Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Miracles

The term “miracle” is used very broadly in ordinary language. A quick review of news stories may turn up reports such as that of a “Christmas Miracle,” by which the Texas gulf coast came to be blanketed with snow by a rare storm. We speak of miracle drugs, or of miracle babies, and some household products purport to be miraculous as well. Philosophical discussion of the miraculous, however, is confined to the use to which religion—and in particular, theistic religion—puts that conception. These philosophical discussions center around two overlapping issues.

The first of these issues is a conceptual one: What is a miracle? Controversy over the conception of a miracle focuses primarily on whether a miracle must be, in some sense, contrary to natural law. Must it, in particular, be a violation of natural law? Supposing that it must be, a second question arises, namely, whether the conception of such a violation is a coherent one.

Philosophers have also been concerned about what sort of observable criteria would allow us to identify an event as a miracle, particularly insofar as that means identifying it as a violation of natural law. How, for example, can we tell the difference between a case in which an event is a genuine violation—assuming that some sense can be made of this notion—and one that conforms to some natural law that is unknown to us? And given the occurrence of a genuine violation, how are we to determine whether it is due to divine agency, or whether it is nothing more than a spontaneous lapse in the natural order?

The second main issue is epistemological: Once we settle on what a miracle is, can we ever have good reason to believe that one has taken place? This question is generally connected with the problem of whether testimony, such as that provided by scriptural sources, can ever give us adequate reason to believe that a miracle has occurred.

Table of Contents

  1. The Definition of “Miracle”
  2. Miracles and Worldview
  3. The Credibility of Witnesses
  4. Hume’s Argument
  5. Problems With Hume’s Argument
    1. Does Hume’s Argument Beg the Question?
  6. Conceptual Difficulties I: The Logical Impossibility of a Violation
    1. Violations as Nonrepeatable Counterinstances to Natural Law
    2. Miracles as Outside the Scope of Natural Laws
  7. Conceptual Difficulties II: Identifying Miracles
  8. Supernatural Causes, Supernatural Explanation
  9. Coincidence Miracles
  10. Miracle as Basic Action
  11. Wittgenstein: Miracle as Gesture
  12. References and Further Reading

1. The Definition of “Miracle”

In sketching out a brief philosophical discussion of miracles, it would be desirable to begin with a definition of “miracle;” unfortunately, part of the controversy in regard to miracles is over just what is involved in a proper conception of the miraculous. As a rough beginning, however, we might observe that the term is from the Latin miraculum, which is derived from mirari, to wonder; thus the most general characterization of a miracle is as an event that provokes wonder. As such, it must be in some way extraordinary, unusual, or contrary to our expectations. Disagreement arises, however, as to what makes a miracle something worth wondering about. In what sense must a miracle be extraordinary? One of the earliest accounts is given by St. Augustine, who held (City of God, XXI.8.2) that a miracle is not contrary to nature, but only to our knowledge of nature; miracles are made possible by hidden potentialities in nature that are placed there by God. In Summa Contra Gentiles III:101, St. Thomas Aquinas, expanding upon Augustine’s conception, said that a miracle must go beyond the order usually observed in nature, though he insisted that a miracle is not contrary to nature in any absolute sense, since it is in the nature of all created things to be responsive to God’s will.

In his Enquiry Concerning Human Understanding, David Hume offered two definitions of “miracle;” first, as a violation of natural law (Enquiries p. 114); shortly afterward he offers a more complex definition when he says that a miracle is “a transgression of a law of nature by a particular volition of the Deity, or by the interposition of some invisible agent” (Enquiries, p. 115n). This second definition offers two important criteria that an event must satisfy in order to qualify as a miracle: It must be a violation of natural law, but this by itself is not enough; a miracle must also be an expression of the divine will. This means that a miracle must express divine agency; if we have no reason to think that an event is something done by God, we will have no reason to call it a miracle.

More recently, the idea that a miracle must be defined in terms of natural law has come under attack. R.F. Holland (1965) has argued that a miracle may be consistent with natural law, since a religiously significant coincidence may qualify as miraculous, even though we fully understand the causes that brought it about. Accounts of the miraculous that distance themselves from the requirement that a miracle be in some way contrary to the order of nature, in favor of a focus on their significance to human life, might be said to emphasize their nature as signs; indeed the term semeion, “sign,” is one of the terms used in the New Testament to describe miraculous events.

2. Miracles and Worldview

The outcome of any discussion of miracles seems to depend greatly on our worldview. The usual theistic view of the world is one that presumes the existence of an omnipotent God who, while transcending nature, is nevertheless able to act, or to express his will, within the natural world. Clearly belief in miracles is already plausible if our enquiry may presume this view of things.

The usual way of making this out might be described as supernaturalistic. Those who would defend supernaturalism sometimes do this through a commitment to an ontology of entities that exist in some sense outside of nature, where by “nature” is meant the totality of things that can be known by means of observation and experiment, or more generally, through the methods proper to the natural sciences.

Defenses of supernaturalism may also take a methodological turn by insisting that the natural sciences are incapable of revealing the totality of all that there is. While supernaturalists typically hold that God reveals his nature in part through observable phenomena (as for example in miracles, or more generally, in the order of nature), as we shall understand it here, methodological supernaturalism is committed as well to the view that our knowledge of God must be supplemented by revelation. Revelatory sources for our knowledge of God might, for example, include some form of a priori knowledge, supersensory religious experience, or a direct communication by God of information that would not otherwise be available to us. Knowledge of God that is passed down in scripture, such as the Bible or the Qur’an, is generally conceived by theists to have a revelatory character.

Supernaturalistic accounts of the miraculous very commonly make reference to supernatural causes, which are thought to play a useful role in the construction of supernatural explanations. However, as we will see in sections 10 and 11, belief in miracles does not obviously commit one to belief in supernatural causes or the efficacy of supernatural explanations.

In contrast to supernaturalism, ontological naturalism denies the existence of anything beyond nature; methodological naturalism holds that observation and experiment—or generally speaking, the methods of the empirical sciences—are sufficient to provide us with all of the knowledge that it is possible for us to have. Naturalism is sometimes further characterized as holding that nature is uniform, which is to say that all events in nature conform to generalizations (e.g. laws) which can be verified by means of observation. Naturalists do commonly hold this view—confidence in the uniformity of nature is an important part of the scientific enterprise—but strictly speaking this represents an additional metaphysical commitment regarding the nature of the universe and its susceptibility to human understanding. If nature turns out not to be fully lawlike, this would not require the rejection of naturalism. A failure of uniformity, or what a believer in miracles might refer to as a violation of natural law, would imply only that there are limits to our ability to understand and predict natural phenomena. However, the naturalist is committed to denying the legitimacy of any attempt to explain a natural phenomenon by appeal to the supernatural. Naturalism denies the existence of supernatural entities and denies as well the claim that revelation is capable of providing us with genuine knowledge. Where the supernaturalistic worldview is quite open to the possibility of miracles, naturalism is much less sympathetic, and one might argue that the tenets of naturalism rule out the possibility of miracles altogether; see Lewis (1947:Ch. 1), Martin (1992:192) and Davis (1999:131).

Much, of course, depends on how we conceive of miracles, and on what we take their significance to be. One concern we might have with the miraculous would be an apologetic one. By “apologetic” here is meant a defense of the rationality of belief in God. Historically, apologists have pointed to the occurrence of miracles as evidence for theism, which is to say that they have held that scriptural reports of miracles, such as those given in the Bible, provide grounds for belief in God. While this argument is not as popular now as it was in the 18th century, the modern conception of the miraculous has been strongly influenced by this apologetic interest. Such an interest puts important constraints on an account of miracles. If we wish to point to a miracle as supporting belief in a supernatural deity, obviously we cannot begin by assuming the supernaturalistic worldview; this would beg the question. If we are trying to persuade a skeptic of God’s existence, we are trying to demonstrate to him that there is something beyond or transcending nature, and he will demand to be persuaded on his own terms; we must make use of no assumptions beyond those that are already acknowledged by the naturalistic worldview.

Because the history of modern thought regarding miracles has been strongly influenced by apologetic interests, the emphasis of this entry will be on the apologetic conception of the miraculous—that is, on the concept of miracle as it has been invoked by those who would point to the reports of miracles in scripture as establishing the existence of a supernatural God. It is important to bear in mind, however, that any difficulty associated with this apologetic appeal to miracles does not automatically militate against the reasonableness of belief in miracles generally. A successful criticism of the apologetic appeal will show at most that a warranted belief in miracles depends on our having independent reasons for rejecting naturalism; again, see Lewis (1947:11).

3. The Credibility of Witnesses

A major concern with the rationality of belief in miracles is with whether we can be justified in believing that a miracle has occurred on the basis of testimony. To determine whether the report of a miracle is credible, we need to consider the reliability of the source. Suppose subject S reports some state of affairs (or event) E. Are S’s reports generally true? Clearly if she is known to lie, or to utter falsehoods as jokes, we should be reluctant to believe her. Also, if she has any special interest in getting us to believe that E has occurred—if, for example, she stands to benefit financially—this would give us reason for skepticism. It is also possible that S may be reporting a falsehood without intending to do so; she may sincerely believe that E occurred even though it did not, or her report may be subject to unconscious exaggeration or distortion. Aside from the possibility that she may be influenced by some tangible self-interest, such as a financial one, her report may also be influenced by emotional factors—by her fears, perhaps, or by wishful thinking. We should also consider whether other reliable and independent witnesses are available to corroborate her report.

We must also ask whether S is herself a witness to E, or is passing on information that was reported to her. If she witnessed the event personally, we may ask a number of questions about her observational powers and the physical circumstances of her observation. There are quite a few things that can go wrong here; for example, S may sincerely report an event as she believed it to occur, but in fact her report is based on a misperception. Thus she may report having seen a man walk across the surface of a lake; this may be her understanding of what happened, when in fact he was walking alongside the lake or on a sand bar. If it was dark, and the weather was bad, this would have made it difficult for S to have a good view of what was happening. And of course we should not neglect the influence of S’s own attitudes on how she interprets what she sees; if she is already inclined to think of the man she reports as walking on water as being someone who is capable of performing such an extraordinary feat, this may color how she understands what she has seen. By the same token, if we are already inclined to agree with her about this person’s remarkable abilities, we will be all the more likely to believe her report.

If S is merely passing on the testimony of someone else to the occurrence of E, we may question whether she has properly understood what she was told. She may not be repeating the testimony exactly as it was given to her. And here, too, her own biases may color her understanding of the report. The possibility of distortions entering into testimony grows with each re-telling of the story.

It will be fruitful to consider these elements in evaluating the strength of scriptural testimony to the miracles ascribed to Jesus. The reports of these miracles come from the four gospel accounts. Some of these accounts seem to have borrowed from others, or to have been influenced by a common source; even if this were not the case, they still cannot be claimed to represent independent reports. Assuming they originate with the firsthand testimony of Jesus’ followers, these people were closely associated and had the opportunity to discuss among themselves what they had seen before their stories were recorded for posterity. They were all members of the same religious community, and shared a common perspective as well as common interests. While the gospel accounts tell us that miracles took place in front of hostile witnesses, we do not have the testimony of these witnesses. (Later acknowledgments of Jesus’ miracles by hostile parties is, the skeptic will argue, evidence only for the gullibility of these writers.)

It is sometimes suggested that these men undertook grave risk by reporting what they did, and they would not have risked their lives for a lie. But this establishes, at best, only that their reports are sincere; unfortunately, their conviction is not conclusive evidence for the truth of their testimony. We could expect the same conviction from someone who was delusional.

Let us consider a particular report of Jesus’ resurrection in applying these considerations. Popular apologetic sometimes points to the fact that according to Paul in 1 Corinthians (15:6), the resurrected Jesus was seen by five hundred people at once, and that it is highly improbable that so many people would have the experience of seeing Jesus if Jesus were not actually there. After all, it may be argued, they could not have shared a mass hallucination, since hallucinations are typically private; there is no precedent for shared hallucination, and it may seem particularly far-fetched to suppose that a hallucination would be shared among so many people. Accordingly it may be thought much more likely that Jesus really was there and, assuming there is sufficient evidence that he had died previously to that time, it becomes reasonable to say that he was resurrected from the dead.

While this report is sometimes taken as evidence of Jesus’ physical resurrection, Paul says only that he appeared to the five hundred without saying explicitly that it was a physically reconstituted Jesus that these people saw. But let us suppose that Paul means to report that the five hundred saw Jesus in the flesh. Unfortunately we do not have the reports of the five hundred to Jesus’ resurrection; we have only Paul’s hearsay testimony that Jesus was seen by five hundred. Furthermore Paul does not tell us how this information came to him. It is possible that he spoke personally to some or all of these five hundred witnesses, but it is also possible that he is repeating testimony that he received from someone else. This opens up the possibility that the report was distorted before it reached Paul; for example, the number of witnesses may have been exaggerated, or the original witnesses may have merely reported feeling Jesus’ presence in some way without actually seeing him. For the sake of argument, however, let us suppose that there was at one time a group of five hundred people who were all prepared to testify that they had seen a physically resurrected Jesus. This need not be the result of any supposed mass hallucination; the five hundred might have all seen someone who they came to believe, after discussing it amongst themselves, was Jesus. In such a case, the testimony of the five hundred would be to an experience together with a shared interpretation of it.

It is also possible that the text of Paul’s letter to the Corinthians has not been accurately preserved. Thus, no matter how reliable Paul himself might be, his own report may have been modified through one, or several, redactions.

There are, therefore, quite a few points at which error or distortion might have entered into the report in 1 Corinthians: (1) The original witnesses may have been wrong, for one reason or another, about whether they saw Jesus; (2) the testimony of these witnesses may have been distorted before reaching Paul; (3) Paul may have incorrectly reported what he heard about the event, and (4) Paul’s own report, as given in his original letter to the Christian community in Corinth, may have been distorted. The apologist may argue that it would be very surprising if errors should creep into the report at any of these four points. The question we must ask now, however, is which of these alternatives would be more surprising: That some error should arise in regard to 1-4 above, or that Jesus really was resurrected from the dead.

4. Hume’s Argument

In Section X of his Enquiry Concerning Human UnderstandingHume tells us that it is not reasonable to subscribe to any “system of religion” unless that system is validated by the occurrence of miracles; he then argues that we cannot be justified in believing that a miracle has occurred, at least when our belief is based on testimony—as when, for example, it is based on the reports of miracles that are given in scripture. (Hume did not explicitly address the question of whether actually witnessing an apparent miracle would give us good reason to think that a miracle had actually occurred, though it is possible that the principles he invokes in regard to testimony for the miraculous can be applied to the case of a witnessed miracle.) His stated aim is to show that belief in miracle reports is not rational, but that “our most holy religion is founded on Faith, not on reason” (Enquiries, p. 130). Hume surely intends some irony here, however, since he concludes by saying that anyone who embraces a belief in miracles based on faith is conscious of “a continued miracle in his own person, which subverts all the principles of his understanding” (Enquiries, p. 131); this seems very far from an endorsement of a faith-based belief in miracles.

There is some dispute as to the nature of Hume’s argument against miracles, and the Enquiry seems to contain more than one such argument. The most compelling of these is the one I will call the Balance of Probabilities Argument. (For a brief discussion of some of the other arguments, see the entry “David Hume: Writings on Religion.”) Hume tells us that we ought to proportion our certainty regarding any matter of fact to the strength of the evidence. We have already examined some of the considerations that go into assessing the strength of testimony; there is no denying that testimony may be very strong indeed when, for example, it may be given by numerous highly reliable and independent witnesses.

Nevertheless, Hume tells us that no testimony can be adequate to establish the occurrence of a miracle. The problem that arises is not so much with the reliability of the witnesses as with the nature of what is being reported. A miracle is, according to Hume, a violation of natural law. We suppose that a law of nature obtains only when we have an extensive, and exceptionless, experience of a certain kind of phenomenon. For example, we suppose that it is a matter of natural law that a human being cannot walk on the surface of water while it is in its liquid state; this supposition is based on the weight of an enormous body of experience gained from our familiarity with what happens in seas, lakes, kitchen sinks, and bathtubs. Given that experience, we always have the best possible evidence that in any particular case, an object with a sufficiently great average density, having been placed onto the surface of a body of water, will sink. According to Hume, the evidence in favor of a miracle, even when that is provided by the strongest possible testimony, will always be outweighed by the evidence for the law of nature which is supposed to have been violated.

Considerable controversy surrounds the notion of a violation of natural law. However, it would appear that all Hume needs in order to make his argument is that a miracle be an exception to the course of nature as we have previously observed it; that is, where we have had a substantial experience of a certain sort of phenomenon—call it A—and have an exceptionless experience of all As being B, we have very strong reason to believe that any given A will be a B. Thus given that we have a very great amount of experience regarding dense objects being placed onto water, and given that in every one of these cases that object has sunk, we have the strongest possible evidence that any object that is placed onto water is one that will sink. Accordingly we have the best possible reasons for thinking that any report of someone walking on water is false—and this no matter how reliable the witness.

While objections are frequently made against Hume’s conception of natural law, in fact no particularly sophisticated account of natural law seems to be necessary here, and Hume’s examples are quite commonsensical: All human beings must die, lead cannot remain suspended in the air, fire consumes wood and is extinguished by water (Enquiries p. 114). This may be a naive conception of natural law; nevertheless it is true that, all things being equal, we can assign a minimal probability to the occurrence of a counterinstance to any of these generalizations.

At times Hume sounds as though he thinks the probability of such an event is zero, given its unprecedented nature, and some commentators have objected that the fact that we have never known such an event to occur does not imply that it cannot occur. Past regularities do not establish that it is impossible that a natural law should ever be suspended (Purtill 1978). However, regardless of Hume’s original intent, this is a more extravagant claim than his argument requires. He is free to admit that some small probability may be attached to the prospect that a dense object might remain on the surface of a lake; it is sufficient for his purposes that it will always be more likely that any witness who reports such an event is attempting to deceive us, or is himself deceived. After all, there is no precedent for any human being walking on water, setting this one controversial case aside, but there is ample precedent for the falsehood of testimony even under the best of circumstances.

Accordingly Hume says (Enquiries p. 115ff) that “no testimony is sufficient to establish a miracle, unless the testimony be of such a kind, that its falsehood would be more miraculous, than the fact, which it endeavors to establish.” We must always decide in favor of the lesser miracle. We must ask ourselves, which would be more of a miracle: That Jesus walked on water, or that the scriptural reports of this event are false? While we may occasionally encounter testimony that is so strong that its falsehood would be very surprising indeed, we never come across any report, the falsehood of which would be downright miraculous. Accordingly, the reasonable conclusion will always be that the testimony is false.

Thus to return to Paul’s report of Jesus’ resurrection in 1 Corinthians: It may be highly unlikely that the original witnesses were wrong, for one reason or another, about whether they saw Jesus; it may be highly unlikely that the testimony of these witnesses may have been distorted before reaching Paul; it may be highly unlikely that Paul incorrectly reported what he heard about the event, and it may be highly unlikely that Paul’s original letter to the Christian community in Corinth has not been accurately preserved in our modern translations of the New Testament. Suppose the apologist can argue that a failure in the transmission of testimony at any of these points might be entirely without precedent in human experience. But the physical resurrection of a human being is also without precedent, so that the very best the apologist can hope for is that both alternatives—that the report is incorrect, or that Jesus returned to life—are equally unlikely, which seems only to call for a suspension of judgment. Apologetic appeals frequently focus on the strength of testimony such as Paul’s, and often appear to make a good case for its reliability. Nevertheless such an appeal will only persuade those who are already inclined to believe in the miracle—perhaps because they are already sympathetic to a supernaturalistic worldview—and who therefore tend to downplay the unlikelihood of a dead man returning to life.

Having said all this, it may strike us as odd that Hume seems not to want to rule out the possibility, in principle, that very strong testimony might establish the occurrence of an unprecedented event. He tells us (Enquiries p. 127) that if the sun had gone dark for eight days beginning on January 1, 1600, and that testimony to this fact continued to be received from all over the world and without any variation, we should believe it—and then look for the cause. Thus even if we were convinced that such an event really did take place—and the evidence in this case would be considerably stronger than the evidence for any of the miracles of the Bible—we should suppose that the event in question really had a natural cause after all. In this case the event would not be a violation of natural law, and thus according to Hume’s definition would not be a miracle.

Despite this possibility, Hume wants to say that the quality of miracle reports is never high enough to clear this hurdle, at least when they are given in the interest of establishing a religion, as they typically are. People in such circumstances are likely to be operating under any number of passional influences, such as enthusiasm, wishful thinking, or a sense of mission driven by good intentions; these influences may be expected to undermine their critical faculties. Given the importance to religion of a sense of mystery and wonder, that very quality which would otherwise tend to make a report incredible—that it is the report of something entirely novel—becomes one that recommends it to us. Thus in a religious context we may believe the report not so much in spite of its absurdity as because of it.

5. Problems with Hume’s Argument

There is something clearly right about Hume’s argument. The principle he cites surely resembles the one that we properly use when we discredit reports in tabloid newspapers about alien visitors to the White House or tiny mermaids being found in sardine cans. Nevertheless the argument has prompted a great many criticisms.

Some of this discussion makes use of Bayesian probabilistic analysis; John Earman, for example, argues that when the principles of Hume’s arguments “are made explicit and examined under the lens of Bayesianism, they are found to be either vapid, specious, or at variance with actual scientific practice” (Earman 2000). The Bayesian literature will not be discussed here, though Earman’s discussion of the power of multiple witnessing deserves mention. Earman argues that even if the prior probability of a miracle occurring is very low, if there are enough independent witnesses, and each is sufficiently reliable, its occurrence may be established as probable. Thus if Hume’s concern is to show that we cannot in principle ever have good reason to believe testimony to a miracle, he would appear to be wrong about this (Earman 2000: See particularly Ch. 18 and following). Of course the number of witnesses required might be very large, and it may be that none of the miracles reported in any scripture will qualify. It is true that some of the miracles of the Bible are reported to have occurred in the presence of a good number of witnesses; the miracle of the loaves and fishes is a good example, which according to Mark (Mark 6:30-44) was witnessed by 5,000 people. But we have already noticed that the testimony of one person, or even of four, that some event was witnessed by a multitude is not nearly the same as having the testimony of the multitude itself.

Another objection against Hume’s argument is that it makes use of a method that is unreliable; that is, it may have us reject reports that are true or accept those that are false. Consider the fact that a particular combination of lottery numbers will generally be chosen against very great odds. If the odds of the particular combination chosen in the California Lottery last week were 40 million to 1, the probability of that combination being chosen is very low. Assuming that the likelihood of any given event being misreported in the Los Angeles Times is greater than that, we would not be able to trust the Times to determine which ticket is the winner.

The unreliability objection, made out in this particular way, seems to have a fairly easy response. There is no skeptical challenge to our being justified in believing the report of a lottery drawing; that is, reports of lottery drawings are reports of ordinary events, like reports of rainstorms and presidential press conferences. They do not require particularly strong testimony to be credible, and in fact we may be justified in believing the report of a lottery drawing even if it came from an otherwise unreliable source, such as a tabloid newspaper. This is surely because we know in advance that when the lottery is drawn, whatever particular combination of numbers may be chosen will be chosen against very great odds, so that we are guaranteed to get one highly improbable combination or another. Despite the fact that the odds against any particular combination are very great, all of the other particular outcomes are equally unlikely, so we have no prejudice against any particular combination.  We know that people are going to win the lottery from time to time; we have no comparable assurance that anyone will ever be raised from the dead.

Nevertheless if we are to be able to make progress in science, we must be prepared to revise our understanding of natural law, and there ought to be circumstances in which testimony to an unprecedented event would be credible. For example, human beings collectively have seen countless squid, few of which have ever exceeded a length of two feet. For this reason reports of giant squid have, in the past, been sometimes dismissed as fanciful; the method employed by Hume in his Balance of Probabilities Argument would seem to rule out the possibility of our coming to the conclusion, on the basis of testimony, that such creatures exist—yet they have been found in the deep water near Antarctica. Similarly, someone living beyond the reach of modern technology might well reject reports of electric lighting and airplanes. Surely we should be skeptical when encountering a report of something so novel. But science depends for its progress on an ability to revise even its most confident assertions about the natural world.

Discussion of this particular problem in Hume tends to revolve around his example of the Indian and the ice. Someone from a very hot climate such as that of India, living during Hume’s time, might refuse to believe that water was capable of taking solid form as ice or frost, since he has an exceptionless experience against this. Yet in this case he would come to the wrong conclusion. Hume argues that such a person would reason correctly, and that very strong testimony would properly be required to persuade him otherwise. Yet Hume refers to this not as a miracle but as a marvel; the difference would appear to lie in the fact that while water turning to ice does not conform to the experience of the Indian, since he has experienced no precedent for this, it is also notcontrary to his experience, because he has never had a chance to see what will happen to water when the temperature is sufficiently low (Enquiries, p. 113). By the same token, we ought to be cautious when it comes to deciding how large squid may grow in the Antarctic deeps, when our only experience of them has been in warm and relatively shallow water. The circumstances of an Antarctic habitat are not analogous to those in which we normally observe squid.

On the other hand, when someone reports to us that they have witnessed a miracle, such as a human being walking on water, our experience of ordinary water is analogous to this case, and therefore counts against the likelihood that the report is true. And of course our usual experience must be analogous to this case, for if the water that someone walks upon is somehow unlike ordinary water, or there is something else in the physical circumstances that can account for how it was possible in this one instance for someone to walk on water when this is impossible in the ordinary case, then it is not a violation of natural law after all, and therefore, by Hume’s definition, not a miracle. Jesus’ walking on water will only qualify as a miracle on the assumption that this case is analogous in all relevant respects to those cases in which dense objects have sunk.

The distinction between a miracle and a marvel is an important one for Hume; as he constructs an epistemology that he hopes will rule out belief in miracles in principle, he must be careful that it does not also hinder progress in science. Whether Hume is successful in making this distinction is a matter of some controversy.

a. Does Hume’s Argument Beg the Question?

Many commentators have suggested that Hume’s argument begs the question against miracles. (See for example Lewis 1947:103, Houston 1994:133) Suppose I am considering whether it is possible for a human being to walk on water. I consider my past experience with dense objects, such as human bodies, and their behavior in water; I may even conduct a series of experiments to see what will happen when a human body is placed without support on the surface of a body of water, and I always observe these bodies to sink. I now consider what is likely to occur, or likely to have occurred, in some unknown case. Perhaps I am wondering what will happen the next time I step out into the waters of Silver Lake. Obviously I will expect, without seriously considering the matter, that I will sink rather than walk on its surface. My past experience with water gives me very good reason to think that this is what will happen. But of course in this case, I am not asking whether nature will be following its usual course. Indeed, I am assuming that it will be, since otherwise I would not refer to my past experience to judge what was likely in this particular case; my past experience of what happens with dense bodies in water is relevant only in those cases in which the uniformity of nature is not in question. But this means that to assume that our past experience is relevant in deciding what has happened in an unknown case, as Hume would have us do, is to assume that nature was following its usual course—it is to assume that there has been no break in the uniformity of nature. It is, in short, to assume that no miracle has occurred. In order to take seriously the possibility that a miracle has occurred, we must take seriously the possibility that there has been a breach in the uniformity of nature, which means that we cannot assume, without begging the question, that our ordinary observations are relevant.

It would be a mistake, however, to suppose that this criticism represents a victory for apologetic. While the apologist may wish to proceed by asking the skeptic to abandon his assumption that ordinary experience is relevant to assessing the truth of miracle reports, this seems to beg the question in the opposite direction. Ordinary experience will only fail to be relevant in those cases in which there was in fact a break in the uniformity of nature, i.e. in those cases in which a miracle has occurred, and this is precisely what the skeptic requires to be shown. It is tempting to suppose that there is a middle ground; perhaps the skeptic need only admit that it is possible that ordinary experience is not relevant in this case. However, it is difficult to determine just what sort of possibility this would be. The mere logical possibility that an exceptional event may have occurred is not something that the skeptic has ever questioned; when I infer that I will sink in the waters of Silver Lake, I do so in full recognition of the fact that it is logically possible that I will not.

If the apologist is asking for any greater concession than this, the skeptic may be forgiven for demanding that he be given some justification for granting it. He may be forgiven, too, for demanding that he be persuaded of the occurrence of a miracle on his own terms—i.e. on purely naturalistic grounds, without requiring him to adopt any of the assumptions of supernaturalism. Of course the most natural place to look for evidence that there may occasionally be breaks in the natural order would be to testimony, but for reasons that are now obvious, this will not do.

It would appear that the question of whether miracle reports are credible turns on a larger question, namely, whether we ought to hold the supernaturalistic worldview, or the naturalistic one. One thing seems certain, however, and that is that the apologist cannot depend on miracle reports to establish the supernaturalistic worldview if the credibility of such reports depends on our presumption that the supernaturalistic worldview is correct.

6. Conceptual Difficulties I: The Logical Impossibility of a Violation

Recent criticisms of belief in miracles have focused on the concept of a miracle. In particular, it has been held that the notion of a violation of natural law is self-contradictory. No one, of course, thinks that the report of an event that might be taken as a miracle—such as a resurrection or a walking on water—is logically self-contradictory. Nevertheless some philosophers have argued that it is paradoxical to suggest both that such an event has occurred, and that it is a violation of natural law. This argument dates back at least as far as T.H. Huxley, who tells us that the definition of a miracle as contravening the order of nature is self-contradictory, because all we know of the order of nature is derived from our observation of the course of events of which the so-called miracle is a part (1984:157). Should an apparent miracle take place, such as a suspension in the air of a piece of lead, scientific methodology forbids us from supposing that any law of nature has been violated; on the contrary, Huxley tells us (in a thoroughly Humean vein) that “the scientist would simply set to work to investigate the conditions under which so highly unexpected an occurrence took place; and modify his, hitherto, unduly narrow conception of the laws of nature” (1894:156). More recently this view has been defended by Antony Flew (1966, 1967, 1997) and Alastair McKinnon (1967). McKinnon has argued that in formulating the laws of nature, the scientist is merely trying to codify what actually happens; thus to claim that some event is a miracle, where this is taken to imply that it is a violation of natural law, is to claim at once that it actually occurred, but also, paradoxically, that it is contrary to the actual course of events.

Let us say that a statement of natural law is a generalization of the form “All As are Bs;” for example, all objects made of lead (A) are objects that will fall when we let go of them (B). A violation would be represented by the occurrence of an A that is not a B, or in this case, an object made of lead that does not fall when we let go of it. Thus to assert that a violation of natural law has occurred is to say at once that all As are Bs, but to say at the same time that there exists some A that is not a B; it is to say, paradoxically, that all objects made of lead will fall when left unsupported, but that this object made of lead did not fall when left unsupported. Clearly we cannot have it both ways; should we encounter a piece of lead that does not fall, we will be forced to admit that it is not true that all objects made of lead will fall. On McKinnon’s view, a counterinstance to some statement of natural law negates that statement; it shows that our understanding of natural law is incorrect and must be modified—which implies that no violation has occurred after all.

Of course this does not mean that no one has ever parted the Red Sea, walked on water, or been raised from the dead; it only means that such events, if they occurred, cannot be violations of natural law. Thus arguably, this criticism does not undermine the Christian belief that these events really did occur (Mavrodes 1985:337). But if Antony Flew is correct (1967:148), for the apologist to point to any of these events as providing evidence for the existence of a transcendent God or the truth of a particular religious doctrine, we must not only have good reason to believe that they occurred, but also that they represent an overriding of natural law, an overriding that originates from outside of nature. To have any apologetic value, then, a miracle must be a violation of natural law, which means that we must (per impossibile) have both the law and the exception.

a. Violations as Nonrepeatable Counterinstances to Natural Law

The conception of a violation may, however, be defended as logically coherent. Suppose we take it to be a law of nature that a human being cannot walk on water; subsequently, however, we become convinced that on one particular occasion (O)—say for example, April 18th, 1910—someone was actually able to do this. Yet suppose that after the occurrence of O water goes back to behaving exactly as it normally does. In such a case our formulation of natural law would continue to have its usual predictive value, and surely we would neither abandon it nor revise it. The only revision possible in this case would be to say “Human beings cannot walk on water, except on occasion O.” Yet the amendment in this case is entirely ad hoc; in its reference to a particular event, the revision fails to take the generalized form that statements of natural law normally possess, and it adds no explanatory power to the original formulation of the law. It gives us no better explanation of what has happened in the past, it does nothing to account for the exceptional event O, and it fares no better than the original formulation when it comes to predicting what will happen in the future. In this case O is what might be called a nonrepeatable counterinstance to natural law. Faced with such an event we would retain our old formulation of the law, which is to say that the exceptional event O does not negate that formulation. This means that there is no contradiction implied by affirming the law together with its exception.

Things would be different if we can identify some feature (F) of the circumstances in which O occurred which will explain why O occurred in this one case when normally it would not. F might be some force operating to counteract the usual tendency of a dense object, such as a human body, to sink in water. In this case, on discovery of F we are in a position to reformulate the law in a fruitful way, saying that human beings cannot walk on water except when F is present. Since the exception in this case now has a generalized form (i.e. it expresses the proposition that human beings can walk on water whenever F is present), our reformulation has the kind of generality that a statement of natural law ought to have. It explains the past interaction of dense bodies with water as well as the original formulation did, and it explains why someone was able to walk on water on occasion O. Finally, it will serve to predict what will happen in the future, both when F is absent and when it is present.

We may now, following Ninian Smart (1964:37) and Richard Swinburne (1970:26), understand a violation as a nonrepeatable counterinstance to natural law. We encounter a nonrepeatable counterinstance when someone walks on water, as in case O, and having identified all of the causally relevant factors at work in O, and reproducing these, no one is able to walk on water. Since a statement of natural law is falsified only by the occurrence of a repeatable counterinstance, it is paradoxical to assert a particular statement of law and at the same time insist that a repeatable counterinstance to it has occurred. However there is no paradox in asserting the existence of the law together with the occurrence of a counterinstance that is not repeatable.

b. Miracles as Outside the Scope of Natural Laws

The force of this line of reasoning is to deny that natural laws must describe the actual course of events. Natural laws do not describe absolutely the limits of what can and cannot happen in nature. They only describe nature to the extent that it operates according to laws. To put the matter differently, we might say that natural laws only describe what can happen as a result of natural causes; they do not tell us what can happen when a supernatural cause is present. As Michael Levine (1989:67) has put the point:

Suppose the laws of nature are regarded as nonuniversal or incomplete in the sense that while they cover natural events, they do not cover, and are not intended to cover, non-natural events such as supernaturally caused events if there are or could be any. A physically impossible occurrence would not violate a law of nature because it would not be covered by (i.e. would not fall within the scope of) such a law.

On this understanding, a physically impossible event would be one that could not occur given only physical, or natural, causes. But what is physically impossible is not absolutely impossible, since such an event might occur as the result of a supernatural cause. One way to make this out is to say that all laws must ultimately be understood as disjunctions, of the form “All As are Bs unless some supernatural cause is operating.” (Let us refer to this as a supernaturalistic formulation of law, where of course it is causal supernaturalism that is at work here, as opposed to a naturalistic formulation, which simply asserts that all As are Bs, without taking account the possibility of any supernatural cause.) If this is correct, then it turns out that strictly speaking, a miracle is not a violation of natural law after all, since it is something that occurs by means of a supernatural intervention. Furthermore, since statements of natural law are only intended to describe what happens in the absence of supernatural intrusions, the occurrence of a miracle does not negate any formulation of natural law.

The supernaturalistic conception of natural law appears to offer a response to Hume’s Balance of Probabilities argument; the evidence for natural laws, gathered when supernatural causes are absent, does not weigh against the possibility that a miracle should occur, since a miracle is the result of a supernatural intervention into the natural order. Thus there is a failure of analogy between those cases that form the basis for our statements of natural law, and the circumstances of a miracle. Probabilistic considerations, based on our ordinary experience, are only useful in determining what will happen in the ordinary case, when there are no supernatural causes at work.

7. Conceptual Difficulties II: Identifying Miracles

We have seen two ways in which the concept of a miracle, described as an event that nature cannot produce on its own, may be defended as coherent. We may say that a miracle is a violation of natural law and appeal to the conception of a violation as a nonrepeatable counterinstance, or we may deny that miracles are violations of natural law since, having supernatural causes, they fall outside the scope of these laws. Nevertheless, conceptual difficulties remain. Antony Flew (1966, 1967, 1997) has argued that if a miracle is to serve any apologetic purpose, as evidence for the truth of some revelation, then it must be possible to identify it as a miracle without appealing to criteria given by that revelation; in particular, there must be natural, or observable, criteria by which an event can be determined to be one which nature cannot produce on its own. Flew refers to this as the Problem of Identifying Miracles.

Let us see how this problem arises in connection with these two conceptions of the miraculous. Are there natural criteria by which we can distinguish a repeatable from a nonrepeatable counterinstance to some natural law? Suppose some formulation of natural law (All As are Bs) and some event that is a counterinstance to that formulation (an A that is not a B). The counterinstance will be repeatable just in case there is some natural force F present in the circumstances that is causally responsible for the counterinstance, such that every time F is present, a similar counterinstance will occur. But suppose we do our best to reproduce the circumstances of the event and are unable to do so. We cannot assume that the event is nonrepeatable, for we have no way to eliminate the possibility that we have failed to identify all of the natural forces that were operating to produce the original counterinstance. The exceptional event may have been produced by a natural force that is unknown to us. No observable distinction can be made between a case in which an exception is repeatable, having been produced by some as-yet undiscovered natural force, and one that is not. Worse yet, the naturalist will argue that the very occurrence of the exception is evidence that there is in fact some previously unknown natural force at work; where there is a difference in effects, there must be a difference in causes—which for the naturalist means, of course, natural causes.

Nor does the difficulty go away if we adopt the supernaturalistic view of natural law. On this view, natural laws only describe what happens when supernatural forces are absent; a genuine miracle does not violate natural law because it is the effect of a supernatural cause. Suppose an extraordinary event occurs, which the apologist would like to attribute to a supernatural cause. The following two states of affairs appear to be empirically indistinguishable:

1. The event is the result of a natural cause that we are as yet unable to identify.

2. The event is the result of a supernatural cause.

This, of course, is due to the fact that we do not observe the cause of the event in either of these cases—in the first, it is because the cause is unknown to us, and in the second, because supernatural causes are unobservable ex hypothesi. Thus the issue here is whether we should suppose that our failure to observe any cause for the event is due to our (perhaps temporary) inability to fully identify all of the natural forces that were operating to produce it, or whether it is because the cause, being supernatural, is in principle unobservable. If Flew is right, then in order to identify the event as a miracle, we must find some way to rule out the possibility of ever finding a natural cause for it; furthermore, if the identification of this event as a miracle is to serve any apologetic purpose, we must find some empirical grounds for doing this.

To complicate matters even further, there is yet a third possibility, which is that:

3. The event has no cause at all.

That is, it is possible that the event is simply uncaused or spontaneous. It is clear that there can be no observable difference between an event that has a supernatural cause, since such a cause is in principle unobservable, and one that fails to have a cause. The challenge for an account of miracles as supernaturally caused is to show what the difference is between conceiving an event as having a supernatural cause, and conceiving of it as simply lacking any cause at all.

The implications of this are quite significant: Even if the naturalist were forced to admit that an event had no natural cause, and that nature is, therefore, not fully lawlike, this does not commit him to supernaturalism. It is possible that nature undergoes spontaneous lapses in its uniformity. Such events would be nonrepeatable counterinstances to natural law, but they would not be miracles. They would fall within the unaided potentialities of nature; the naturalist need not admit the necessity of supernatural intervention to produce such events, because their occurrence requires no appeal to any transcendent reality. Indeed, should we become persuaded that an event has occurred that has no natural cause, the naturalist may argue that simplicity dictates that we forgo any appeal to the supernatural, since this would involve the introduction of an additional entity (God) without any corresponding benefit in explanatory power.

8. Supernatural Causes and Supernatural Explanation

The apologist, however, will insist that this is precisely the point. Describing an extraordinary event as the effect of a supernatural cause, and attributing it to divine intervention, is justified by the fact that it offers us a chance to explain it where no natural explanation is available. Assuming (as the naturalist typically does) that nature operates according to physical laws, the occurrence of an apparent exception points to some difference in the circumstances. If no difference in the physical circumstances can be found, then the only explanation available is that there is some supernatural force at work. It is unreasonable to reject such a supernatural explanation in the purely speculative hope that one day a natural explanation may become available.

The notion of a supernatural explanation deserves careful attention. The naturalist will surely argue that the conception of a supernatural explanation—together with its cognate, the notion of a supernatural cause—is confused. This position is motivated by the conviction that the notions of an explanation and of a cause are fundamentally empirical conceptions.

First, as regards the conception of a cause: Paradigmatically, causation is a relation between two entities, a cause (or some set of causal circumstances) and an effect. Now there are many cases in which we witness the effect of a cause that is not seen; I might for example hear the sound of a gunshot, and not see the gun that produced it. Furthermore I will be able to infer that there is a gun somewhere nearby that produced that sound. This is an inference from effect to cause, and is similar to what the apologist would like to do with a miracle, inferring the existence of God (as cause) from the occurrence of the miracle (as effect). But what makes my inference possible in this case is, as Hume would point out, the fact that I have observed a regular conjunction of similar causes with similar effects. This is precisely what is lacking when it comes to supernatural causes. I cannot ever experience the conjunction of a supernatural cause with its effect, since supernatural causes are (by hypothesis) unobservable—nor can I make an inference from any phenomenon in nature to its supernatural cause without such an experience. Indeed given the very uniqueness of God’s miraculous interventions into nature, it is difficult to see how the notion of divine causation could draw on any kind of regularity at all, as empirical causes do.

It is true that science often appeals to invisible entities such as electrons, magnetic fields, and black holes; perhaps the apologist conceives her own appeal as having a similar character (Geivett 1997:183). These things, one may argue, are known only through their observable effects. But the causal properties of such natural entities as electrons and magnetic fields are analogous to those of entities that are observable; this is what entitles us to refer to them as natural entities. Furthermore, these properties may be described in terms of observable regularities, which means that entities like electrons and magnetic fields may play a role in theories that have predictive power. Thus for example, an appeal to electrons can help us predict what will happen when we turn on a light switch. God is not a theoretical entity of this kind. Far from being able to play a role in any empirical regularities, God’s miraculous interventions into nature, as these are conceived by the supernaturalist, are remarkable for their uniqueness.

Another reason for doubting that God can possess causal powers analogous to those enjoyed by natural objects arises from the fact that God is typically conceived as lacking any location in space—and on the view of some philosophers, as being outside of time as well. Causal relationships among natural entities play out against a spatio-temporal background. Indeed it would seem that to speak of God as the cause of events in nature encounters something similar to the Problem of Mind-Body Interaction. (This should not be surprising given the usual conception of God as a nonmaterial entity, i.e. as mind or spirit.) All of the cases of causal interaction of which we are aware occur between physical entities that are fundamentally similar to one another in terms of possessing physical properties such as mass, electrical charge, location in space etc. Thus we know for example how one billiard ball may move another by virtue of the transfer of momentum. But God possesses none of these qualities, and cannot therefore interact with physical objects in any way that we can understand. God cannot, for example, transfer momentum to a physical object if God does not possess mass.

It may be argued that the conception of an explanation is inextricably intertwined with that of causation, so that if the conception of a supernatural cause is an empty one, the notion of a supernatural explanation can hardly be expected to get off the ground. The apologist may respond by distinguishing the sort of explanation she intends to give, when she attributes a miracle to divine agency, from the sort of explanation that is common to the natural sciences. In particular, she might characterize them as personal explanations, which work to explain a phenomenon by reference to the intentions of an agent—in this case God. (See for example Swinburne 1979: Ch. 2) Now, it is true that personal explanations do not have quite the same empirical basis as do scientific ones; nevertheless, like scientific explanations, they do typically have empirical consequences. For example, if I explain Bertrand’s running a red light by saying that he wanted to be on time to his meeting, I have given a personal explanation for Bertrand’s behavior, and it is one that is testable. It will be supported by any observations that tend to confirm the hypothesis that Bertrand is due for a meeting and that being on time is something that he desires, and it will be undermined by any that are contrary to it, such as discovering that Bertrand does not believe that any meeting is imminent. Furthermore this explanation also serves as a basis for rough predictions about other actions that Bertrand might be expected to perform, e.g. he will likely take other steps (possibly involving additional traffic violations) in order to make it to his meeting on time.

The most obvious way in which appeals to divine agency fail to be analogous to the usual sort of personal explanation is in their failure to yield even the vaguest of predictions. (See Nowell-Smith 1955) Suppose, for example, that we attribute a walking on water to divine intervention; from this description, nothing follows about what we can expect to happen in the future. Unless we can introduce additional information provided by revelation, we have no grounds for inferring that God will bring it about that additional miracles will occur; he may, or he may not. Indeed, as far as this kind of predictive expansion is concerned, we seem no better off saying that some event came about because God willed it to occur than we would be if we said of it simply that it had no cause, or that it occurred spontaneously. (Indeed, often when someone says “It was God’s will,” they are calling attention to the inscrutability of events.) In light of this fact, there is no reason why the naturalist should find such a supernatural explanation compelling; on the contrary, faced with a putative miracle, if his concern was to explain the event, he would be justified in following Hume’s advice and continuing to hold out for a natural cause and a natural explanation—one that possesses predictive power—or in the worst case, to simply shrug off the incident as inexplicable, while denying that this inexplicability warrants any appeal to the divine.

An objection here may be that all of this makes use of an unnecessarily narrow conception of causation—one which arbitrarily seeks to restrict their use to the natural sciences. Undoubtedly the word “cause” is used in a very diverse number of ways, and it is surely wrong to say that no sense can ever be attached to a statement of the form “God caused x to occur.” The same may be said regarding the notion of an explanation. But it is the apologist who tries to understand supernatural causes as analogous to the sort of causes that are of interest to natural science. If supernatural causes are not sufficiently similar to natural ones, they cannot be expected to fill the gap when natural causes are found to be lacking.

The most fundamental challenge to someone who wishes to appeal to the existence of supernatural causes is to make it clear just what the difference is between saying that an event has a supernatural cause, and saying that it has no cause at all. Similarly when it comes to the prospect of giving a supernatural explanation: Supposing that someone walks on water and we are unable to find any natural explanation for this, what warrants our saying that such an event has a supernatural explanation, as opposed to saying that it is inexplicable and being done with it?

9. Coincidence Miracles

Given the difficulties that arise in connection with the suggestion that God causes a miracle to occur, a non-causal account deserves consideration. R.F. Holland (1965) has suggested that a religiously significant coincidence may qualify as a miracle. Suppose a child who is riding a toy motor-car gets stuck on the track at a train crossing. A train is approaching from around a curve, and the engineer who is driving it will not be able to see the child until it is too late to stop. By coincidence, the engineer faints at just the right moment, releasing his hand on the control lever, which causes the train to stop automatically. The child, against all expectations, is saved, and his mother thanks God for his providence; she continues to insist that a miracle has occurred even after hearing the explanation of how the train came to stop when it did. Interestingly, when the mother attributes the stopping of the train to God she is not identifying God as its cause; the cause of the train’s stopping is the engineer’s fainting. Nor is she, in any obvious way, offering an explanation for the event—at least none that is intended to compete with the naturalistic explanation made possible by reference to the engineer’s medical condition. What makes this event a miracle, if it is, is its significance, which is given at least in part by its being an apparent response to a human need.

Like a violation miracle, such a coincidence occurs contrary to our expectations, yet it does this without standing in opposition to our understanding of natural law. To conceive of such an event as a miracle does seem to satisfy the notion of a miracle as an event that elicits wonder, though the object of our wonder seems not so much to be how the train came to stop as the simple fact that it should stop when it did, when we had every reason to think it would not.

A similar account of the miraculous comes from John Hick’s conception of religious faith as a form of “experiencing-as.” Inspired by Wittgenstein‘s discussion of seeing-as in the Philosophical Investigations (194e), Hick has argued that while the theist and the atheist live in the same physical environment, they experience it differently; the theist sees a significance in the events of her life that prompts her to describe her experience as a continuing interaction with God (1973:Ch. 2). A theist, for example, might benefit from an unexpected job opportunity and experience this as an expression of divine providence; the same event might not move an atheist in this way. Regarding miracles in particular, Hick (1973:51) writes:

A miracle, whatever else it may be, is an event through which we become vividly and immediately conscious of God as acting towards us. A startling happening, even if it should involve a suspension of natural law, does not constitute for us a miracle in the religious sense of the word if it fails to make us intensely aware of God’s presence. In order to be miraculous, an event must be experienced as religiously significant.

Holland gives no indication that he wants to describe the miracle of the train in terms of experiencing-as. Nevertheless it seems reasonable to say, with Hick, that in Holland’s example, while the child’s mother has seen the same thing that the skeptic has—the stopping of the train—she understands it differently, experiencing it as a miracle, and as an expression of divine providence.

But now a new problem emerges: If the question of whether an event is a miracle lies in its significance, and if its significance is a matter of how we understand it, then it is hard to see how the determination that some event is a miracle can avoid being an entirely subjective matter. In this case, whether or not a miracle has occurred depends on how the witnesses see it, and so (arguably) is more a fact about the witnesses, and their response to the event, than it is to the event itself. (See Smart 1964:35) But we do not typically analyze human agency in this way; whether or not Caesar crossed the Rubicon is not a matter of how anyone experiences things. The question of whether Caesar crossed the Rubicon is an objective one. Surely the theist wishes to say that the question of whether God has acted in the world, in the occurrence of a miracle, is objective as well. And surely this fact accounts for the attractiveness of a causal account of miracles; any dispute over the cause of a putative miracle is a dispute over the facts, not a dispute about how people view the facts.

10. Miracle as Basic Action

This is a serious criticism, but it overlooks something very important about the character of actions generally. To ask whether a human being has acted is surely to ask an objective question, but it is not always to ask a question about causes. Arthur Danto (1965) has argued for a distinction between two types of action: Those that are mediated, and those that are basic. (See also Davidson 1982, who refers to basic actions as primitive.)  I act in a mediated way when I perform action x by doing y; for example, if I turn on the light in my study by flicking a switch, my turning on the light is a mediated action. My flicking the switch is also a mediated action if I flick the switch by moving my fingers.  Notice that, when we say that I turned on the light in a mediated sort of way, this may carry causal implications: In this case, the light’s coming on was caused by the switch’s being flicked, and the switch’s being flicked was caused by my fingers’ moving.  But not all of our actions are like this. When I move my fingers in order to flip the switch, I do not bring about their movement by doing anything else; I just move them. Thus to say I have acted in moving my fingers does not imply that I caused anything to happen. Yet clearly it is, in some sense of “fact,” a fact that I moved my fingers.

It is possible, of course, that my fingers’ moving has a cause, such as the firing of various neurons. But my neural firings are not actions of mine; they are not things that I do. It is not as though I set about to fire my neurons as part of a procedure aimed ultimately at bringing it about that my muscles contract and my fingers move. And even if I did, there would have to be something that I did immediately in order to set the chain of causes going, or there would be an infinite series of actions I would have to perform in order to turn on the light—I could never so much as start to act . Thus the possibility of being able to describe my fingers’ moving in terms of physical causes, and of thereby being able to give a natural explanation for this in terms of neural firings and the like, does not rule out the possibility of saying that in moving my fingers, I have acted.

Some philosophers believe that the truth of a libertarian account of free will implies that the free actions of human beings have no natural cause. This parallels the way that the traditional view of miracles has understood the manner of God’s action in a miracle. (J.P. Moreland has discussed the analogy between free human actions and miracles in this regard; see Moreland 1997.) Such a libertarian view of human action may be correct. It is important to recognize, however, that we do not have to settle the matter; we do not have to show that someone’s moving of their fingers has no natural cause in order to attribute this movement to their agency. Thus analogously, a believer in miracles may insist that there is no natural explanation for various miracles such as the creation of the universe, Moses’ parting of the Red Sea, or Jesus’ resurrection. But if miracles are basic actions on the part of God, then our attribution of divine agency to such events does not require us to show that these things cannot be explained by reference to natural causes. Whatever we must do to identify an event as a miracle, if a miracle is conceived as a basic action on the part of God, it cannot involve a requirement to show that it has no natural cause.

To ascribe a basic action to its agent is not to make any claim about its cause; thus if miracles are properly conceived as basic actions on the part of God, it is not the case that “any assertion that a miracle has occurred is implicitly a causal assertion” (Levine 1994:39), though this view is widely held. On the contrary, the ascription of a miracle to God will be logically independent of any causal analysis. (For a detailed discussion of this point see Corner 2007, and particularly Ch. 4.)

11. Wittgenstein: Miracle as Gesture

This leaves open the question of how we are to identify an event as a miracle, if this does not involve a causal analysis.  One approach is to think of a miracle as a gesture on the part of God. In Culture and Value (1980:45e), Ludwig Wittgenstein writes:

A miracle is, as it were, a gesture that God makes. As a man sits quietly and then makes an impressive gesture, God lets the world run on smoothly and then accompanies the words of a saint by a symbolic occurrence, a gesture of nature. It would be an instance if, when a saint has spoken, the trees around him bowed, as if in reverence.

It is interesting that Wittgenstein should speak of a gesture as a symbolic occurrence. A human bodily movement becomes a gesture when it takes on a particular kind of significance. The significance of a bow, for example, lies in the fact that it is an expression of reverence or respect. Being able to identify a bending at the waist as a bow requires us to be familiar with the culture in which this particular bodily movement has the significance that it does. Nevertheless, the question of whether someone has bowed is an objective one—it is, we might say, a question about the facts. Thus the analogy of a miracle to a gesture may give us a way to view miracles at once as signs, allowing us to say that the character of a miracle lies, at least in part, in its significance within what Wittgenstein would call a “form of life,” and at the same time insist that the question of its significance is an objective matter.

If a miracle is like a gesture in the way Wittgenstein thinks it is, then supposing that a miraculous event should occur, part of what makes it possible to identify that event as a miracle is an appreciation of its significance. But a miracle does not take on its significance in a vacuum; the significance of a miracle, like the significance of a gesture, is dependent on a certain sort of context. This context is established, at least to some degree, by one’s view of the world; whether one is able to identify an event as a miracle will depend on one’s ability to integrate it with a worldview in which the possibility of God’s acting in nature is already acknowledged. Such a limitation poses no problem for theology generally, which might legitimately regard such a view of things as its starting point. It will, however, be fatal to any apologetic appeal that seeks to establish the credentials of theistic religion by pointing to the occurrence of a putative miracle and attempting to establish, on grounds that are consistent with naturalism, that this event gives compelling evidence for the existence of God.

Peter Winch has recently taken up Wittgenstein’s comparison of a miracle to a gesture:

A certain disposition, or movement, of a human body can be called a ‘gesture’ only within a context where it is possible for it to be recognised and/or reacted to as a gesture… Such a possibility depends, at least in large part, on the reigning culture within which the action occurs. (1995:211, emphasis in the original)

Winch observes that our recognition of a gesture is typically immediate rather than inferred. Thus for example, if we are introduced to someone and they bow, we would not normally arrive at the conclusion that they are bowing by means of an inference, after first eliminating the possibility that their movement has a natural explanation; on the contrary, if we are sufficiently familiar with bowing as a cultural institution we will immediately recognize the character of their act. Furthermore, our recognition of the fact that they have bowed will typically be shown in our reaction to their gesture, e.g. in our bowing in return. Analogously, we express our recognition of a miracle not by looking to see if it has any natural cause, but by responding in the manner characteristic of theistic religion; with awe, perhaps, or with gratitude for God’s beneficence. (This is the response of the mother in Holland’s miracle of the train.) But, just as our ability to recognize, and to react appropriately to, a bow depends on our being immersed in a particular culture, so might our ability to recognize a miracle and react to it in the characteristically religious way. If Winch is correct, then the skeptic, who seeks to show that a putative miracle has a natural cause, is proceeding in the wrong direction—but then so is the theist who tries to show that the event cannot be explained scientifically. Such a theist commits the same error as one would who thinks that in order to show that a particular gesture is a bow, we must show that no physiological explanation can be given for it.

The mainstream theistic approach to miracles is, at the moment, one that would prefer to employ a method similar to that used in the natural sciences. Philosophers taking this approach are unlikely to be satisfied with the conception of a miracle as a gesture. But if Winch is right, this is an indication of how deeply embedded science has become in modern western culture, and an indication as well of a drift away from the kind of religious culture in which the conception of a miracle originally found its home.

12. References and Further Reading

  • Aquinas, Thomas, Summa Contra Gentiles, III:100-103
  • Augustine, The City of God, XXI:8
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Author Information

David Corner
Email: dcorner@csus.edu
California State University Sacramento
U. S. A.

Last updated: February 11, 2009 | Originally published: