Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Minucius Felix (c. 2nd and 3rd cn. C.E.)

Minucius Felix was a Roman advocate, rhetorician, and Christian apologist. Like Lactantius, Minucius was a convert to Christianity. His only known work, the dialogue Octavius, is one of the earliest examples of Latin apologetics; it is an attack upon paganism and skepticism, and a defense of early Christianity as it was known in the Roman world. Minucius is of interest not only to theologians and Church historians, but also to those with an interest in philosophy and rhetoric. Unlike other Latin apologists of the period, such as Tertullian, who asserted credo quia ineptum (I believe because [it is] absurd) (De Carne Christi 5.4), and who was openly hostile to speculative philosophy, Minucius attempted to establish at least the rational possibility of the Christian faith. The rhetoric found within the Octavius can be considered Ciceronian, having elements of the six-part speech (exordium, narration, partition, confirmation, refutation, and conclusion). This text represents an important stage in the evolution of rhetoric from a primarily oral, forensic, and political art, to a literary art.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Circumstance
  2. The Dialogue
    1. Questions Concerning the Text
    2. The Debate
  3. Conclusion
  4. References and Further Reading

1. Life and Circumstance

Minucius lived in the late 2nd and early 3rd centuries C.E., although the exact dates of his birth and death are unknown. Most of what we know about him comes from his only surviving work, the Octavius. His first name is revealed as Marcus (III.1), and as a Roman advocate, he would “undertake the defense and protection of cases of sacrilege or incest or even murders” (XXVIII.3) within the basilica. He was once a pagan, and “after careful experience of either way of life,” had “repudiated the one and approved of the other” (V.1).

Other sources for his life include Lactantius (240-320), the Professor of Latin Rhetoric at Nicomedia, who writes of Minucius, “among those who are known to me, Minucius Felix was not of mean repute among the case-pleaders of the place. His book, which has the title of Octavius, shows how suitable a defender of truth he could have been if he had devoted himself entirely to that pursuit” (Div. Inst. V.I). St. Jerome (342-420) mentions the Octavius briefly in the De Viris Illustribus and adds that Minucius also wrote a De fato (the fate), although this text has never been found. According to Jerome, Minucius practiced his profession in Rome (LVIII). Many historians assume that he was originally of African origin; his name is found on a dedication at Carthage, and on a column at Tebessa (DeLabriolle 110). However, other men shared his name, so it is unclear if these inscriptions actually refer to the author of the Octavius. In his dialogue, Minucius displays an antipathy towards the Roman policy of expansion: “all that the Romans hold, occupy, and possess is the spoil of outrage” (XXV.5), which may suggest he came to Rome from the provinces, but this could simply be a rhetorical commonplace. Curiously, there is no mention of Minucius in Eusebius’ (260-340) History of the Church, although there are many passages in this tome regarding his contemporary Tertullian (c. 160-230).

From the dialogue, we can gather that Minucius was a highly educated man, with an intimate understanding of ancient authors such as Virgil, Ovid, Nepos, Thallus and Diodorus. His comments on these ancient authors allow historians to consider him a doxographer, or one who enumerates and comments upon texts from earlier periods. His rhetorical Latin is “grand” (gravis) and refined, and his descriptions vivid and compelling. He is careful to avoid slipping into the swollen or drifting style argued against in the Rhetorica ad Herrenium (see book IV). Aside from his religion, there is evidence from the dialogue that Minucius may have been a Stoic prior to his conversion. His passages on the “divine mind,” or the intelligence behind all creation, attest to this (XIX.9-10) (see below).

The Octavius can be understood as an attack against the skepticism of the New Academy and of Pyrrhonism, and an attempt to reconcile nascent Christianity with Stoic philosophy and Roman civic life. But while Minucius rejects skepticism and embraces Stoicism, on first inspection he seems to adhere to the opinion of Tertullian;

What indeed has Athens to do with Jerusalem? What concord is there between the Academy and the Church? What between heretics and Christians? Our instruction comes from the “porch of Solomon” who had himself taught that “the Lord should be sought in simplicity of heart.” Away with all attempts to produce a mottled Christianity of Stoic, Platonic, and dialectic composition! We want no curious disputation after possessing Christ Jesus, no inquisition after enjoying the Gospel (De praescriptione haereticorum 7).

In defending the intellect, Minucius is careful not to assert the primacy of philosophy, for that would be to declare reason above revelation. In this way, he is a member of what Etienne Gilson calls the “Tertullian Family”; he stresses the limitations of the intellect, but not the negation of it (History 48). The Octavius may have been intended to persuade intellectual Romans to reject both paganism and skepticism, and to embrace the new religion. Unlike Tertullian’s dogmatic treatises, the dialogue is an elegant balancing act, careful to stress the fundamental precepts of Christianity, while expressing the practical and ethical value of Stoicism and criticizing the excesses of speculative philosophy. It has been said that Minucius Felix was the only Anti-Nicene father to present both the Christian and pagan side of the question (History 46).

2. The Dialogue

a. Questions Concerning the Text

Modern translations of the Octavius come from a 9th century manuscript in the Biblioteque Nationale in Paris which contains the seven books of Arnobius’ (284-305) Adversus Nationes along with an 8th book—the Octavius. For centuries, scholars have attempted to assign a firm date of composition to the dialogue. The central question has always been, is the Octavius anterior to the Apologeticus of Tertullian? Stylistically, Minucius’ Latin is closer to the classical Latin of Tacitus (54-117) than the excursive Latin of Tertullian, with its “complexity and strangeness” and “unnatural combinations of word and syntax” (Glover 12). Tertullian’s Apologeticus displays a proliferation of compound-complex sentences, intervening phrases and clauses, and awkward constructions. Take for example XXXVIII.4: Aeque spectaculus vestris in tantum renuntiamus in quantum originibus eorum, quas scimus de superstitione conceptas, cum et ipsis rebus, de quibus transiguntur, praetersumus. (Your public games, we renounce too, as heartily as we do their origins; we know these origins lie in superstition; we leave on one side matters with which they are concerned). Minucius’ style is generally more declarative and straightforward, and it is similar to other African writers of the period, such as Frontonius, Flaurus, and Apuleius (DeLabriolle 110).

Unlike the Apologeticus, which takes the form of a protest directed at the magistrates of the Roman Empire, the Octavius is a dialogue featuring individuals whom historians believe may have actually lived in the empire. This use of a dialogue is a Ciceronian technique (although certainly not exclusive to Cicero), and can be seen in De Oratore. Among Christian writers of the period, the dialogue form can also be seen in Ariston of Pella, Justin Martyr, and Caius of Rome (DeLabriolle 127). The Octavius is stylistically closer to the works of previous generations; it is markedly different than the texts written by Christian apologists in the 2nd and 3rd centuries. Nevertheless, the question of style is still debated among historians of Latin and scholars of early apologetics. Among the scholars that argue for the priority of the Octavius is O. Bardenhewer who writes, “It is Tertullian who made use of Minucius, and not Minucius who used the writings of Tertullian” (71).

A clue to the date of the dialogue may be found within Minucius’ statement “if you think of earthly dominions, which surely have analogies to heaven. When has joint monarchy ever started in good faith, or ended without bloodshed?” (XVIII.6). This is perhaps a subtle allusion to the quarrel between the Antonine emperors Caracalla (188-217) and his brother Publius Septimius Geta (189-211), who ruled jointly before the Caracalla assassinated his brother in a fit of rage. The death of Geta was a shocking incident in the history of Rome, and it was surely on the mind of anyone writing during the period. Tertullian’s Scorpiace written in 213 uses the allusion of Cain and Abel to illustrate the significance of this imperial fratricide. Minucius could not risk referring to the event directly, he had to instead use the illustration of the perils of joint rule as a rhetorical commonplace.

Perhaps the strongest argument for the priority of the Apologeticus can be found in Tertullian’s assertion, “[I]f it comes to this that men who were called Romans are found to be enemies, why are we, who are thought to be enemies, denied the name of Romans?” (XXXVI.1). In 212, the Emperor Caracalla passed an edict known as the Constitutio Antoniniana, granting universal citizenship to all free Romans within the many provinces of the Empire. Prior to this, only men living within the Italian peninsula were considered citizens. Ostensibly, the edict’s goal was to extend the benefits of citizenship to all qualified individuals, but it also had the effect of increasing tax revenues and military conscription. The edict is important in that while Tertullian complains of Christians lacking citizenship (at least those within the African provinces), Minucius ignores the issue altogether. Perhaps this is because the citizenship issue had already been settled by the time Minucius resolved to write his dialogue. So while the Octavius appears to be stylistically older than the Apologeticus, it is quite possible that it was composed no earlier than 212, following both the death of Geta, and the enactment of the Constitutio Antoniniana.

St. Cyprian’s Quod idola non dii sint (that idols are not gods), written around 257-8, draws from the Octavius; an obvious parallel can be seen in chapter 9 of Cyprian’s work in which the author declares, “this One cannot be seen, He is too bright to see; cannot be comprehended, He is too pure to grasp” (356), and in the Octavius, “God cannot be seen—he is too bright for sight; nor measured—for he is beyond all sense, infinite, measureless, his dimensions known to himself alone” (XVIII.7). A more telling approximation can be found in the passages of the idola in which Cyprian asserts that the gods of the Romans are merely deified men of antiquity, “Romulus was made a god when Proculus committed perjury” (351). And in a passage from the Octavius, Minucius writes,

It is a waste of time to go through all one by one, and to trace the whole family line; the mortality which we have proved in the case of their first parents has descended to the rest by order of succession. But perhaps you [Caecilius] imagine that men become gods after death; Romulus was made a god by the false oath of Proculus (XXI.9).

Since Lactantius mentions Minucius, and Cyprian used the Octavius as a source for the idola, the text must be no later than the middle of the 3rd century. Conversely, most scholars assume that the Apologeticus was composed in 197. Another possibility is that both the Octavius and the Apologeticus draw from an earlier text that has been lost, but this hypothesis has never been proven.

Some histories of rhetoric maintain that Minucius used the Apologeticus as a template, but the differences between the texts counterbalance the similarities. Tertullian’s work can be classified under the blanket appellation literary rhetoric; his letters were usually intended for a single reader, oftentimes a Roman political leader such as Scapula (proconsul of Africa) or a theological adversary such as Praxeas. These works were not forensic exercises or speeches intended for large audiences; they were never intended to be performed. In the case of the Apologeticus we must consider that the advent of Christianity into the Roman Empire placed new obligations and prerogatives upon the rhetorician. As George Kennedy points out, “[e]xercises in declamation often lost touch with contemporary realities, a fact lamented by Quintilian, Tacitus, and others” (129). The new religion was one such “contemporary reality,” and it required, for its defense the evolving art of apologetics, first seen in Justin Martyr’s (100-165) Dialogue With Trypho the Jew. Nevertheless, apologetics depends greatly upon rhetoric, and Christians were obligated to learn the art, even though Tertullian forbade them from ever teaching it (On Idolatry 10).

So if we conclude that the texts are contra-distinct, the central question concerns the type or genre of oratory the Octavius represents. It is not an argument directed at a Roman official, or even a work intended to encourage persecuted Christians (exhortation). It contains elements of apologetics, yet retains more of a classical rhetorical structure; it stands somewhere between Cicero and Tertullian in form. Within the dialogue is a forensic debate in which Octavius Januarius defends his faith against the prosecutor Caecilius, with Minucius acting as arbiter. Arbesmann and others suggest that this debate is in the form of a controversia (317), a rhetorical exercise popular in the first century. In this exercise (described by Seneca the Elder), the instructor creates a special case for his students to build their arguments around. The teacher may posit a dilemma in which application of a particular law is difficult due to the circumstances involved; for instance, a woman who is raped has the choice of ordering the execution of her assailant or marrying him. But then it is discovered that the same man has raped two women in one night; one demands his death, the other asks him to marry her. For the Octavius to be a controversia it would have to be both fictional and hypothetical, however there is no evidence that it is either. Because there is a central issue (the “error” of paganism as opposed to the “truth” of Christian revelation), the dialogue can be considered an apology with a kind of scholastic dialectic which dictates its form, a pro et contra. All such dialectics have a deliberative character. Caecilius acts as the spokesman for the traditional Roman religion, and Octavius performs the same function for Christianity. The arguments follow and a conclusion is ultimately reached.

So while the text has forensic (judicial) characteristics, its genre can be considered deliberative in the Ciceronian sense, as the issue of expediency is central; should the honorable Roman continue to follow “the thick darkness of vulgar ignorance,” risking a wreck upon “stones, however carved and anointed and garlanded they may be,” i.e. the pagan tradition with its many eloquent champions, or should he turn to the “broad daylight” (II.1) of the new religion? The Octavius is an argument intended for Roman ears, not Christian, and as Cicero remarks, in any deliberative endeavor, the orator must know “the character of the community” (De Oratore II.337). As Gilson points out, Octavius avoids the “blunt dogmatism of Christian faith, something unpalatable to the cultured pagan mind” (46). This partially explains the curious absence of Christology within the text; the birth, death, and resurrection of Jesus are not mentioned. As DeLabriolle indicates, “amongst the apologists of the IInd century, Aristides, St. Justin and Tertullian are the only ones who have uttered the name of Jesus Christ” (117). Despite this, some have suggested that Minucius is somehow more orthodox than Tertullian, since the latter ultimately fell in with the Montanists (Forster 260). But his orthodoxy cannot be attested to, since he is intentionally vague on specific doctrinal matters. It would be counterproductive to swamp potential converts with the esoteric aspects of Christianity at the outset; Minucius instead presents and defends the exoteric image of the church. And while drawing heavily from ancient authors and historical events, Minucius never once uses scripture as an illustration of a point or concept.

b. The Debate

The dialogue opens with Minucius’ recollections of his friendship to the recently deceased Octavius. The dead man was the “sole confident” of his affections, and his “partner in wanderings from the truth” (I.4-5). The language and circumstance is almost identical to that of Cicero in book 3 of De Oratore, as Cicero describes his “bitter recollection” that has “revived old feelings of distress and grief in [his] heart,” (III.1-2) when he contemplates the death of fellow intellectual Lucius Crassus. In both instances, the occasion brings forth an opportunity to launch into a deliberative dialogue. As in Plato’s Phaedrus, the debate takes place in the countryside, away from the noise and distraction of urban life. The setting is Ostia, a pleasant resort town less than twenty miles from Rome, known for its baths. Minucius, Octavius Januarius, and Caecilius have come to the resort to obtain “relief from judicial duties” (II.3). While walking along the shore, the men encounter an image of Serapsis, a Graeco-Egyptian god. Caecilius blows a kiss to the god, which is immediately followed by Octavius’ chastisement of Minucius, that no man has the right to leave his friend in the “thick darkness of vulgar ignorance” (III.1). It is Octavius’ position that any honorable Roman has the obligation to encourage his friends to accept the truth of Christianity.

An interesting section follows, in which the men proceed down the beach and see a group of boys skipping rocks in the ocean. It is a contest in which the boy who wins is the one whose shard travels the farthest out into the sea, and it is perhaps a metaphor for the power of argument within the contest of rhetoric. The scene awakens within Caecilius the desire to answer Octavius’ indirect accusation. He suggests a debate in which Minucius is to act as arbiter, and as a guarantee of Minucius’ impartiality, Caecilius commands him to “take your seat as a novice, ignorant as it were of either side of the case” (V.1-2).

Caecilius’ prooemium is direct and forthright; he believes he is defending that which is honorable (not only the Roman religion, but the philosophy of Skepticism), and makes no attempt at winning the audience’s favor. This is consistent with book one of the Rhetorica ad Herrenium, in which a direct opening (prooemium) should be used instead of a subtle opening (ephodos) if the speaker’s (or writer’s) cause is honorable and his position confident (I.IV.5-8). A closer analysis of his opening reveals that his Latin is “rounded,” as the critical concept (informandus est animus) is carried structurally in the middle, and subordinate ideas are handled with adversative, causal, and relative clauses (O’Connor 167). It is a stylistic pattern that will be repeated throughout his speech. Caecilius declares that everyone “must feel indignant and annoyed that certain persons—persons untrained in study, uninitiated in letters … should come to fixed conclusions upon the universe” (V.4). The ad hominem charge that Christians, traditionally members of the Roman lower classes, and with little education, are in no position to assert their position on theological matters is not original; it can be seen in Tertullian’s Apologeticus as well. Caecilius follows this with the statement: Sufficient be it for our happiness, and sufficient for our wisdom if, according to the ancient oracle of the wise men, we learn closer acquaintance with our own selves. But seeing that with mad and fruitless toil we overstep the limits of our humble intelligence, and from our earth-bound level seek, with audacious eagerness, to scale heaven itself and the stars of heaven, let us at least not aggravate our error by vain and terrifying imaginations (V.5-6).

This passage is important on a number of levels: the reference to the Oracle of Delphi and the ancient maxim “know thyself,” display Caecilius’ sympathy for the “New Academy,” the movement of Platonic philosophy into the regions of skepticism. This also sounds very similar to the passage in De Natura Deorum, “[a]nd until this issue is decided, mankind must continue to labor under the profoundest uncertainty, and to be in ignorance about matters of the highest moment” (I.3).

Caecilius continues his speech with a particularly poetic and vivid illustration of the fortuitous and capricious nature of the physical world; natural disasters destroy the innocent as well as the guilty, and the harvest is obliterated by violent squalls and suffocating droughts. If divine intelligence and wisdom ruled the world, we would not see so much injustice in the human realm. Camillus would not have been sent into exile, Socrates would never have been forced to drink hemlock, and the tyrants Phalaris and Dionysius “would never have deserved a throne” (V.12). The proposition or partitio is then introduced, “[C]um igitur aut fortuna caeca aut incerta natura sit“, and the Latin here is a little unclear; it should probably read, “[S]eeing then that either blind fortune or uncertain nature” are the two possibilities open to us, we should “accept the teaching of our elders as the priest of truth” (VI.1). Caecilius feels “since everything evades man’s grasp, he ought to cling with all the more tenacious energy to those fixed points which are open to him” (DeLabriolle 112). The Romans can judge their efforts at piety simply by the results given to them: Rome has enjoyed hundreds of years of prosperity and expansion under the pagan gods, even as it has absorbed other religions and deities from people like the Gauls, Syrians, and Taurians. Military leaders have seen their successes and failures depend upon the favor of the gods; Brennus was defeated at the river Allia in 390 B.C. because of his “contempt for the auspices” (VII.4). Marcus Crassus dared to attack the Parthians after ignoring the imprecations of the Furies (VIII.5), and was summarily routed. Even those that have claimed the supremacy of their god over the Roman pantheon, the Jews for instance, have ended up in captivity to Rome. As Gilson remarks, “had not these gods led to world leadership? No doctrine could be certain enough to justify national apostasy” (History 46). Within this section, Caecilius uses rhetorical techniques such as preterition and paralipsis to emphasize that he argues from common sense and communal knowledge; “[M]ulta praetereo consulto” (Much I purposely pass over) (X.1), “[s]ed omitto communia (things however common to all I pass over) (XII.2), and finally, “[m]ulta ad haec subpetunt, ni festinat oratio” (much might be added on this subject) (XI.5).

Caecilius then turns his attention towards specific tenets of the Christian religion. What if the body has gone to pieces? Will it be resurrected this way? When Christians suffer in pyres or on crosses, why does their god refuse to help them? Their god cannot attend to particulars because he is preoccupied with the whole, and cannot attend to the whole because he is preoccupied with particulars (X.5). If the Christians dare to philosophize, they would do well to follow the maxim of Socrates, “that which is above us does not concern us,” an attitude from which “flowed the guarded skepticism of Arcesilas, and later of Carneades” (XIII.1-3). Arcesilas was one of the first philosophers to teach the suspension of judgment (epokhé) that leads to ataraxía (freedom from worry). This philosophy would be expanded by Sextus Empiricus in the late 3rd century in his Outlines of Pyrrhonism (see below).

In his conclusion, Caecilius returns to the central argument of his speech, that “things that are doubtful, as they are, should be left in doubt” (XIV.5). DeLabriolle describes Caecilius as ” an admirable representative of those lettered pagans who were very skeptical as regards the foundation of things, but who from civic pietas and from respect for the mos majorum, thought it their duty to energetically defend the religion of tradition” (113). When Caecilius begins to brag and insult Octavius, Minucius intervenes and tells him it is truth (veritati), not glory (laudi) they are striving for (XIV.3). This is further evidence of the deliberative nature of the dialogue; it is not a forensic contest or a flowery debate, but a search for truth. In any debate, one can dazzle an audience with a virtuosic display and thus win honors for himself, and some have argued that this became the principle interest of orators during the Imperial age (Dunn 4). But Minucius obviously expects more from rhetoric. He furthers his criticism of the art by saying, “an audience, as everyone knows , is so easily swayed. Fascination of words distracts them from attention to facts … forgetting that the incredible contains an element of truth, and probability an element of falsehood” (XIV.4). This at once sets the stage for a new philosophy, one that eschews Skepticism, and it serves as a transition and introduction to the speech of Octavius. It is he who will stress the incredible as true.

After declaring the need to take the verity of all arguments into consideration, Minucius then moves beyond criticism of rhetoric to comment on Skepticism directly, “[a]ccordingly we must take good care not to become victims of a dislike of all arguments whatsoever” (XIV). We cannot take the position of the Pyrrhonists and say:

while the dogmatizer posits the matter of his dogma as substantial truth, the skeptic enunciates his formulae so that they are virtually cancelled by themselves, he should not be said to dogmatize his enunciation of them. And most important of all, in his enunciation of these formulae he states what appears to himself and announces his own impression in an undogmatic way, without making any positive assertion regarding the external realities (Outlines 14-15).

According to the Pyrrhonists, only the dogmatist asserts the absolute “truth” of any given proposition, the skeptic merely enunciates what he sees. Minucius feels that to abstain from asserting anything either positive or negative is to display a contempt for argument, and therefore a contempt for truth. One who does not believe in truth cannot take revelation seriously, and this attitude thus undermines the very foundations of Christianity. But this goes beyond religion, as Sextus Empiricus includes the Epicureans and Stoics among the “dogmatists” he rejects (3). If we accept that Pyrrhonism represents the evolution of Skepticism from the New Academy of Carneades (214-129 B.C.) to a new “Roman” equivalent, in that they find a common bond in the primacy of akatalêpsia (also see Hakinson 50) and ataraxía, we can see the underlying conflict in the Octavius transcends religious issues. How can the Roman advocate argue from a position of logos (reason) if everything is uncertain? How can the Stoic or Epicurean extol the virtues of his philosophy if equally persuasive arguments exist to the contrary? How can anyone be certain that what he or she learns is of value?

Caecilius immediately objects to Minucius’ interference, accusing him of attempting to “break the force of [his] pleading by interpolating this weighty subject for debate; it is for Octavius to deal with my several points” (XV.1). Octavius finally responds with his exordium, by doing two things: to speak of himself to win the audience’s sympathy, and to speak of his adversary. He requests the assistance of the audience to “turn the floodgates of truth upon the stains of blackening calumny” (XVI.1). As in an enthymeme, the orator must supply the necessary premises and the audience must reach the intended conclusion. According to Octavius, Caecilius is a man “who does not know the right way, when the road happens to fork off in several directions; and not knowing the way, he doubts and hesitates” (XVI.3). Such a man does not know the implications of such a vacillating world-view. He accuses Caecilius of declaring that the gods cannot be said to exist one moment, and then insisting that they must be worshipped the next.

Octavius then offers his own partitio, “I will refute and disprove his inconsistent arguments by proving and establishing a single truth; setting him free from all further occasion for doubt and wandering” (XVI.4). What follows is a direct appeal to the Roman ideal of expediency and practical wisdom in the form of an argument by analogy, “without careful investigation of the nature of deity, you cannot know that of man; just as you cannot manage the civic affairs successfully without some knowledge of the wider world-society of men” (XVII.2). There is a relationship between theology and humanity, a relationship that must be understood by anyone attempting wise governance of mankind.

The first point Octavius tackles is that of intelligent design, or the divine intention behind creation. The regularity in the motion of the heavens, the waxing and waning moon, the blooming of flowers, all of these things attest to God’s involvement in nature. There is a similar passage in Cicero’s De Natura Deorum:

There are however other philosophers, and those of eminence and note, who believe that the whole world is ruled and governed by divine intelligence and reason … the weather and the seasons and the changes of the atmosphere by which all products of the soil are ripened and matured are the gift of the immortal gods to the human race (I.4-5).

But of greater importance, is Cicero’s adumbration that Carneades argued against this position persuasively, and this brings us back to the argument between Caecilius and Octavius.

Octavius proceeds from an enumeration of the products of the divine intelligence to the nature of God himself. His statements “God cannot be seen—he is too bright for sight; nor measured—for he is beyond all sense, infinite, measureless, his dimensions known to himself alone” (XVIII.7), and “the majesty of God is the despair of the understanding” (XIX.14) foreshadow negative theology of the Arians and Cappadocians. Gregory of Nyssa (d.385), for instance, claimed that because time implies measurement, God is therefore “out of time … and the deity is of course incommensurable” (Mortley 129). This via negativa (negative way) would later find its fullest expression in the works of 5th century theologian Dionysius the Pseudo-Areopagite. Octavius’ admonition “[S]eek not a name for God: God is his name. Terms are needed when individuals have to be distinguished from the mass” (XVIII.10), may find some foundation in certain passages of scripture, such as Exodus 3:14, in which God says to Moses “I am who am,” and Malachi 3:6, “I the Lord change not,” but there are no direct examples of Minucius’ exegesis, so this is only speculation. In his Against Eunomius Gregory takes up the issue of “names” for God. When the theologian says, “God is good,” or “God is immutable,” he introduces a copula between God and another term (Pr.). This “isness of God remains undescribed. The ‘is’ of the copula refers to the being of God, and this is actually undefinable” (Mortley 180). To bolster his argument that God is infinite (and ultimately unknowable in a human sense), Minucius offers the supporting opinions of Xenophanes (who held God to be infinite) and Aristotle (who assigns a single power of intelligence behind creation).

Upon establishing his confirmatio, Minucius then moves into the refutatio. The gods and religious traditions of the Romans are products of an “ignorant tradition, charmed or captivated by its pet fables” (XX.2). And in an amazing bit of inconsistency, asks “[w]hy recall old wives’ tales of human beings changed into birds and beasts, or into trees and flowers? Had such things happened in the past, they would happen now; as they cannot happen now, they did not happen then” (XX.4). Such an argument could easily be used against the Christians.

As to the argument of collective wisdom, Octavius dismisses it as “[g]eneral insanity shield[ing] itself behind the multitude of the insane” (XXIII.10), an insanity promoted by the “fatal influence” of poets. It was right for Plato to exclude Homer from the ideal Republic, for “he above all others in his Iliad, though half in jest, gave gods a place in the affairs and doings of men” (XXIV.2-4). The Romans are vain in thinking such incestuous and fictitious beings somehow hold dominion over the affairs of humanity. And In the next section, Octavius counters Caecilius’ argument that the Christian god is oblivious to the suffering of his subjects. The success of the Jews depended upon their fidelity to the one God; when they deserted Him, they fell into captivity and misery. “That those who know not God deserve their tortures, as impious and unrighteous, none but an atheist doubts” (XXXV.4). And if one dares to say the Christians are a miserable lot, Octavius counters that they would prefer to despise wealth than hoard it, turning to the maxim: “[a]s on the highroad he who walks lightest walks with most ease” (XXXVI.6). The Stoic suffering of the persecuted Christians is evidence of their collective conviction that paradise awaits them following death. And in death, everyone is equal; “[a]re you of noble lineage? Proud of your ancestry? yet we are all born equal; virtue alone gives mark.” What good is it “to shine in purple and be squalid in mind” (XXXVII.10-11). The parallels between this attitude and Stoic philosophy are obvious. As the Emperor Marcus Aurelius (121-180) said in book II of his Meditations, “do the things external which fall upon thee distract thee?”

Octavius closes with a final attack on the philosophers he despises:

Let Socrates look to himself! Socrates, “the buffoon of Athens” (as Zeno called him), who confessed he knew nothing, though he boasted of the promptings of a deceiving demon; Arcesilas too, and Carneades, and Pyrrho, and even the whole host of the Academics, let them argue on! (XXXVIII.5-6).

This passage is as important for the names Octavius leaves off the list, as the names he puts on it. According to Octavius, Skepticism is the bastard child of Socrates, a child that has been nurtured by the New Academy, and is even now asserting its pernicious influence over Roman life. The Christians reject the attitude of these “high-brow” philosophers, as the faithful “do not preach great things, but we live by them” (XXXVIII.6). Philosophy is an idle and vain pursuit if it does not include the truth that comes from revelation, an idea that would characterize many of Tertullian’s theological disputations.

In his final comments, Octavius borrows a page from Caecilius’ handbook, and uses the first person plural to adopt a conciliatory tone, “Fruamur bono nostro et recti sententiam temperemus” (let us enjoy our good things, coordinate our sense of right) (XXXVIII.7).

Upon completion of the second speech, Caecilius declares Octavius to be the winner, but also claims a victory for himself, in that he has had his triumph over error. He understands the main issue to be one of providence, the same issue that is central to book one of Cicero’s De Natura Deorum. The skeptic denies providence, and therefore cannot enjoy the fullness of truth (alétheia).

3. Conclusion

The Octavius stands apart from Tertullian’s Apologeticus in that it is less dogmatic, more consistent with Roman sensibilities, and more eloquently expresses the difficult philosophical problems of the day. Gilson astutely points out, “Tertullian seems to have completely forgotten what reasons he had once had to be pagan. This is something which Minucius has never forgotten” (History 46). The dialogue illustrates many of the problems nascent Christianity faced during the Imperial era. Long before St. Augustine of Hippo (354-430) reconciled his faith with Neo-Platonism, the Latin fathers struggled with defining the boundaries between reason and revelation; Skepticism was always dangerously lurking in the corner. Minucius’ view is clear when he exclaims, “he [Octavius] disarmed ill-will by the very weapons which the philosophers use for their attack, and had set forth truth in a guise at once so easy and so attractive” (XXXIX.7). Rhetoric and logic are not to be discarded when defending the faith, but one must be careful not to assert the sovereignty of these worldly arts over the sublime truths of revelation.

4. References and Further Reading

  • Bardenhewer, Otto. Patrologie. Freiberg: Herder, 1901.
  • Barnes, Timothy David. Tertullian: A Historical and Literary Study. Oxford: Clarendon, 1971.
  • Boyes-Stones, G.R. Post-Hellenistic Philosophy: A Study of its Development From the Stoics to Origen. New York: Oxford, 2001.
  • Cicero, Marcus Tullius. De Natura Deorum & Academica. Trans. H. Rackham. London: Putnam, 1932.
  • Cicero, Marcus Tullius. De Inventione, De Optimo Genere Oratorum, Topica. Trans. H.M. Hubbell. London: William Heinemann LTD, 1968.
  • Cyprianus, Thascius Caecilius. Treatises. Trans. Roy J. Deferrari. New York: Catholic University Press, 1958.
  • DeLabriolle, Pierre. History of Literature of Christianity From Tertullian to Boethius. London: Kegan Paul, Trench, Trubner & Co., 1924.
  • Dunn, Geoffrey D. “Rhetorical Structure in Tertullian’s Ad Scaplam.” Vigilae Christiannae 56 (2002): 47-55.
  • Dunn, Geoffrey D. “Rhetoric and Tertullian’s De Virginibus Velandis.” Vigilae Christiannae 59 (2005): 1-30.
  • Empiricus, Sextus. Outlines of Pyrrhonism. Trans. R.G. Bury. New York: Promethius, 1990.
  • Eusebius. History of the Church From Christ to Constantine. Trans. G.A. Williamson. New York: Dorset, 1984.
  • Felix, Minucius. Octavius. Trans. Gerald H. Rendall. Cambridge: Harvard University, 2003.
  • Felix, Minucius. Octavius. Trans. Arbesmann, Rudolph. Washington, D.C.: Catholic University Press, 1962.
  • Forster, Roger, & Paul Marston. Reason & Faith. Eastbourne: Monarch Publications, 1980.
  • Gilson, Etienne. History of Christian Philosophy in the Middle Ages. London: Sheed & Ward, 1955.
  • Gilson, Etienne. Reason and Revelation in the Middles Ages. New York: Scribners, 1938.
  • Glover, T.R. Life and Letters in the Fourth Century. New York: Russell, 1968.
  • Hackinson, R.J. “Values, Objectivity, and Dialectic; The Skeptical Attack on Ethics: Its Methods, Aims, and Success.” Phronesis 39 (1993): 45-68.
  • Kennedy, George. Classical Rhetoric and Its Christian and Secular Tradition From Ancient to Modern Times. Chapel Hill: North Carolina, 1999.
  • Lactantius. The Divine Institutes. Trans. Sister Mary Francis McDonald. Washington D.C.: Catholic University of America Press, 1964.
  • Marias, Julian. Philosophy as Dramatic Theory. University Park: Penn State, 1971.
  • Mortley, Raoul. From Word to Silence: The Rise and Fall of Logos. Hanstein: Bonn, 1986.
  • O’Connor, Joseph. “The Conflict of Rhetoric in the ‘Octavius’ of Minucius Felix.” Classical Folia 30 (1976): 165-173.
  • Quintilian, Marcus Fabius. Institutio Oratorio. Trans. John Selby. Carbondale: Southern Illinois, 1987.
  • Tertullian, Septimius Florentis. Apologeticus & De Spectaculus. Trans. T.R. Glover. Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 2003.
  • Tertullian, Septimius Florentis. Adversus Praxean Liber. London: University of Edinburgh, 1948.
  • Tertullian, Septimius Florentis. The Writings of Tertullian II: Ante Nicene Christian Library Translations of the Writings of the Fathers Down to AD 325. Trans. Alexander Roberts.

Author Information

C. Francis Higgins
University of Louisiana Lafayette
U. S. A.

Last updated: September 30, 2007 | Originally published: