology, economics, social and political philosophy, ethics, metaphysics, religion, and current affairs. Among his most well-known and significant are A System of Logic, Principles of Political Economy, On Liberty, Utilitarianism, The Subjection of Women, Three Essays on Religion, and his Autobiography.Mill’s education at the hands of his imposing father, James Mill, fostered both intellectual development (Greek at the age of three, Latin at eight) and a propensity towards reform. James Mill and Jeremy Bentham led the “Philosophic Radicals,” who advocated for rationalization of the law and legal institutions, universal male suffrage, the use of economic theory in political decision-making, and a politics oriented by human happiness rather than natural rights or conservatism. In his twenties, the younger Mill felt the influence of historicism, French social thought, and Romanticism, in the form of thinkers like Coleridge, the St. Simonians, Thomas Carlyle, Goethe, and Wordsworth. This led him to begin searching for a new philosophic radicalism that would be more sensitive to the limits on reform imposed by culture and history and would emphasize the cultivation of our humanity, including the cultivation of dispositions of feeling and imagination (something he thought had been lacking in his own education).
None of Mill’s major writings remain independent of his moral, political, and social agenda. Even the most abstract works, such as the System of Logic and his Examination of Sir William Hamilton’s Philosophy, serve polemical purposes in the fight against the German, or a priori, school otherwise called “intuitionism.” On Mill’s view, intuitionism needed to be defeated in the realms of logic, mathematics, and philosophy of mind if its pernicious effects in social and political discourse were to be mitigated.
In his writings, Mill argues for a number of controversial principles. He defends radical empiricism in logic and mathematics, suggesting that basic principles of logic and mathematics are generalizations from experience rather than known a priori. The principle of utility—that “actions are right in proportion as they tend to promote happiness; wrong as they tend to produce the reverse of happiness”—was the centerpiece of his ethical philosophy. On Liberty puts forward the “harm principle” that “the only purpose for which power can be rightfully exercised over any member of a civilized community, against his will, is to prevent harm to others.” In The Subjection of Women, he compares the legal status of women to the status of slaves and argues for equality in marriage and under the law.
This article provides an overview of Mill’s life and major works, focusing on his key arguments and their relevant historical contexts.
Writing of John Stuart Mill a few days after Mill’s death, Henry Sidgwick claimed, “I should say that from about 1860-65 or thereabouts he ruled England in the region of thought as very few men ever did: I do not expect to see anything like it again.” (Collini 1991, 178). Mill established this rule over English thought through his writings in logic, epistemology, economics, social and political philosophy, ethics, metaphysics, religion, and current affairs. One can say with relative security, looking at the breadth and complexity of his work, that Mill was the greatest nineteenth century British philosopher.
This rule did not come about accidentally. It had been planned by his father James Mill from the younger Mill’s birth on May 20, 1806. The elder Mill was a towering figure for his eldest child, and Mill’s story must be told through his father’s. James Mill was born in Scotland in 1773 to a family of modest means. Through the patronage of Sir John and Lady Jane Stuart, he was able to attend the University of Edinburgh, which at the time was one of the finest universities in Europe. He trained for the Presbyterian ministry under the auspices of admired teachers like Dugald Stewart, who was an effective popularizer of Thomas Reid’s philosophy.
After a brief and generally unsuccessful stint as a minister, James Mill moved to London, where he began his career in letters. This was a difficult path for a man of very modest resources to take; he and his wife Harriet (married 1805) lived without financial security for well over a decade. It was only with the publication of his The History of British India in 1818—a work that took twelve years to write—that Mill was able to land a stable, well paying job at the East India Company that enabled him to support his large family (ultimately consisting of his wife and nine children).
Throughout the years of relative poverty, James Mill received assistance from friends including the great legal theorist and utilitarian reformer Jeremy Bentham, whom he met in 1808. The two men helped lead the movement of “Philosophic Radicals” that gave intellectual heft to the British Radical party of the early to mid-nineteenth century. Among their colleagues were David Ricardo, George Grote, Sir William Molesworth, John Austin, and Francis Place.
This philosophically inspired radicalism of the early nineteenth century positioned itself against the Whigs and Tories. The Radicals advocated for legal and political reform, universal male suffrage, the use of economic theory (especially Ricardo’s) in political decision-making, and a politics oriented by human happiness rather than by conservatism or by natural rights (which Bentham famously derided as “nonsense upon stilts”). Moreover, one aspect of their political temperament that distinguished them from Whigs and Tories was their rationalism—their willingness to recommend re-structuring social and political institutions under the explicit guidance of principles of reason (e.g. the principle of utility).
With Bentham’s financial support, the Radicals founded the Westminster Review (1824) to counter the Whig Edinburgh Review (1802) and the Tory Quarterly Review (1809). While Whig intellectuals and Radicals tended to align with each other on economic issues, both tending towards pro-urban, pro-industrial, laissez-faire policies, Tory intellectuals focused on defending traditional British social structures and ways of life associated with aristocratic agrarianism. These alliances can be seen in disputes over the Tory-supported Corn Laws, legislation meant to protect domestic agriculture by taxing imported grains.
Though Whigs and Radicals were often allied (eventually forming the Liberal party in the 1840s), some of the most acrimonious political and intellectual rows of the period were over their differences (for example, Macaulay’s famous public disputes with James Mill over political theorizing). James Mill saw the Whigs as too imbued with aristocratic interests to be a true organ of democratic reform. Only the Radicals could properly advocate for the middle and working classes. Moreover, unlike the Radicals, who possessed a systematic politics guided by the principle of utility (the principle that set the promotion of aggregate happiness as the standard for legislation and action), the Whigs lacked a systematic politics. The Whigs depended instead on a loose empiricism, which the senior Mill took as an invitation to complacency. Whigs, alternatively, took exception to the rationalistic tenor of the Radicals’ politics, seeing in it a dangerous psychological and historical naiveté. They also reacted to the extremity of the Radicals’ reformist temperaments, which revealed hostility to the Anglican church and to religion more generally.
The younger Mill was seen as the crown prince of the Philosophic Radical movement and his famous education reflected the hopes of his father and Bentham. Under the dominating gaze of his father, he was taught Greek beginning at age three and Latin at eight. He read histories, many of the Greek and Roman classics, and Newton by eleven. He studied logic and math, moving to political economy and legal philosophy in his early teens, and then went on to metaphysics. His training facilitated active command of the material through the requirement that he teach his younger siblings and through evening walks with his father when the precocious pupil would have to tell his father what he had learned that day. His year in France in 1820 led to a fluency in French and initiated his life-long interest in French thought and politics. As he matured, his father and Bentham both employed him as an editor. In addition, he founded a number of intellectual societies and study groups and began to contribute to periodicals, including the Westminster Review.
The stress of his education and of his youthful activity combined with other factors to lead to what he later termed, in his Autobiography, his “mental crisis” of 1826. There have been a wide variety of attempts to explain what led to this crisis—most of which center around his relation to his demanding father—but what matters most about the crisis is that it represents the beginning of Mill’s struggle to revise his father’s and Bentham’s thought, which he grew to think of as limited in a number of ways. Mill claims that he began to come out of his depression with the help of poetry (specifically Wordsworth). This contributed to his sense that while his education had fostered his analytic abilities, it had left his capacity for feeling underdeveloped. This realization made him re-think the attachment to the radical, rationalistic strands of Enlightenment thought that his education was meant to promote.
In response to this crisis, Mill began exploring Romanticism and a variety of other European intellectual movements that rejected secular, naturalistic, worldly conceptions of human nature. He also became interested in criticisms of urbanization and industrialization. These explorations were furthered by the writings of (and frequent correspondence with) thinkers from a wide sampling of intellectual traditions, including Thomas Carlyle, Auguste Comte, Alexis de Tocqueville, John Ruskin, M. Gustave d’Eichtal (and other St. Simonians), Herbert Spencer, Frederick Maurice, and John Sterling.
The attempt to rectify the perceived deficiencies of the Philosophic Radicals through engagement with other styles of thought began with Mill’s editing of a new journal, the London Review, founded by the two Mills and Charles Molesworth. Molesworth quickly bought out the old Westminster Review in 1834, to leave the new London and Westminster Review as the unopposed voice of the radicals. With James Mill’s death in 1836 and Bentham’s 1832 demise, Mill had more intellectual freedom. He used that freedom to forge a new “philosophic radicalism” that incorporated the insights of thinkers like Coleridge and Thomas Carlyle. (Collected Works [CW], I.209). One of his principal goals was “to shew that there was a Radical philosophy, better and more complete than Bentham’s, while recognizing and incorporating all of Bentham’s which is permanently valuable.” (CW, I.221).
This project is perhaps best indicated by Mill’s well-known essays of 1838 and 1840 on Bentham and Coleridge, which were published in the London and Westminster Review. Mill suggested that Bentham and Coleridge were “the two great seminal minds of England in their age” and used each essay to show their strengths and weaknesses, implying that a more complete philosophical position remained open for articulation. Mill would spend his career attempting to carry that out.
Harriet Taylor, friend, advisor, and eventual wife, helped him with this project. He met Taylor in 1830 and she was to join James Mill as one of the two most important people in Mill’s life. Unfortunately for Mill, Taylor was married. After two decades of an intense and somewhat scandalous platonic relationship, they were married in 1851 after her husband’s death. Her death in 1858 left him inconsolable.
There has been substantial debate about the nature and extent of Harriet Taylor’s influence on Mill. Beyond question is that Mill found in her a partner, friend, critic, and someone who encouraged him. Mill was probably most swayed by her in the realms of political, ethical, and social thought, but less so in the areas of logic and political economy (with the possible exception of his views on socialism).
Mill’s day-to-day existence was dominated by his work at the East India Company, though his job required little time, paid him well, and left him ample opportunity for writing. He began there in 1826, working under his father, and by his retirement in 1857, he held the same position as his father, chief examiner, which put him in charge of the memoranda guiding the company’s policies in India.
On his retirement and after the death of his wife, Mill was recruited to stand for a Parliamentary seat. Though he was not particularly effective during his one term as an MP, he participated in three dramatic events. (Capaldi 2004, 326-7). First, Mill attempted to amend the 1867 Reform Bill to substitute “person” for “man” so that the franchise would be extended to women. Though the effort failed, it generated momentum for women’s suffrage. Second, he headed the Jamaica Committee, which pushed (unsuccessfully) for the prosecution of Governor Eyre of Jamaica, who had imposed brutal martial law after an uprising by blacks. Third, Mill used his influence with the leaders of the laboring classes to defuse a potentially dangerous confrontation between government troops and workers who were protesting the defeat of the 1866 Reform Bill.
After his term in Parliament ended and he was not re-elected, Mill began spending more time in France, writing, walking, and living with his wife’s daughter, Helen Taylor. It was to her that he uttered his last words in 1873, “You know that I have done my work.” He was buried next to his wife, Harriet.
Though Mill’s influence has waxed and waned since his death, his writings in ethics and social and political philosophy continue to be read most often. Many of his texts—particularly On Liberty, Utilitarianism, The Subjection of Women, and his Autobiography—continue to be reprinted and taught in universities throughout the world.
Mill wrote on a startling number of topics. All his major texts, however, play a role in defending his new philosophic radicalism and the intellectual, moral, political, and social agendas associated with it.
Though Mill’s biography reveals his openness to intellectual exploration, his most basic philosophical commitment—to naturalism—never seriously wavers. He is committed to the idea that our best methods of explaining the world are those employed by the natural sciences. Anything that we can know about human minds and wills comes from treating them as part of the causal order investigated by the sciences, rather than as special entities that lie outside it.
By taking the methods of the natural sciences as the only route to knowledge about the world, Mill sees himself as rejecting the “German, or a priori view of human knowledge,” (CW, I.233) or, as he also calls it, “intuitionism,” which was espoused in different ways by Kant, Reid, and their followers in Britain (e.g. Whewell and Hamilton). Though there are many differences among intuitionist thinkers, one “grand doctrine” that Mill suggests they all affirm is the view that “the constitution of the mind is the key to the constitution of external nature—that the laws of the human intellect have a necessary correspondence with the objective laws of the universe, such that these may be inferred from those.” (CW, XI.343). The intuitionist doctrine conceives of nature as being largely or wholly constituted by the mind rather than more or less imperfectly observed by it. One of the great dangers presented by this doctrine, from the perspective of Mill’s a posteriori school, is that it supports the belief that one can know universal truths about the world through evidence (including intuitions or Kantian categories of the understanding) provided by the mind alone rather than by nature. If the mind constitutes the world that we experience, then we can understand the world by understanding the mind. It was this freedom from appeal to nature and the lack of independent (i.e. empirical) checks to the knowledge claims associated with it that Mill found so disturbing.
For Mill, the problems with intuitionism extend far beyond the metaphysical and epistemological to the moral and political. As Mill says in his Autobiography when discussing his important treatise of 1843, A System of Logic:
The notion that truths external to the mind may be known by intuition or consciousness, independently of observation and experience, is, I am persuaded, in these times, the great intellectual support of false doctrines and bad institutions. By the aid of this theory, every inveterate belief and every intense feeling, of which the origin is not remembered, is enabled to dispense with the obligation of justifying itself by reason, and is erected into its own all-sufficient voucher and justification. There never was such an instrument devised for consecrating all deep-seated prejudices. And the chief strength of this false philosophy in morals, politics, and religion, lies in the appeal which it is accustomed to make to the evidence of mathematics and of the cognate branches of physical science. To expel it from these, is to drive it from its stronghold. (CW, I.233)
This charge against intuitionism, that it frees one from the obligation of justifying one’s beliefs, has strong roots in philosophic radicalism. We find Bentham, in his 1789 An Introduction to the Principles of Morals and Legislation, attacking non-utilitarian moral systems for just this reason: “They consist all of them in so many contrivances for avoiding the obligation of appealing to any external standard, and for prevailing upon the reader to accept of the author’s sentiment or opinion as a reason and that a sufficient one for itself.” (IPML, II.14). Mill thus saw his own commitment to the naturalism and empiricism of the “a posteriori school” of thought as part of a broader social and political agenda that advocated for reform and also undercut traditional foundations of conservatism.
Intuitionism, however, is often taken to be on much firmer ground than empiricism when it comes to accounting for our knowledge of mathematics and logic. This is especially true if one rejects the idea, found in people like Hobbes and Hume, that mathematical propositions like 2 + 3 = 5 are true merely because of the meaning of the constituents of the proposition, or, as Hume puts it, because of the proposition’s “relations of ideas.” Mill agrees with those (including Kant) who maintain that logical and mathematical truths are not merely linguistic—that they contain substantive, non-linguistic information. But this leaves Mill with the problem of accounting for the apparent necessity of such truths—a necessity which seems to rule out their origin in experience. To successfully attack intuitionism in “its stronghold,” the System of Logic needs to provide alternative grounds for basic principles of logic and mathematics (e.g. the principle of non-contradiction). In particular, Mill needs to show how “that peculiar character of what are called necessary truths” may be explained from experience and association alone.
The object of logic “is to ascertain how we come by that portion of our knowledge (much the greatest portion) which is not intuitive: and by what criterion we can, in matters not self-evident, distinguish between things proved and things not proved, between what is worthy and what is unworthy of belief.” (A System of Logic [System], I.i.1). It should be noted that logic goes beyond formal logic for Mill and into the conditions of truth more generally.
The text has the following basic structure. Book I addresses names and propositions. Books II and III examine deduction and induction, respectively. Book IV discusses a variety of operations of the mind, including observation, abstraction and naming, which are presupposed in all induction or instrumental to more complicated forms of induction. Book V reveals fallacies of reasoning. Finally, in Book VI, Mill treats the “moral sciences” and argues for the fundamental similarity of the methods of the natural and human sciences. In fact, the human sciences can be understood as themselves natural sciences with human objects of study.
Mill’s argument that the principles of mathematics and logic are justified by appeal to experience depends upon his distinction between verbal and real propositions, that is, between propositions that do not convey new information to the person who understands the meaning of the proposition’s terms and those propositions that do convey new information. The point of the distinction between verbal and real propositions is, first, to stress that all real propositions are a posteriori. Second, the distinction emphasizes that verbal propositions are empty of content; they tell us about language (i.e. what words mean) rather than about the world. In Kantian terms, Mill wants to deny the possibility of synthetic a priori propositions, while contending that we can still make sense of our knowledge of subjects like logic and mathematics.
This distinction between verbal and real propositions depends, in turn, upon Mill’s analysis of the meaning of propositions, i.e. how the meanings of constituents of propositions determine the meaning of the whole. A proposition, in which something is affirmed or denied of something, is formed by putting together two “names” or terms (subject and predicate) and a copula. The subject is the name “denoting the person or thing which something is affirmed or denied of.” (System, I.i.2). The predicate is “the name denoting that which is affirmed or denied.” The copula is “the sign denoting that there is an affirmation or denial,” which thereby enables “the hearer or reader to distinguish a proposition from any other kind of discourse.” In the proposition ‘gold is yellow’ for example, the copula ‘is’ shows that the quality yellow is being affirmed of the substance gold.
Mill divides names into general and singular names. All names, except proper names (e.g. Ringo, Buckley, etc) and names that signify an attribute only (e.g. whiteness, length), have a connotation and a denotation. That is, they both connote or imply some attribute(s) and denote or pick out individuals that fall under that description. The general name “man,” for example, denotes Socrates, Picasso, Plutarch and an indefinite number of other individuals, and it does so because they all share some attribute(s) (e.g. rational animal, featherless biped, etc.) connoted by man. The name “white” denotes all white things and implies or connotes the attribute whiteness. The word “whiteness,” by contrast, denotes or signifies an attribute but does not connote an attribute. Instead, it operates like a proper name in that its meaning derives entirely from what it denotes.
The meaning of a typical proposition is that the thing(s) denoted by the subject has the attribute(s) connoted by the predicate. In sentences like “Eleanor is tired” and “All men are mortal,” though the subjects pick out their objects differently (through a proper name and through an attribute, respectively), Mill’s basic story about the meaning of propositions holds.
Things become much more difficult with identity statements like “Hesperus is Phosphorus.” In this case, we have two proper names that pick out the same object (the planet Venus). Under Mill’s view, these proper names should have the same meaning because they denote the same object. But this appears untenable because the statement seems informative. It doesn’t seem plausible that the proposition merely states that an object is identical with itself, which would be the proposition’s meaning if Mill’s views on the meaning of proper names were correct. (See Frege and Russell’s attack on Mill’s account of the meaning of proper names; but see Kripke’s sophisticate defense of Mill on this in Naming and Necessity).
This discussion of the nature of names or terms enables us to understand Mill’s treatment of verbal and real propositions. Verbal propositions assert something about the meaning of names rather than about matters of fact. This means that, “(s)ince names and their signification are entirely arbitrary, such propositions are not, strictly speaking, susceptible of truth or falsity, but only of conformity or disconformity to usage or convention.” (System, I.vi.1). This kind of proposition simply “asserts of a thing under a particular name, only what is asserted of it in the fact of calling it by that name; and which, therefore, either gives no information, or gives it respecting the name, not the thing.” (I.vi.4). As such, verbal propositions are empty of content and they are the only things we know a priori, independently of checking the correspondence of the proposition to the world.
Real propositions, in contrast, “predicate of a thing some fact not involved in the signification of the name by which the proposition speaks of it; some attribute not connoted by that name.” (I.vi.4). Such propositions convey information that is not already included in the names or terms employed, and their truth or falsity depends on whether or not they correspond to relevant features of the world. Thus, “George is on the soccer team” predicates something of the subject George that is not included in its meaning (in this case, the denotation of the individual person) and its being true or not depends upon whether George is, in fact, on the team.
Mill’s great contention in the System of Logic is that logic and mathematics contain real, rather than merely verbal, propositions. He claims, for example, that the law of contradiction (i.e. the same proposition cannot at the same time be false and true) and the law of excluded middle (i.e. either a proposition is true or it is false) are both real propositions. They are, like the axioms of geometry, experimental truths, not truths known a priori. They represent generalizations or inductions from observation—very well-justified inductions, to be sure, but inductions nonetheless. This leads Mill to say that the necessity typically ascribed to the truths of mathematics and logic by his intuitionist opponents is an illusion, thereby undermining intuitionist argumentative fortifications at their strongest point.
A System of Logic thus represents the most thorough attempt to argue for empiricism in epistemology, logic, and mathematics before the twentieth century (for the best discussion of this point, see Skorupski 1989). Though revolutionary advances in logic and philosophy of language in the late nineteenth and early twentieth centuries have rendered many of Mill’s technical points about semantics and logic obsolete, the basic philosophical vision that Mill defends is very much a live option (see, for example, the work of Quine).
There are some other topics covered in the System of Logic that are of interest. First is Mill’s treatment of deduction (in the form of the syllogism). His discussion is driven by one basic concern: Why wouldn’t a deduction simply tell us what we already know? How can it be informative? Mill discounts two common views about the syllogism, namely, that it is useless (because it tells us what we already know) and that it is the correct analysis of what the mind actually does when it discovers truths. To understand why Mill discounts these ways of thinking about deduction, we need to understand his views on inference.
The key point here is that all inference is from particular to particular. When we infer that the Duke of Wellington is mortal from “All men are mortal,” what we are really doing is inferring the Duke’s mortality from the mortality of the individual people with whose mortality we are familiar. What the mind does in making a deductive inference is not to move from a universal truth to a particular one. Rather, it moves from truths about a number of particulars to a smaller number (or one). The general statement that “All men are mortal” only allows us to more easily register what we know—it reflects neither the true inference being made nor the warrant or evidence we have for making the inference. Though general propositions are not necessary for reasoning, they are heuristically useful (as are the syllogisms that employ them). They aid us in memory and comprehension.
Mill’s famous treatment of induction reveals the a posteriori grounds for belief. He focuses on four different methods of experimental inquiry that attempt to single out from the circumstances that precede or follow a phenomenon the ones that are linked to the phenomenon by an invariable law. (System, III.viii.1). That is, we test to see if a purported causal connection exists by observing the relevant phenomena under an assortment of situations. If we wish, for example, to know whether a virus causes a disease, how can we prove it? What counts as good evidence for such a belief? The four methods of induction or experimental inquiry—the methods of agreement, of difference, of residues, and of concomitant variation—provide answers to these questions by showing what we need to demonstrate in order to claim that a causal law holds. Can we show, using the method of difference, that when the virus is not present the disease is also absent? If so, then we have some grounds for believing that the virus causes the disease.
Another issue addressed in A System of Logic that is of abiding interest is Mill’s handling of free will. Mill’s commitment to naturalism includes treating the human will as a potential object of scientific study: “Our will causes our bodily actions in the same sense, and in no other, in which cold causes ice, or a spark causes an explosion of gunpowder. The volition, a state of our mind, is the antecedent; the motion of our limbs in conformity to the volition, is the consequent.” (System, III.v.11). The questions that readily arise are how, under this view, can one take the will to be free and how can we preserve responsibility and feelings of choice?
In his Autobiography, Mill recounts his own youthful, melancholy acceptance of the doctrine of “Philosophical Necessity” (advocated by, among others, Robert Owen and his followers): “I felt as if I was scientifically proved to be the helpless slave of antecedent circumstances; as if my character and that of all others had been formed for us by agencies beyond our control, and was wholly out of our own power.” (CW, I.175-7). But it is precisely the idea that our character is formed for us, not by us, that Mill thinks is a “grand error.” (System, VI.ii.3). We have the power to alter our own character. Though our own character is formed by circumstances, among those circumstances are our own desires. We cannot directly will our characters to be one way rather than another, but we can will actions that shape those characters.
Mill addresses an obvious objection: what leads us to will to change our character? Isn’t that determined? Mill agrees. Our desire to change our character is determined largely by our experience of painful and pleasant consequences associated with our character. For Mill, however, the important point is that, even if we don’t control the desire to change our character, we are still left with the feeling of moral freedom, which is the feeling of being able to modify our own character “if we wish.” (System, VI.ii.3). What Mill wants to save in the doctrine of free will is simply the feeling that we have “real power over the formation of our own character.” (CW, I.177). If we have the desire to change our character, we find that we can. If we lack that desire it is “of no consequence what we think forms our character,” because we don’t care about altering it. For Mill, this is a thick enough notion of freedom to avoid fatalism.
One of the basic problems for this kind of naturalistic picture of human beings and wills is that it clashes with our first-person image of ourselves as reasoners and agents. As Kant understood, and as the later hermeneutic tradition emphasizes, we think of ourselves as autonomous followers of objectively given rules (Skorupski 1989, 279). It seems extremely difficult to provide a convincing naturalistic account of, for example, making a choice (without explaining away as illusory our first-person experience of making choices).
The desire to treat the will as an object, like ice or gunpowder, open to natural scientific study falls within Mill’s broader claim that the moral sciences, which include economics, history, and psychology among others, are fundamentally similar to the natural sciences. Though we may have difficulty running experiments in the human realm, that realm and its objects are, in principle, just as open to the causal explanations we find in physics or biology.
Perhaps the most interesting element of his analysis of the moral sciences is his commitment to what has been called “methodological individualism,” or the view that social and political phenomena are explicable by appeal to the behavior of individuals. In other words, social facts are reducible to facts about individuals: “The laws of the phenomena of society are, and can be, nothing but the laws of the actions and passions of human beings united together in the social state. Men, however, in a state of society, are still men; their actions and passions are obedient to the laws of individual human nature. Men are not, when brought together, converted into another kind of substance with different properties.” (System, VI.vii.1).
This position puts Mill in opposition to Auguste Comte, a founding figure in social theory (he coined the term “sociology”) and an important influence on, and correspondent with, Mill. Comte takes sociology rather than psychology to be the most basic of human sciences and takes individuals and their conduct to be best understood through the lens of social analysis. To put it simplistically, for Comte, the individual is an abstraction from the whole—its beliefs and conduct are determined by history and society. We understand the individual best, on this view, when we see the individual as an expression of its social institutions and setting. This naturally leads to a kind of historicism. Though Mill recognized the important influences of social institutions and history on individuals, for him society is nevertheless only able to shape individuals through affecting their experiences—experiences structured by universal principles of human psychology that operate in all times and places. (See Mandelbaum 1971, 167ff).
Mill’s attacks on intuitionism continued throughout his life. One notable example is his 1865 An Examination of Sir William Hamilton’s Philosophy, which revisits much of the same ground as A System of Logic in the guise of a thorough-going criticism of Hamilton, a thinker influenced by Reid and Kant whom Mill took as representing “the great fortress of the intuitional philosophy in this country.” (CW, I.270). The rather hefty volume explores “some of the disputed questions in the domain of psychology and metaphysics.” (CW, I.271).
Among the doctrines given most attention is that of the “relativity of knowledge,” something to which Mill takes Hamilton as insufficiently committed. It is the idea that we have no access to “things-in-themselves” (thus, the relativity versus absoluteness of knowledge) and that we are limited to analyzing the phenomena of consciousness. Mill, who accepts this basic principle, counts himself as a Berkeleian phenomenalist and famously defines matter in the Examination as “a Permanent Possibility of Sensation,” (CW, IX.183), thinks that Hamilton accepts this doctrine in a confused manner. “He affirms without reservation, that certain attributes (extension, figures, etc.) are known to us as they really exist out of ourselves; and also that all our knowledge of them is relative to us. And these two assertions are only reconcileable, if relativity to us is understood in the altogether trivial sense, that we know them only so far as our faculties permit.” (CW, IX.22). Hamilton therefore seems to want to have his cake and eat it too when it comes to knowledge of the external world. On the one hand, he wants to declare that we have access to things as they are, thereby aligning himself with Reid’s project of avoiding the fall into (Humean) skepticism—a fall prompted by the Lockean “way of ideas.” On the other hand, he wants to follow Kant in limiting our knowledge of things-in-themselves, thereby reigning in the pretensions of metaphysical speculation. Mill avoids this dilemma by rejecting Hamilton’s position that we know things outside as they really are.
One point of historical interest about the Examination is the impact that it had on the way that the history of philosophy is taught. Mill’s demolition of Hamilton’s reputation led to the removal of Reid and the school of Scottish “common sense” philosophy from the curriculum in Britain and America. As Kuklick puts it, the success of Mill’s Examination “is the crucial event in understanding the development of the contemporary view of Modern Philosophy in America.” By destroying “the credibility of the entire Scottish reply to Hume,” Mill’s Examination led Anglo-American philosophers to turn to Kant in the later part of the nineteenth century in order to find more satisfactory response to Humean skepticism (Kuklick 1984, 128). Thus, the standard course in Modern Philosophy that includes all or some of Descartes, Spinoza, Leibniz, Locke, Berkeley, Hume, and Kant, is partly an unintended consequence of the publication of Mill’s attack on Hamilton and on intuitionism more broadly.
As noted in the discussion of A System of Logic, Mill’s commitment to “methodological individualism” makes psychology the foundational moral science. Though he never wrote a work of his own on psychology, he edited and contributed notes to an 1869 re-issue of his father’s 1829 work in psychology, Analysis of the Phenomena of the Human Mind, and reviewed the work of his friend and correspondent, Alexander Bain. All three were proponents of the associationist school of psychology, whose roots go back to Hobbes and especially Locke and whose members included Gay, Hartley, and Priestly in the eighteenth century and the Mills, Bain, and Herbert Spencer in the nineteenth century.
Mill distinguishes between the a posteriori and a priori schools of psychology. The former “resolves the whole contents of the mind into experience.” (CW, XI.341). The latter emphasizes that “in every act of thought, down to the most elementary, there is an ingredient which is not given to the mind, but contributed by the mind in virtue of its inherent powers.” (CW, XI.344). In the a priori or intuitionist school, experience “instead of being the source and prototype of our ideas, is itself a product of the mind’s own forces working on the impressions we receive from without, and has always a mental as well as an external element.” (CW, XI.344).
The associationist version of a posteriori psychology has two basic doctrines: “first, that the more recondite phenomena of the mind are formed out of the more simple and elementary; and, secondly, that the mental law, by means of which this formation takes place, is the Law of Association.” (CW, XI.345). The associationist psychologists, then, would attempt to explain mental phenomena by showing them to be the ultimate product of simpler components of experience (e.g. color, sound, smell, pleasure, pain) connected to each other through associations. These associations take two basic forms: resemblance and contiguity in space and/or time. Thus, these psychologists attempt to explain our idea of an orange or our feelings of greed as the product of simpler ideas connected by association.
Part of the impulse for this account of psychology is its apparent scientific character and beauty. Associationism attempts to explain a large variety of mental phenomena on the basis of experience plus very few mental laws of association. It therefore appeals to those who are particularly drawn to simplicity in their scientific theories.
Another attraction of associationist psychology, however, is its implications for views on moral education and social reform. If the contents of our minds, including beliefs and moral feelings, are products of experiences that we undergo connected according to very simple laws, then this raises the possibility that human beings are capable of being radically re-shaped—that our natures, rather than being fixed, are open to major alteration. In other words, if our minds are cobbled together by laws of association working on the materials of experience, then this suggests that if our experiences were to change, so would our minds. This doctrine tends to place much greater emphasis on social and political institutions like the family, the workplace, and the state, than does the doctrine that the nature of the mind offers strong resistance to being shaped by experience (i.e. that the mind molds experience rather than being molded by it). Associationism thereby fits nicely into an agenda of reform, because it suggests that many of the problems of individuals are explained by their situations (and the associations that these situations promote) rather than by some intrinsic feature of the mind. As Mill puts it in the Autobiography in discussing the conflict between the intuitionist and a posteriori schools:
The practical reformer has continually to demand that changes be made in things which are supported by powerful and widely spread feelings, or to question the apparent necessity and indefeasibleness of established facts; and it is often an indispensable part of his argument to shew, how these powerful feelings had their origin, and how those facts came to seem necessary and indefeasible. There is therefore a natural hostility between him and a philosophy which discourages the explanation of feelings and moral facts by circumstances and association, and prefers to treat them as ultimate elements of human nature…I have long felt that the prevailing tendency to regard all the marked distinctions of human character as innate, and in the main indelible, and to ignore the irresistible proofs that by far the greater part of those differences, whether between individuals, races, or sexes, are such as not only might but naturally would be produced by differences in circumstances, is one of the chief hindrances to the rational treatment of great social questions, and one of the greatest stumbling blocks to human improvement. (CW, I.269-70).
Another maneuver in his battle with intuitionism came when Mill published Utilitarianism (1861) in installments in Fraser’s Magazine (it was later brought out in book form in 1863). It offers a candidate for a first principle of morality, a principle that provides us with a criterion distinguishing right and wrong. The utilitarian candidate is the principle of utility, which holds that “actions are right in proportion as they tend to promote happiness; wrong as they tend to produce the reverse of happiness. By happiness is intended pleasure and the absence of pain; by unhappiness, pain and the privation of pleasure.” (CW, X.210).
By Mill’s time, the principle of utility possessed a long history stretching back to the 1730’s (with roots going further back to Hobbes, Locke, and even to Epicurus). In the eighteenth and early nineteenth centuries, it had been explicitly invoked by three British intellectual factions. Though all may have agreed that an action’s consequences for the general happiness were to dictate its rightness or wrongness, the reasons behind the acceptance of that principle and the uses to which the principle was put varied greatly.
The earliest supporters of the principle of utility were the religious utilitarians represented by, among others, John Gay, John Brown, Soame Jenyns, and, most famously, William Paley, whose 1785 The Principles of Moral and Political Philosophy was one of the most frequently re-printed and well read books of moral thought of the late eighteenth and early nineteenth centuries (to Mill’s dismay, Bentham’s utilitarianism was often conflated with Paley’s). Religious utilitarianism was very popular among the educated classes and dominated in the universities until the 1830’s. These thinkers were all deeply influenced by Locke’s empiricism and psychological hedonism and often stood opposed to the competing moral doctrines of Shaftesbury, Hutcheson, Clarke, and Wollaston.
The religious utilitarians looked to the Christian God to address a basic problem, namely how to harmonize the interests of individuals, who are motivated by their own happiness, with the interests of the society as a whole. Once we understand that what we must do is what God wills (because of God’s power of eternal sanction) and that God wills the happiness of his creatures, morality and our own self-interest will be seen to overlap. God guarantees that an individual’s self-interest lies in virtue, in furthering the happiness of others. Without God and his sanctions of eternal punishment and reward, it would be hard to find motives that “are likely to be found sufficient to withhold men from the gratification of lust, revenge, envy, ambition, avarice.” (Paley 2002 , 39). As we shall see in a moment, another possible motivation for caring about the general happiness—this one non-religious—is canvassed by Mill in Chapter Three of Utilitarianism.
In contrast to religious utilitarianism, which had few aspirations to be a moral theory that revises ordinary moral attitudes, the two late-eighteenth century secular versions of utilitarianism grew out of various movements for reform. The principle of utility—and the correlated commitments to happiness as the only intrinsically desirable end and to the moral equivalency of the happiness of different individuals—was itself taken to be an instrument of reform.
One version of secular utilitarianism was represented by William Godwin (husband of Mary Wollstonecraft and father of Mary Shelley), who achieved great notoriety with the publication of his Political Justice of 1793. Though his fame (or infamy) was relatively short-lived, Godwin’s use of the principle of utility for the cause of radical political and social critique began the identification of utilitarianism with anti-religiosity and with dangerous democratic values.
The second version of secular utilitarianism, and the one that inspired Mill, arose from the work of Jeremy Bentham. Bentham, who was much more successful than Godwin at building a movement around his ideas, employed the principle of utility as a device of political, social, and legal criticism. It is important to note, however, that Bentham’s interest in the principle of utility did not arise from concern about ethical theory as much as from concern about legislative and legal reform.
This history enables us to understand Mill’s invocation of the principle of utility in its polemical context—Mill’s support of that principle should not be taken as mere intellectual exercise. In the realm of politics, the principle of utility served to bludgeon opponents of reform. First and foremost, reform meant extension of the vote. But it also meant legal reform, including overhaul of the common law system and of legal institutions, and varieties of social reform, especially of institutions that tended to favor aristocratic and moneyed interests. Though Bentham and Godwin intended it to have this function in the late eighteenth century, utilitarianism became influential only when tied with the political machinery of the Radical party, which had particular prominence on the English scene in the 1830’s.
In the realm of ethical debate, Mill took his opponents to be the “intuitionists” led by Sedgwick and Whewell, both Cambridge men. They were the contemporary representatives of an ethical tradition that understood its history as tied to Butler, Reid, Coleridge, and turn of the century German thought (especially that of Kant). Though intuitionists and members of Mill’s a posteriori or “inductive” school recognize “to a great extent, the same moral laws,” they differ “as to their evidence and the source from which they derive their authority. According to the one opinion, the principles of morals are evident a priori, requiring nothing to command assent except that the meaning of the terms be understood. According to the other doctrine, right and wrong, as well as truth and falsehood, are questions of observation and experience.” (CW, X.206).
The chief danger represented by the proponents of intuitionism was not from the ethical content of their theories per se, which defended honesty, justice, benevolence, etc., but from the kinds of justifications offered for their precepts and the support such a view lent to the social and political status quo. As we saw in the discussion of the System of Logic and with reference to Mill’s statements in his Autobiography, he takes intuitionism to be dangerous because it allegedly enables people to ratify their own prejudices as moral principles—in intuitionism, there is no “external standard” by which to adjudicate differing moral claims (for example, Mill understood Kant’s categorical imperative as getting any moral force it possesses either from considerations of utility or from mere prejudice hidden by hand-waving). The principle of utility, alternatively, evaluates moral claims by appealing to the external standard of pain and pleasure. It presented each individual for moral consideration as someone capable of suffering and enjoyment.
Mill’s defense of the principle of utility in Utilitarianism includes five chapters. In the first, Mill sets out the problem, distinguishes between the intuitionist and “inductive” schools of morality, and also suggests limits to what we can expect from proofs of first principles of morality. He argues that “(q)uestions of ultimate ends are not amenable to direct proof.” (CW, X.207). All that can be done is to present considerations “capable of determining the intellect either to give or withhold its assent to the doctrine; and this is equivalent to proof.” (CW, X.208). Ultimately, he will want to prove in Chapter Four the basis for the principle of utility—that happiness is the only intrinsically desirable thing—by showing that we spontaneously accept it on reflection. (Skorupski 1989, 8). It is rather easy to show that happiness is something we desire intrinsically, not for the sake of other things. What is hard is to show that it is the only thing we intrinsically desire or value. Mill agrees that we do not always value things like virtue as means or instruments to happiness. We do sometimes seem to value such things for their own sakes. Mill contends, however, that on reflection we will see that when we appear to value them for their own sakes we are actually valuing them as parts of happiness (rather than as intrinsically desirable on their own or as means to happiness). That is, we value virtue, freedom, etc. as things that make us happy by their mere possession. This is all the proof we can give that happiness is our only ultimate end; it must rely on introspection and on careful and honest examination of our feelings and motives.
In Chapter Two, Mill corrects misconceptions about the principle of utility. One misconception is that utilitarianism, by endorsing the Epicurean view “that life has…no higher end than pleasure” is a “doctrine worthy only of swine.” (CW, X.210). Mill counters that “the accusation supposes human beings to be capable of no pleasures except those of which swine are capable.” (CW, X.210). He proffers a distinction (one not found in Bentham) between higher and lower pleasures, with higher pleasures including mental, aesthetic, and moral pleasures. When we are evaluating whether or not an action is good by evaluating the happiness that we can expect to be produced by it, he argues that higher pleasures should be taken to be in kind (rather than by degree) preferable to lower pleasures. This has led scholars to wonder whether Mill’s utilitarianism differs significantly from Bentham’s and whether Mill’s distinction between higher and lower pleasures creates problems for our ability to know what will maximize aggregate happiness.
A second objection to the principle of utility is that “it is exacting too much to require that people shall always act from the inducement of promoting the general interest of society.” (CW, X.219). Mill replies that this is to “confound the rule of action with the motive of it.” (CW, X.219). Ethics is supposed to tell us what our duties are, “but no system of ethics requires that the sole motive of all we do shall be a feeling of duty; on the contrary, ninety-nine hundredths of all our actions are done from other motives, and rightly so done if the rule of duty does not condemn them.” (CW, X.219). To do the right thing, in other words, we do not need to be constantly motivated by concern for the general happiness. The large majority of actions intend the good of individuals (including ourselves) rather than the good of the world. Yet the world’s good is made up of the good of the individuals that constitute it and unless we are in the position of, say, a legislator, we act properly by looking to private rather than to public good. Our attention to the public well-being usually needs to extend only so far as is required to know that we aren’t violating the rights of others.
Chapter Three addresses the topic of motivation again by focusing on the following question: What is the source of our obligation to the principle of utility? What, in other words, motivates us to act in ways approved of by the principle of utility? With any moral theory, one must remember that ‘ought implies can,’ i.e. that if moral demands are to be legitimate, we must be the kind of beings that can meet those demands. Mill defends the possibility of a strong utilitarian conscience (i.e. a strong feeling of obligation to the general happiness) by showing how such a feeling can develop out of the natural desire we have to be in unity with fellow creatures—a desire that enables us to care what happens to them and to perceive our own interests as linked with theirs. Though Chapter Two showed that we do not need to attend constantly to the general happiness, it is nevertheless a sign of moral progress when the happiness of others, including the happiness of those we don’t know, becomes important to us.
Finally, Chapter Five shows how utilitarianism accounts for justice. In particular, Mill shows how utilitarianism can explain the special status we seem to grant to justice and to the violations of it. Justice is something we are especially keen to defend. Mill begins by marking off morality (the realm of duties) from expediency and worthiness by arguing that duties are those things we think people ought to be punished for not fulfilling. He then suggests that justice is demarcated from other areas of morality, because it includes those duties to which others have correlative rights, “Justice implies something which it is not only right to do, and wrong not to do, but which some individual person can claim from us as his moral right.” (CW, X.247). Though no one has a right to my charity, even if I have a duty to be charitable, others have rights not to have me injure them or to have me repay what I have promised.
Critics of utilitarianism have placed special emphasis on its inability to provide a satisfactory account of rights. For Mill, to have a right is “to have something which society ought to defend me in the possession of. If the objector goes on to ask why it ought, I can give no other reason than general utility.” (CW, X.250). But what if the general utility demands that we violate your rights? The intuition that something is wrong if your rights can be violated for the sake of the general good provoked the great challenge to utilitarian conceptions of justice, leveled with special force by twentieth century thinkers like John Rawls.
The topic of justice received further treatment at Mill’s hands in his famous 1859 book On Liberty. This work is the one, along with A System of Logic, that Mill thought would have the most longevity. It concerns civil and social liberty or, to look at it from the contrary point of view, the nature and limits of the power that can legitimately be exercised by society over the individual.
Mill begins by retelling the history of struggle between rulers and ruled and suggests that social rather than political tyranny is the greater danger for modern, commercial nations like Britain. This social “tyranny of the majority” (a phrase Mill takes from Tocqueville) arises from the enforcement of rules of conduct that are both arbitrary and strongly adhered to. The practical principle that guides the majority “to their opinions on the regulation of human conduct, is the feeling in each person’s mind that everybody should be required to act as he, and those with whom he sympathizes, would like them to act.” (On Liberty [OL], 48). Such a feeling is particularly dangerous because it is taken to be self-justifying and self-evident.
There is a need, therefore, for a rationally grounded principle which governs a society’s dealings with individuals. This “one very simple principle”—often called the “harm principle”—entails that:
[T]he sole end for which mankind are warranted, individually or collectively, in interfering with the liberty of action of any of their number, is self-protection. That the only purpose for which power can be rightfully exercised over any member of a civilized community, against his will, is to prevent harm to others. His own good, either physical or moral, is not a sufficient warrant. He cannot rightfully be compelled to do or forbear because it will be better for him to do so, because it will make him happier, because, in the opinion of others, to do so would be wise, or even right. These are good reasons for remonstrating with him, or reasoning with him, or persuading him, or entreating him, but not for compelling him, or visiting him with any evil in case he do otherwise. (OL, 51-2)
This anti-paternalistic principle identifies three basic regions of human liberty: the “inward domain of consciousness,” liberty of tastes and pursuits (i.e. of framing our own life plan), and the freedom to unite with others.
Mill, unlike other liberal theorists, makes no appeal to “abstract right” in order to justify the harm principle. The reason for accepting the freedom of individuals to act as they choose, so long as they cause minimal or no harm to others, is that it would promote “utility in the largest sense, grounded on the permanent interests of man as a progressive being.” (OL, 53). In other words, abiding by the harm principle is desirable because it promotes what Mill calls the “free development of individuality” or the development of our humanity.
Behind this rests the idea that humanity is capable of progress—that latent or underdeveloped abilities and virtues can be actualized under the right conditions. Human nature is not static. It is not merely re-expressed in generations and individuals. It is “not a machine to be built after a model, and set to do exactly the work prescribed for it, but a tree, which requires to grow and develop itself on all sides, according to the tendency of the inward forces which make it a living thing.” (OL, 105). Though human nature can be thought of as something living, it is also, like an English garden, something amenable to improvement through effort. “Among the works of man, which human life is rightly employed in perfecting and beautifying, the first in importance surely is man himself.” (OL, 105). The two conditions that promote development of our humanity are freedom and variety of situation, both of which the harm principle encourages.
A basic philosophical problem presented by the work is what counts as “harm to others.” Where should we mark the boundary between conduct that is principally self-regarding versus conduct that involves others? Does drug-use cause harm to others sufficient to be prevented? Does prostitution? Pornography? Should polygamy be allowed? How about public nudity? Though these are difficult questions, Mill provides the reader with a principled way of deliberating about them.
Many volumes of Mill’s writings deal with topics of social and political concern. These include writings on specific political problems in India, America, Ireland, France, and England, on the nature of democracy (Considerations on Representative Government) and civilization, on slavery, on law and jurisprudence, on the workplace, and on the family and the status of women. The last subject was the topic of Mill’s well-known The Subjection of Women, an important work in the history of feminism.
The radical nature of Mill’s call for women’s equality is often lost to us after over a century of protest and changing social attitudes. Yet the subordination of women to men when Mill was writing remains striking. Among other indicators of this subordination are the following: (1) British women had fewer grounds for divorce than men until 1923; (2) Husbands controlled their wives personal property (with the occasional exception of land) until the Married Women’s Property Acts of 1870 and 1882; (3) Children were the husband’s; (4) Rape was impossible within a marriage; and (5) Wives lacked crucial features of legal personhood, since the husband was taken as the representative of the family (thereby eliminating the need for women’s suffrage). This gives some indication of how disturbing and/or ridiculous the idea of a marriage between equals could appear to Victorians.
The object of the essay was to show “(t)hat the principle which regulates the existing social relations between the two sexes—the legal subordination of one sex to the other—is wrong in itself, and now one of the chief hindrances to human improvement; and that it ought to be replaced by a principle of perfect equality, admitting no power or privilege on the one side, nor disability on the other.” (CW, XXI.261). This shows how Mill appeals to both the patent injustice of contemporary familial arrangements and to the negative moral impact of those arrangements on the people within them. In particular, he discusses the ways in which the subordination of women negatively affects not only the women, but also the men and children in the family. This subordination stunts the moral and intellectual development of women by restricting their field of activities, pushing them either into self-sacrifice or into selfishness and pettiness. Men, alternatively, either become brutal through their relationships with women or turn away from projects of self-improvement to pursue the social “consideration” that women desire.
It is important to note that Mill’s concern for the status of women dovetails with the rest of his thought—it is not a disconnected issue. For example, his support for women’s equality was buttressed by associationism, which claims that minds are created by associative laws operating on experience. This implies that if we change the experiences and upbringing of women, then their minds will change. This enabled Mill to argue against those who tried to suggest that the subordination of women to men reflected a natural order that women were by nature incapable of equality with men. If many women were incapable of true friendship with noble men, says Mill, that is not a result of their natures, but of their faulty environments.
Another work that addresses issues of social and political concern is Mill’s Principles of Political Economy of 1848. The book went through numerous editions and served as the dominant British textbook in economics until being displaced by Alfred Marshall’s 1890 Principles of Economics. Mill intended the work as both a survey of contemporary economic thought (highlighting the theories of David Ricardo, but also including some contributions of his own on topics like international trade) and as an exploration of applications of economic ideas to social concerns. It was “not a book merely of abstract science, but also of application, and treated Political Economy not as a thing by itself, but as a fragment of a greater whole.” (CW, I.243). These two interests nicely divide the text into the first three more technical books on production, distribution, and exchange and the last two books, which address the influences of societal progress and of government on economic activity (and vice versa). The technical work is largely obsolete. Mill’s relating of economics and society, however, remains of great interest.
In particular, Mill shared concerns with others (e.g. Carlyle, Coleridge, Southey, etc.) about the moral impact of industrialization. Though many welcomed the material wealth produced by industrialization, there was a sense that those very cornerstones of British economic growth—the division of labor (including the increasing simplicity and repetitiveness of the work) and the growing size of factories and businesses—led to a spiritual and moral deadening.
Coleridge expressed this in his contrast of mere “civilization” with “cultivation”:
The permanency of the nation…and its progressiveness and personal freedom…depend on a continuing and progressive civilization. But civilization is itself but a mixed good, if not far more a corrupting influence, the hectic of disease, not the bloom of health, and a nation so distinguished more fitly to be called a varnished than a polished people, where this civilization is not grounded in cultivation, in the harmonious development of those qualities and faculties that characterize our humanity. We must be men in order to be citizens. (Coleridge 1839, 46).
“Civilization” expresses central features of modernization, including industrialism, cosmopolitanism, and increasing material wealth. But, for Coleridge, civilization needed to be subordinated to cultivation of our humanity (expressed in terms similar to those later found in On Liberty).
This concern for the moral impact of economic growth explains, among other things, his commitment to a brand of socialism. In an essay on the French historian Michelet, Mill praises the monastic associations of Italy and France after the reforms of St. Benedict: “Unlike the useless communities of contemplative ascetics in the East, they were diligent in tilling the earth and fabricating useful products; they knew and taught that temporal work may also be a spiritual exercise.” (CW, XX.240). It was the desire to transform temporal work into a spiritual and moral exercise that led Mill to favor socialist changes in the workplace.
In order to transform the workplace from a setting filled with antagonism into a “school of sympathy” that would enable workers to feel a part of something greater than themselves—thereby mitigating the rampant selfishness encouraged by industrial society—Mill recommends “industrial co-operatives.” Mill thought that these co-operatives had the advantage over communes or other socialist institutions because they were able to compete against traditional firms (his complaint against many other socialists is that they undervalued competition as a morally useful stimulus to activity). These co-operatives can take two forms: a profit-sharing system in which worker pay is tied to the success of the business or a worker co-operative in which workers share ownership of capital. The latter was preferable because it turned all the workers into entrepreneurs, calling upon many of the faculties that mere labor for pay left to atrophy.
Though Mill contended that laborers were generally unfit for socialism given their current level of education and development, he thought that modern industrial societies should take small steps towards fostering co-operatives. Included among these steps was the institution of limited partnerships. Up to Mill’s time, partners shared full liability for losses, including any personal property they owned—obviously a strong deterrent to the founding of worker co-operatives.
Mill’s recommendations for the economic organization of society, like his political and social policies, always paid careful attention to how institutions, laws, and practices impacted the intellectual, moral, and affective well-being of the individuals operating under or within them.
Mill’s criticism of traditional religious doctrines and institutions and his promotion of the “Religion of Humanity,” also depended largely on concerns about human cultivation and education. Though the Benthamite “philosophic radicals,” including Mill, took Christianity to be a particularly pernicious superstition that fostered indifference or hostility to human happiness (the keystone of utilitarian morality), Mill also thought that religion could potentially serve important ethical needs by supplying us with “ideal conceptions grander and more beautiful than we see realized in the prose of human life.” (CW, X.419). In so doing, religion elevates our feelings, cultivates sympathy with others, and imbues even our smallest activities with a sense of purpose.
The posthumously published three Essays on Religion (1874)—on “Nature,” the “Utility of Religion,” and “Theism”—criticized traditional religious views and formulated an alternative in the guise of the Religion of Humanity. Along with the criticism of religion’s moral effects that he shared with the Benthamites, Mill was also critical of the intellectual laziness that permitted belief in an omnipotent and benevolent God. He felt, following his father, that the world as we find it could not possibly have come from such a God given the evils rampant in it; either his power is limited or he is not wholly benevolent.
Beyond attacking arguments concerning the essence of God, Mill undermines a variety of arguments for his existence including all a priori arguments. He concludes that the only legitimate proof of God is an a posteriori and probabilistic argument from the design of the universe – the traditional argument (stemming from Aristotle) that complex features of the world, like the eye, are unlikely to have arisen by chance, hence there must be a designer. (Mill acknowledges the possibility that Darwin, in his 1859 The Origin of Species, has provided a wholly naturalistic explanation of such features, but he suggests that it is too early to judge of Darwin’s success).
Inspired by Comte, Mill finds an alternative to traditional religion in the Religion of Humanity, in which an idealized humanity becomes an object of reverence and the morally useful features of traditional religion are supposedly purified and accentuated. Humanity becomes an inspiration by being placed imaginatively within the drama of human history, which has a destination or point, namely the victory of good over evil. As Mill puts it, history should be seen as “the unfolding of a great epic or dramatic action,” which terminates “in the happiness or misery, the elevation or degradation, of the human race.” It is “an unremitting conflict between good and evil powers, of which every act done by any of us, insignificant as we are, forms one of the incidents.” (CW, XXI.244). As we begin to see ourselves as participants in this Manichean drama, as fighting alongside people like Socrates, Newton, and Jesus to secure the ultimate victory of good over evil, we become capable of greater sympathy, moral feeling, and an ennobled sense of the meaning of our own lives. The Religion of Humanity thereby acts as an instrument of human cultivation.
Mill’s intellect engaged with the world rather than fled from it. His was not an ivory tower philosophy, even when dealing with the most abstract of philosophical topics. His work is of enduring interest because it reflects how a fine mind struggled with and attempted to synthesize important intellectual and cultural movements. He stands at the intersections of conflicts between enlightenment and romanticism, liberalism and conservatism, and historicism and rationalism. In each case, as someone interested in conversation rather than pronouncement, he makes sincere efforts to move beyond polemic into sustained and thoughtful analysis. That analysis produced challenging answers to problems that still remain. Whether or not one agrees with his answers, Mill serves as a model for thinking about human problems in a serious and civilized way.
* = works of note.
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