Modern Chinese Philosophy

The term “modern Chinese philosophy” is used here to denote various Chinese philosophical trends in the short period between the implementation of the constitutional “new policy” (1901) and the abolition of the traditional examination system (1905) in the late Qing (Ch’ing) dynasty and the rise and fall of the Republic of China in mainland China (1911-1949). As an ancient cultural entity, China seemed to be frozen in a time capsule for thousands of years until it suddenly defrosted as a direct result of military invasions and exploitation by the West and Japan since the Opium War of 1839-42. Thus, one may argue that China had longer “classical” and “medieval” periods than the West, whereas its “modern” period began relatively recently. Modern Chinese philosophy is rooted historically in the traditions of Buddhism, Confucianism, especially Neo-Confucianism, and the Xixue (“Western Learning,” that is, mathematics, natural sciences and Christianity) that arose during the late Ming Dynasty (ca. 1552-1634) and flourished until the early Republic Period (1911-1923). In particular, the Jingxue (School of Classical Studies), or classical Confucianism, developed in the early Qing dynasty, which critiqued Neo-Confucian thought as impractical and subjective and instead championed a pragmatic approach to resolving China’s dilemmas as a nation, exerting a powerful influence on the development of modern Chinese philosophy. Modern Chinese philosophers typically responded to critiques of their heritage by both Chinese and Western thinkers either by transforming Chinese tradition (as in the efforts of Zhang Zhidong and Sun Yat-sen), defending it (as in the work of traditional Buddhists and Confucians), or opposing it altogether (as in the legacy of the May Fourth New Cultural Movement, including both its liberal and its communist exponents). Many modern Chinese philosophers advanced some form of political philosophy that simultaneously promoted Chinese national confidence while problematizing China’s cultural and intellectual traditions. In spite of this, a striking feature of most modern Chinese philosophy is its retrieval of traditional Chinese thought as a resource for addressing 20th century concerns.

Table of Contents

  1. Dividing Chinese Philosophy into Periods
  2. Historical Background
  3. The Transformational Trend in Modern Chinese Philosophy
    1. Zhang Zhidong
    2. Sun Yat-sen
    3. Chinese Scholasticism
  4. The Anti-Traditional Trend in Modern Chinese Philosophy
    1. Yan Fu and Western Learning
    2. The May Fourth New Cultural Movement
    3. Hu Shi
    4. Chen Duxiu
    5. The Debate of 1923
  5. The Traditional Trend in Modern Chinese Philosophy
    1. Yang Rensan and the Buddhist Renaissance
    2. Ou-Yang Jingwu and the Chinese Academy of Buddhism
    3. Liang Shuming and Neo-Confucianism
    4. Fung Yulan and Neo-Confucianism
    5. Carsun Chang and Neo-Confucianism
    6. Xiong Shili and Neo-Confucianism
    7. Wang Kuowei and Classical Confucianism
    8. Thome Fang and Classical Confucianism
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Dividing Chinese Philosophy into Periods

The term “modern Chinese philosophy” is used here to denote various Chinese philosophical trends in the short period between the implementation of the constitutional “new policy” (1901) and the abolition of the traditional examination system (1905) in the late Qing Dynasty and the rise and fall of the Republic of China in mainland China (1911-1949). Admittedly, the term “modern philosophy” often refers to Western philosophy since the 17th century , characterized by the critical and independent spirit inspired by the Scientific Revolution, but there is no counterpart to this movement in 17th-19th century Chinese intellectual history. As an antique, independent cultural entity, China seemed to be frozen in a time capsule for thousands of years until it suddenly defrosted as a direct result of military invasions and exploitation by the West and Japan since the Opium War of 1839-42. Thus, one may argue that China had longer “classical” and “medieval” periods than the West, whereas its “modern” period began relatively recently.

With this demarcation in mind, the history of Chinese philosophy can be divided into five phases: the ancient (ca. 1000 BCE-588 CE), the medieval (589-959 CE), the Renaissance (960-1900 CE), the modern (1901-1949 CE), and the contemporary (after 1949 CE). Roughly speaking, many parallels to the history of Western philosophy can be discerned in this division. Like Greek philosophy, ancient Chinese philosophy was dominated by a spirit of fundamental humanism rather than theistic enthusiasm. Like Christian scholasticism, medieval Chinese philosophy was dominated by a religious concern displayed in the teachings of the multifarious Buddhist schools. The Renaissance of Chinese philosophy may be found in the Neo-Confucian movement that lasted for one thousand years through four dynasties: the Song (960-1279), Yuan (1280-1367), Ming (1368-1643) and Qing (1644-1911). Finally, all schools of modern and contemporary Western thought have prompted modern and contemporary Chinese philosophy to respond to their profound challenges. These various modes of response include the affirmation of tradition, the transformation of tradition, and the abandonment of tradition, once and for all. Collectively, these three modes of response function as the background to the development of modern Chinese philosophy and also help identify three of its major trends: the transformational trend (represented by Zhang Zhidong and Sun Yat-sen), the traditional trend (represented by traditional Buddhism, classical Confucianism, and Neo-Confucianism, respectively), and the anti-traditional trend (represented by the Liberalism and the Communism fostered by the May Fourth New Cultural Movement). While there have been various developments within other minor schools, only the major strains of thought will be treated briefly here.

2. Historical Background

Liang Qichao (1873-1930), a renowned early 20th century Chinese philosopher, suggested in his The Chinese Academic History in the Past Three Hundred Years (Zhongkuo jinsanbainien xueshushi) that modern Chinese philosophy was rooted in the traditions of classical Confucianism, Neo-Confucianism, Pure Land Buddhism, and the Xixue (“Western Learning,” that is, mathematics, natural sciences and Christianity) that arose during the late Ming Dynasty (ca. 1552-1634) and flourished until the early Republic Period (1911-1923). As he noted, there were two Confucian traditions handed down from the Han dynasty (206 BCE-220 CE) to the early Qing dynasty, namely, classical Confucianism (Jingxue) and Neo-Confucianism (Lixue). The so-called Lixue or Daoxue (the learning of reasons or of universal principles), represented in the Song dynasty by Zhu Xi’s Lixue (Rationalism) and Lu Xiangshan’s Xinxue (Idealism) and in the Ming dynasty by Wang Yangming (a follower of Lu), can be regarded as a renaissance of the ideal of humanity within Confucianism, yet it is a syncretic system composed of various elements of Chan (Zen) Buddhism, sectarian Daoism, and Confucianism (mainly based on the Analects, Mencius , Daxue (Great Learning), Zhongyong (Doctrine of the Mean), and the Xicixuan (Conspectus of the Book of Changes), the first four of which Zhu Xi annotated and entitled the Four Books, which became the corpus of Neo-Confucian teaching).

In opposition to the Neo-Confucian approach, there emerged the so-called Jingxue (School of Classics Studies) or classical Confucianism developed in the early Qing dynasty that was founded on the study of the “Six Classics,” that is the Yijing (Book of Changes), the Shujing (Classic of Ancient History), the Shijing (Classic of Poetry), the now-lost Yuejing (Classic of Music), the Lijing (Classic of Propriety), and the Chunqiu (Annals of the Spring and Autumn Period). Liang argued that the major difference between the two is that Neo-Confucianism places great emphasis on abstractions such as xin (mind), xing (human nature), li (reason), and qi (material-force) and demonstrates little concern for practical affairs such as economic, political, and military knowledge that will strengthen the national defense, benefit the public welfare, and promote people’s livelihood. To find a scapegoat for the collapse of the Ming dynasty (the last imperial regime led by ethnic Chinese), many late Ming intellectuals blamed Wang Yangming’s idealism for the ruin of their country. Thus the Jingxue thinkers urged Confucius’ genuine followers to turn to the original Confucian teachings through exegesis, not only of the Four Books, but of the Six Classics, which they supposed to be uncontaminated by Buddhism and Daoism. As they observed, Confucius taught his students with “Six Arts” (ritual, music, archery, horse-riding, calligraphy, and mathematics), which were the basic requirements for a gentleman of the pre-Qin era. These thinkers regarded the “Six Arts” as examples of practical learning and claimed that Confucius never made impractical, soul-seeking meditation or discussions of mind, spirit, and human nature the primal tasks of learning. In contrast to the subjective, idealistic approach applied by Wang Yangming’s school, the Jingxue thinkers promoted what they saw as a more realistic, objective approach to the study of the Classics and the pursuit of practical knowledge of agriculture, public administration, economics, national defense, and so forth. Among them, Ku Yanwu (1613-1682), Yan Yuan (1635-1704), and Dai Zhen (1724-1777) made great contributions to late Ming pragmatism. Their criticisms of Neo-Confucianism are still wielded with some force by those who critique Neo-Confucian thought today.

Another major intellectual trend that had exercised great influence on modern Chinese philosophy was Buddhism, a foreign religion that first came to China in the late Han dynasty. From then onward, Buddhism became popular with ordinary people as a folk belief for its promise to satisfy their secular needs, and gradually became attractive to scholars for the complexity and intricacy of its metaphysical and psychological theories. Imbued with the humanistic teaching of traditional philosophy, Chinese scholars found the Buddhist doctrines of “emptiness” (sunyata) and “non-self” or “self-denial” (wuwo) unacceptable until they were rendered intelligible and transformed in terms of the Daoist doctrines of “non-being” (wu) and “self-abstention” (wuyu), using the philosophical method of geyi (analogous interpretation) produced by the Neo-Daoists of the 3rd to 5th centuries CE. Once thus accepted, the Buddhist doctrines flourished in the Sui (590-617) and Tang (618-906) dynasties, during which four major Chinese Buddhist schools developed: the Huayan (“Flower Garland,” based on the Flower Ornament Sutra]), Tiantai (“Heavenly Platform,” based on the Lotus Sutra), Chan (“Meditation”–better known by its Japanese equivalent, Zen--based on the Vajracchedika Sutra and the Lankavatatra Sutra), and Jingtu (“Pure Land,” based on the Amitayus Sutra). Among these schools of Chinese Buddhism, the greatest tension has existed between Chan, which has maintained an iconoclastic attitude toward traditional Buddhist precepts and scriptural study, and “Pure Land,” whose theistic and ritualistic flavor helped to ensure its widespread popularity beginning in the Ming dynasty.

Finally, all schools of modern Chinese philosophy have submitted themselves to tremendous influence from “Western Learning” or Xixue, which flourished between the late Ming dynasty and the early Qing dynasty through the importation of Western astronomy, geometry, geography, mathematics, and natural sciences along with Christianity by Jesuit missionary scholars such as Matteo Ricci (1552-1610). With the help of Chinese scholars Xu Gunag-chi (1561-1633), Li Zhizao (1565-1630), and others, Ricci translated Euclid’s geometrical text The Elements. His work Shiyi (True Ideas of God ) introduced the scholastic concepts of “being,” “substance,” “essence,” and “existence” with a view to synthesizing the Christian view of the soul with the Confucian theory of human nature. The prospect of “Western Learning” was suddenly squelched by the Qing emperor Yongzheng (r. 1723-1735) on the grounds that the Jesuits were interfering in court politics. “Western Learning” was revived after the Opium War, however, and soon came into vogue among Chinese thinkers who opposed tradition in the name of “modernization.” The result has been most vividly described by Wing-tsit Chan, who writes: “At the turn of the [20th] century, ideas of Schopenhauer, Kant, Nietzsche, Rousseau, Tolstoy, and Kropotkin were imported. After the intellectual renaissance of 1917, the movement advanced at a rapid pace. In the following decade, important works of Descartes, Spinoza, Hume, James, Bergson, and Marx, and others became available in Chinese. Dewey, Russell, and Dreisch came to China to lecture, and special numbers of journals were devoted to Nietzsche and Bergson… Almost every trend of thought had its exponent. James, Bergson, Euken, Whitehead, Hocking, Schiller, T. H. Creen, Carnap, and C. I. Lewis had their own following. For a time it seemed Chinese thought was to be completely Westernized.” (Chan 1963:743)

3. Transformational Trend in Modern Chinese Philosophy

a. Zhang Zhidong

From the late 19th century to the first half of the 20th century, China suffered from ruthless exploitation and invasions by the Western powers and Japan. Trammeled by many unfair treaties signed by the defeated Qing government, China experienced a crisis of cultural self-confidence as its traditions shattered, its society disintegrated, and its empire perished. In the midst of this cultural, societal, and political turmoil, many intellectuals prescribed various remedies for the country’s survival; among them, Zhang Zhidong (1837-1909) was representative. In his Quanxue Pien (An Exhortation to Learning, 1898), Zhang called for importing Western industrial and economic knowledge and technology to meet China’s practical needs while at the same time preserving the leading position of Chinese traditional learning in theory. His response to the impact of Western knowledge is epitomized in the following phrases: “Taking Chinese learning as ‘substance,’ that is, the foundation of culture, and taking Western learning as ‘function’, that is, for the practical purpose and utility,” or to state briefly: “Chinese Learning as Substance and Western Learning as Function” (Zhongti Xiyong). This can be regarded as the first instance of the transformational trend in modern Chinese philosophy before the birth of modern China in 1911.

b. Sun Yat-sen

Sun Yat-sen (1866-1925), the Nationalist founder of the Republic of China, led the overthrow of the Qing regime in 1911 after a long series of revolutionary campaigns. Inspired by U.S. President Abraham Lincoln’s Gettysburg Address, in 1919 Sun articulated “Three Principles of the People” (Sanmin Zhuyi) on which the new democratic Republic of China was to be founded: the Principle of Nationalism (minzu zhuyi), the Principle of People’s Sovereignty (minquan zhuyi), and the Principle of People’s Livelihood (minsheng zhuyi).

The first principle, the Principle of Nationalism, which corresponds to Lincoln’s idea of “a government of the people,” maintains the equality of all ethnic groups in China proper and seeks equal national status for Chinese with all peoples of the world. This doctrine urges all ethnic groups (mainly the Han, Hui [Chinese Muslims], Manchus, Mongolians, and Tibetans) in China to unite as one nation so as to retrieve China’s national self-confidence and revitalize its national creativity. According to Sun, his Nationalism promoted eight kinds of national virtues: loyalty, fidelity, benevolence, love, honesty, justice, harmony, and peace, all of which have their origin in Chinese traditional culture but must be transformed to meet with the urgent needs of modern society.

The second principle, the Principle of People’s Sovereignty, which corresponds to Lincoln’s idea of “a government by the people,” holds that Chinese people must fight for their sovereignty through revolutions in order to set up a democratic government. According to Sun, Jean-Jacques Rousseau’s ideas that all men are born equal and people’s sovereignty is given by nature are merely ideals or theoretical hypotheses found in classic political texts. In human history, insisted Sun, no evidence can be found to support Rousseau’s views, and it was only through bloodshed that people ever acquired their power, sovereignty, and equality. Thus, Sun urged all Chinese to stand up for their rights, and to fight for their freedom and equality by joining the course of revolution. Influenced by the meritocratic Confucian civil service system of traditional China, Sun urged that most of the executive offices of the government be assigned by way of examination, instead of election. This is to separate people’s power from ability, so that people hold the power to govern while officials have the ability to serve (quanneng qufen).

The third principle, the Principle of People’s Livelihood, which corresponds to Lincoln’s idea of “a government for the people,” claims to provide a middle course between capitalism and communism and to avoid either extreme by substituting the idea of “cooperative economy” for that of “the free market.” Based on the Principle of People’s Livelihood, Sun argued for the adoption of two policies: (a) equalization of land ownership through taxation of property, and (b) restriction of private capital and expansion of state capital. Accordingly, the government should monopolize ownership and management of electricity, banking, mass transportation, and so forth, and leave medium- and small-sized businesses free room for their own development. Thus, the third Principle takes people’s livelihood in food, clothing, housing, and transportation to be of primary importance and demands that government assume full responsibility for this.

Above all, Sun proclaimed that his “Three Principles of the People” combined the choicest parts of Chinese and Western thinking with the Golden Mean (zhongyong) as a guideline derived from Chinese tradition. For example, the Principle of People’s Sovereignty accepts the Western idea of democracy but denies its origination from “natural law ”; as Sun observed, “all men are born unequal,” and those born with more intelligence and capability should serve those less favored by birth with compassion. To philosophers who demand scientific rigor and logical consistency, Sun’s synthesis may not sound convincing, and may seem to be largely based on personal observations and experience without theoretical justifications. However, from a historical perspective, Sun’s “Three Principles” may be seen as a major effort at introducing Western democratic ideas into China. In this sense, Sun’s attempt to combine Chinese tradition with Western modern thinking should be regarded as a typical example of the transformational trend in modern Chinese philosophy.

c. Chinese Scholasticism

The person who carried on the Christian tradition of Matteo Ricci in the early 20th century was Wu Jingxiong (1899-1986), also known as John C. H. Wu. A Roman Catholic and a scholar of jurisprudence, Wu became the first Chinese to translate the Bible into classical Chinese at the request of the Nationalist leader Chiang Kai-shek (1887-1975) in the 1930s. Wu saw Confucianism, Daoism and Chan Buddhism as the main currents in Chinese philosophy. He then tried to combine the Aristotelian-Thomistic tradition with Chinese philosophy. In many of his works, such as “Mencius’ Theory of Human Nature and Natural Law,” “My Philosophy of Law: Natural Law in Evolution,” and “Comparative Studies in the Philosophy of Natural Law,” Wu argued that the Confucian Dao consists of a number of ethical principles which are parallel to the “natural laws” in Christian scholasticism. For instance, the Confucian concepts of “Heavenly Mandate” (tianming), “human nature,” and “edification” assume many similarities to the “eternal law,” “natural law,” and “positive law” of scholastic philosophy. (Shen 1993: 282-283) In a small pamphlet entitled “Joy in Chinese Philosophy,” published in the 1940s, Wu explicitly pointed out that Confucianism, Daoism and Chan Buddhism all display a kind of spiritual joy that can be subsumed under Christian joy. The Chinese scholastic tradition is still carried on today, with Fu Jen Catholic University in Taiwan as its center.

4. Anti-Traditional Trend in Modern Chinese Philosophy

a. Yan Fu and Western Learning

The importation of Western science into China, prohibited since the early Qing, was renewed after the Opium War and gained tremendous momentum from the military supremacy of Western powers then invading China. To facilitate the introduction of Western military technology in manufacturing guns and building ships, the Jiangnan Arsenal, the first formal institution for Western learning in China, was established in 1865, followed by the construction of the Fuzhou Shipyard in 1866. The Qing government then changed its policy of isolation and sent the first group of young children abroad for foreign studies in 1872. Nonetheless, China’s disastrous defeat in the Sino-Japanese War of 1894-95 further weakened Chinese confidence in traditional culture and generated even greater enthusiasm among intellectuals for the West as a complete source of knowledge. Yan Fu (1853-1921), who studied in England from 1877 to 1879, was the first Chinese scholar to introduce Western philosophy, science, and political theory systematically by translating Thomas Huxley’s Evolution and Ethics, Herbert Spencer’s Synthetic Philosophy, John Stuart Mill’s On Liberty, Montesquieu’s L’Esprit des lois, and Adam Smith’s Wealth of Nations into Chinese. (Fung 1976: 326) He advocated freedom of speech as the foundation of a civil society and thereby laid the foundation for democracy and liberalism to flourish in China in the early 20th century.

b. The May Fourth New Cultural Movement

Although he was an advocate of Western learning, Yan Fu rendered his translations of Western works in the archaic classical form of the Chinese language and consistently showed his respect for the traditional culture. In contrast, many of his followers turned their back on traditional culture and tried to forsake it completely. In fact, the major trend of modern Chinese philosophy could be characterized as an overall antagonism toward the intellectual and cultural traditions, which reached its height during the so-called “May Fourth New Cultural Movement” (wushi xinwenhua yundong). (Kwok 1965: 8-17)

Soon after Sun Yat-sen established the Republic of China, he was elected its President. He then abdicated his presidency to the warlord Yuan Shihkai (1859-1916). Yuan died after failing to restore the imperial regime with himself as emperor, leaving behind a corrupt government that secretly depended upon Japanese financing. In the beginning, the May Fourth Movement was purely a patriotic student movement provoked by the government’s intention to sign the Versailles Treaty (which promised to concede Germany’s monopoly in Shandong Province to Japan instead of giving it back to China, in spite of China’s contributions to the Allied Powers in the First World War). On May 4, 1919, Beijing University students demonstrated in protest against the government and burned the houses of the officials involved. The movement soon spread all over the whole country, many schools and business were closed down, and the Japanese goods were boycotted by the people as a sign of support for the student movement.

Politically, the movement was successful, as it prevented the government from signing the Versailles Treaty. But it also proved to be a fatal stroke to traditional culture and Chinese national confidence. Most of the student leaders in this movement, such as Hu Shi (1891-1962), Cai Yuanpei (1868-1940), Wu Zhihui (1865-1953), Wu Yu (1872-1949), Lo Jialun (1897-1969), Chen Duxiu (1897-1942), and Li Dazhao (1889-1927), later turned to the major figures of an even greater new cultural and political movement that was at first called the “Vernacular Movement” (paihaowen yundong), then the “New Cultural Movement” (xinwenhua yundong). The movement called for an overall reform of Chinese culture and made “Mr. Science and Ms. Democracy” its icons. The rebellious spirit provoked by the two slogans, which seemed to be the panacea for the desperate situation of China, ended by bringing about an extremely violent campaign against Confucianism. The movement then divided into two camps: one led by the liberal Hu Shi, the other led by the communist Chen Duxiu.

c. Hu Shi

Hu Shi, a student of John Dewey at Columbia University in the United States, invited his teacher to lecture at Shanghai when the May Fourth Movement broke out in Beijing. Hu soon became the chief leader of the New Cultural Movement by promoting a pragmatic, critical spirit and by applying “scientific method” in every branch of human studies. He proclaimed that archaic language failed to convey real-life experience and should be replaced by vernacular language in literature, that classical literature handed down from the remote past should be reexamined to determine whether it represented true experience or scholarly forgery, and that Confucianism had misled the Chinese people by teaching them to subordinate themselves to the authorities of sovereign, father, family, and the state. Similarly, Hu blamed Daoism for teaching the Chinese people to comply with nature, instead of understanding and controlling nature. Hu praised the early Chinese philosophical school known as Mohism--not because of its high moral commitment, but because he regarded it as possibly the earliest form of pragmatism in Chinese intellectual history. In this spirit of new literary movement, Hu Shi published the first book in Chinese vernacular language, Outlines of the History of Chinese Philosophy (1919), which dismissed the traditional sacred image of Confucianism. Above all, Hu advocated the scientific method in doing any research work with the maxim “make hypotheses boldly, but verify them carefully.” A believer in scientism, Hu advocated pragmatism and devalued traditional Chinese culture on the grounds that it was deficient in the elements of science and democracy.

d. Chen Duxiu

While Chen Duxiu shared Hu’s pro-democratic, pro-scientific, and anti-Confucian sentiments, he rejected Hu’s individualist liberalism and helped to found the Chinese Communist Party in 1921. Chen, editor of the most influential journal of the New Cultural Movement, New Youth, was influenced by French democratic thought and Russian Marxist theory. He saw Chinese traditions, chiefly Confucianism, as incompatible with science and democracy, and called for an end to what he saw as an emblem of obscurantism and dogmatism. Deeply impressed by French thinkers, he enumerated their achievements in democracy (as seen in the work of Lafayette and Seignobos), evolutionary theory (in Lamarck), and socialism (in Babeuf, Saint-Simon, and Fourier). Influenced by his predecessor Li Shizeng (1881-1973), the first Chinese to study in France and the transmitter of Pyotr Kropotkin’s anarchist doctrines prior to the May Fourth Movement, Chen once was an anarchist. He then came to embrace dialectical materialism and propagate Marxism strongly as the only remedy for a feeble China. In 1920, he wrote: “The republic cannot give happiness to the people…. Evolution goes from feudalism to republicanism and from republicanism to communism. I have said that the republic has failed and that feudalism has been reborn, but I hope that soon the feudal forces will be wiped out again by democracy and the latter by socialism…for I am convinced that the creation of a proletarian state is the most urgent revolution in China.” (Briere 1956: 24) These statements prefigure the birth of the People’s Republic of China which replaced the Republic of China as the regime in mainland China after 1949 and made Marxism the only authority in modern Chinese philosophy.

e. The Debate of 1923

The tide of anti-Confucianism reached another height in 1923 in “The Debate between Metaphysicians and Scientists,” held chiefly by the geologist, Ding Wenjiang (1887-1936), and the Neo-Confucian thinker Zhang Junmei (1887-1969), later known as Carsun Chang. (Briere 1956: 16-17, 135-160; Kwok 1965: 29-31) Chang (Zhang), a disciple of Liang Qichao, gave a lecture on “the philosophy of life” at Qinghua University in Beijing in which he maintained that intuitive conscience and free will were the foundation of a happy life free from the sway of mechanical laws and argued that traditional Confucianism, including Neo-Confucianism, had made great contributions toward bringing about a great spiritual civilization by offering solutions for the problems of life to which science and technology had no answers. These remarks received an immediate rebuke from Ding in an article entitled “Science and Metaphysics,” in which he accused Chang of mixing Bergsonian intuitionism of élan vital with the intuitionism of Wang Yangming, thus recalling the specter of metaphysics in a positivist age. Ding, who championed the work of Darwin, Huxley, Spencer, et al, asserted that science is all-sufficient, not only in its subject matter, but also in its methodical procedure. According to Ding, science’s object is to search for universal truth by objectively excluding any personal, subjective prejudices, while the metaphysician can only introduce a supersensible world that is beyond human cognition and constructed from empty words.

In response, Chang retorted that manifestly there is knowledge outside of science, such as truths and hypotheses in philosophy and religion that cannot be verified by scientific criteria. Science, argued Chang, is far from being omnipotent: it is as limited in its scope as in its methods. Chang’s mentor, Liang Qichao, soon came to his aid and took on the role of an arbitrator in an article entitled “The View of Life and Science.” One the one hand, Liang criticized Chang for overstating the function of intuition and free will that leads to an undesirable subjective individualism and maintained that most of the “problems of life” can be solved with help of scientific knowledge. On the other hand, Liang supported Chang’s denial of the omnipotence of scientific knowledge and asserted that our understanding of beauty, love, religious experience, moral sentiment, aesthetic feeling, and so forth, can never proceed through scientific methods. (Briere 1956: 30)

The debate lasted more than one year. In addition to Liang Qichao, Liang Shuming (1893-1988) and Zhang Dungsun (1886-1962) sided with Chang, while Hu Shi, Chen Duxiu, Wu Zhihui and many others were in Ding’s camp. In the end, Ding’s “scientific” faction prevailed and paved the way for another wave of cultural reform, the so-called “Movement of Overall Westernization” (quanpan xihua) that sought a complete abandonment of traditional culture and a replacement of a backward, conservative way of life with a Westernized, modern way of life.

5. Traditional Trend in Modern Chinese Philosophy

a. Yang Rensan and the Buddhist Renaissance

In the early 20th century, the Chinese Buddhist school of Weishi, founded by Xuanzang during the Tang dynasty, was revived by Yang Rensan (1837-1911) and Ouyang Jinwu (1871-1943). Yang has been called the “Father of Modern Buddhism” because of his establishment of the “Nanjing Inscription Place for Sutras” (Jinglin Yinkechu) in 1866, which greatly contributed to the maintenance of Buddhist literature and the education of young monks. Yang advanced the Dashengcixin Lun (Essays on Awakening the Faith in Mahayana Buddhism) as the key work for understanding the essence of Buddha’s teaching. This text promotes the doctrine of “One Mind Opens Two Ways” (yixin kai ermen), according to which “Two Ways” refers to the Way of Real Mind (xinzhenru men) or the category of reality, noumena, suchness, and so forth, and the Way of Passing Mind (xinshengmei men), or the category of appearance, phenomena, ephemerality, and so on. In Yang’s understanding, the doctrine of “One Mind Opens Two Ways” provides a full account of life and death, which is the basic concern of Buddhism. All Buddhist practices aim at helping people to achieve Buddhahood and freedom from suffering, conditioned existence in cyclical rebirth (samsara). For Yang, these aims are made possible because both one’s suffering and one’s redemption from suffering coexist in one’s mind. Once one discovers his immaculate nature, which is pure, pristine, changeless and irremovable, then he will achieve Buddhahood. However, if he is entangled by ignorance, greed, anger, wantonness, and evils, then he will continue to suffer from cyclical birth and death (although essentially these will not affect his immaculate nature). Thus in Yang’s view, the study of mind and consciousness (in the sense of activity-consciousness or yehshi) is of primal importance and can be best accomplished through this type of Buddhist discipline.

b. Ou-Yang Jingwu and the Chinese Academy of Buddhism

Yang’s idea deeply impressed his disciple Ouyang Jingwu, a forerunner of both modern Chinese Buddhism and Neo-Confucianism (whose leading figure, Xiong Shili [1885-1968], was a disciple of Ouyang). Ouyang originally was a Neo-Confucian familiar with Zhu Xi and Wang Yangming who eventually tired of the “empty talk” of Neo-Confucianism and became interested in Yang’s Weishi Buddhism. In 1922, carrying on Yang’s career of reprinting Buddhist literature and promoting Buddhist education, Ouyang founded the Chinese Academy of Buddhism (Zhina Neixueyuan) at Nanjing, which soon became the center for Weishi studies. Ouyang himself republished the most important classic of Weishi, the Yogacaryabhumi Sastra (Yoga Masters on the Spiritual Levels of Buddhist Practice or Yujiashidi Lun), with an introduction that was highly praised by the Buddhist academic community of the time. Before this, in 1921, he gave a lecture entitled “Buddhist Teaching is neither a Religion nor a Philosophy” at Nanjing Normal High School in which he distinguished Buddhism from both religion and philosophy. In Ouyang’s view, Buddhism does not teach the belief in the existence of God or gods, nor does it maintain any relations coalescing God and man, so it should not be regarded as a “religion” in the Western theistic sense. Again, the term “philosophy” does not apply to Buddhism either, as the former has no concern of the ultimate destiny of man and pays no attention to achieving the highest spiritual status through self-cultivation. Thus, Ouyang praised Buddhism as the all-encompassing learning that covers cosmology, epistemology, psychology, and the issue of life and death–as the only learning, in fact, that will help people to solve the problem of life and death.

Although a faithful follower of Yang, Ouyang did not accept all his master’s views without reservation. He differed from Yang in his understanding of the significance and adequacy of the Essays on Awakening the Faith in Mahayana Buddhism. Yang appreciated the work for its union of “reality” with “appearance” in one mind; Ouyang, however, criticized this doctrine severely according to the principle of “Distinguishing Substance from Function” (jianbie tiyong). Ouyang argued that “reality” or suchness indicates the substance and essence of a thing, whereas “appearance” or the sensible merely indicates the function or work of a thing. These two belong to different levels of category and should not be taken indiscriminately, as the Essays do. Ouyang then tried to go beyond Weishi, and studied Avatamsaka Sutra and Mahaparinirvana Sutra in his later years with the purpose of expanding and advancing modern Buddhist thought. With his effort, Chinese Buddhism flourished once again in the early 1920s and ’30s, and many celebrities such as Liang Qichao and Cai Yuanpei came to Ouyang’s help to sponsor the Chinese Academy of Buddhism. His thought has proven to be quite influential on subsequent Chinese Buddhist and Neo-Confucian thinkers, including Tai Xu (1890-1947), Lu Cheng (1896-1989), and the aforementioned Xiong Shili.

c. Liang Shuming and Neo-Confucianism

The Buddhist renaissance mentioned above may be regarded as the most insulated quarter of modern Chinese philosophy, insofar as it paid no attention to the prevalence of Western philosophy in China and maintained itself firmly on the traditional track. Modern Confucianism, however, pursued a combined course, partly following the traditional way and partly transforming itself in response to the challenge of Western culture. Among the traditional Confucianists, the late Qing reformer and mentor of Liang Qichao, Kang Yuwei (1858-1927), might be regarded as the last Confucian who was convinced that China could solve its problems by traditional learning alone. Even after the complete rejection of Confucianism by Hu Shi and Chen Duxiu in the early 1920s, Confucianism still retained its defenders. Most notable among these was Liang Shuming, who published Dongxiwenhua jichizhexue (The Oriental and Occidental Cultures and Their Philosophies) in 1922. In this book, Liang attempted a macro-scale analysis of Eastern and Western cultures and divided the development of world cultures into three different stages: (1) the objective, (2) the moderate, and (3) the divine, which correspond to three kinds of life attitude -- the outward, the inward, and the backward, respectively. According to Liang, modern European culture with its objective spirit should be ascribed to the first stage. People who live in this culture aim to understand and exploit nature in order to satisfy their mounting needs and desires, and therefore assume an outward life attitude, an attitude of aggression, striving, progression, and competition. In Liang’s view, Chinese culture could be ascribed to the second stage, as the Chinese knew quite well that excess desire for material goods undermines the true happiness of humankind. Without undergoing the first stage, Chinese culture came directly to the second stage and thus was in fact morally precocious, adopting an inward life attitude of moderation and pursuing the equilibrium of humanity and nature, a harmonization of reason and emotions. Finally, Liang saw Indian culture as representative of the last stage, in which high wisdom teaches people to abstain from desire and pleasure and make them assume a backward life attitude toward this sensual world. “In short,” Liang argued, “it is necessary to reject Indian culture as useless, to modify Western culture with true happiness in view, and to reassert the value of Chinese culture.” In Liang’s optimistic vision, “The world culture will eventually be the renovated Chinese culture.” Thus from a more or less spiritualistic outlook, Liang provided a different evaluation of Chinese traditional culture by offering a broader picture of the total developments of human civilization and its destiny, though without founding arguments.

d. Fung Yulan and Neo-Confucianism

The renowned scholar Fung Yulan (1895-1990), a contemporary of Liang, was another important figure in the camp of Confucian defense. Fung, like Hu, had also been a student of John Dewey, as he studied at Columbia University from 1919 to 1924 and received his Ph.D. there. He then returned to China, where he mainly taught at Qinghua University and edited a professional journal, Philosophical Critique (1927-1937), with Hu Shi, Carsun Chang, Zhang Dongsun, et al. In 1934, Fung published the first volume of his History of Chinese Philosophy, which was translated into English in 1937 and became the first book on this subject in English. From 1939 to 1947, Fung published a series of books under the title of Xinlixue (New Rational Philosophy) that made him the initiator of modern Neo-Confucian movement. Carrying on the traditions of Song and Ming Neo-Confucianism, Fung’s “New Rational Philosophy” was based on four concepts: principle (li), material force (qi), the substance of Dao or Way (daoti), and the Great Whole (daquan). Roughly speaking, Fung assumed a realist outlook and laid out the basic tenets of his philosophy as follows. First, everything exists as something really exists, and it is inherent within itself as a “principle” that makes it what it is. Second, everything exists by taking its shape from material force; since the “principle” is eternal, universal, and abstract, there must be something that is temporal, particular, and concrete to make a thing really exist. Third, whatever exists, exists in a flux. The totality of ephemeral phenomena and the transient world is called the substance of Dao. Fourth, the totality of whatever exists, the ultimate existence, is called the Great Whole. Borrowing the totalistic concept from Buddhism, Fung sees the Great Whole as an indication that, in the ultimate reality, “one is all and all is one.” In addition, The Great Whole is also the life-purpose of a philosopher who tries to understand the external world, to realize his potential abilities, and to serve Heaven: that is, to fulfill humanity. Thus, Fung was basically a Neo-Confucian of Zhu Xi’s type, who maintained that universal principles should be the foundations of a moral cosmos in which humanity can be fulfilled. This can be seen in Fung’s paper “Chinese Philosophy and a Future World Philosophy,” published in 1948 by The Philosophical Review, which makes comparisons between Plato and Zhu Xi, Immanuel Kant and the Daoists, and establishes human perfection as the major goal of Confucianism.

e. Carsun Chang and Neo-Confucianism

Though Fung was the first modern Chinese philosopher who carried on the traditions of Song and Ming Neo-Confucianism by elaborating its metaphysical systems, it was Carsun Chang who literally gave birth to the term “Neo-Confucianism” or Xinjujia and provided a great impetus to the later “New Confucian” movement in Hong Kong and Taiwan. As mentioned before, in the “Debate of 1923,” Chang allied himself with Liang Qichao and Liang Shuming in fighting against the torrents of anti-Confucianism and scientism. However, like Fung, Chang was acquainted with Western culture and studied abroad in Japan and Germany. In 1918, Chang studied with the German idealist Rudolf Eucken at Jena University. Despite his interest in philosophy, he threw himself into politics and founded a party which was at first called “National Socialist,” and then “Social Democrat.” In 1957, after immigrating to the United States, Chang returned to his past interests and wrote The Development of Neo-Confucian Thought, which gives a full account of Neo-Confucianism from the Tang thinker Han Yu (768-824) to the beginning of the early Republican period and freely associates Neo-Confucianism and Chan Buddhism with Western idealism and liberalism. The book was the first work on Neo-Confucianism in English and in it, Chang coined the term “Neo-Confucianism,” since widely used by academics in both the East and the West.

f. Xiong Shili and Neo-Confucianism

Another representative of modern Neo-Confucianism was Xiong Shili. Xiong was deeply influenced by Ouyang’s Buddhist thought, but rejected his teacher’s doctrine of “Distinguishing Substance from Function.” In 1944, he wrote Xinweishi lun (New Doctrine of Consciousness-Only) in which he attempted to synthesize Chan Buddhism with the idealism of Neo-Confucianism and to criticize the Consciousness-Only school. According to Xiong, reality is in perpetual transformation, consisting of unceasing “closing” and “opening” movements, with everything arising from these movements. The universe in its “closing” aspect is prone to integrate substantial things, and the outcome may be called “matter.” While in its opening aspect, the universe intends to maintain its own nature and be its own master, and the outcome may be called “mind.” This mind itself is one part of the “original mind,” which implies the activities of consciousness and will as well. Both “closing” and “opening” are the functions of the universe, but they are the manifestations of the substance of the universe, too. Thus, there should be no separation or distinction of “substance” from “function,” as the “Consciousness-Only” school taught. The “Consciousness-Only” school maintains that there are two different realms, namely, the realm of temporality or phenomena (the realm of alaya) and the realm of suchness or noumena. Taking alaya as the cause of the consciousness, consciousness becomes the effect of alaya. In Xiong’s view, all these separations are due to the misleading doctrine of “Distinguishing Substance from Function” and should be lifted according to the doctrine of “Substance as Function.” Here, the concepts of “closing” and “opening” seem to be adopted from the Book of Changes and become the cornerstones of Xiong’s cosmology. Thus, with a strong inclination to Wang Yangming’s idealism, Xiong made personal experience and self-awareness the only foundation of reality, which his critics maintained failed to do justice to the objective existence of the universe.

Xiong’s Neo-Confucian thought exercised great influence on his followers, especially Mou Zongsan (1909-1973) and Tang Junyi (1909-1978). After 1958, Mou and Tang taught at the the Chinese University of Hong Kong’s New Asia College and made Neo-Confucianism a popular school within modern Chinese philosophy.

g. Wang Kuowei and Classical Confucianism

Although Neo-Confucianism was predominant in modern Chinese philosophy, there was an unpopular strain of thought derived from the tradition of “classical Confucianism” of the early Qing that stood in opposition to Neo-Confucianism. The arguments between the two can be traced back to Wang Kuowei (1877-1927)’s critique of Zhang Zhidong’s denial of the value of philosophy. After its defeat in the Boxers’ Rebellion of 1900 by the Alliance of Eight Nations, the Qing government finally determined to implement its “New Policy” for constitutional and educational reforms. Zhang Zhidong was in charge of educational reform and assigned the office to stipulate the articles for the establishment of modern schools in China. As noted above, Zhang held a doctrine of “Chinese Learning as Substance and Western Learning as Function,” and contrived to preserve the dominant position of traditional learning. As a Neo-Confucian, Zhang took the Lixue of the Song as the authority of traditional learning and deemed Western philosophy to be poisonous, useless, and incompatible with Lixue, on the grounds that democratic theories in Western philosophy might spread dangerous ideas of freedom and human rights throughout China and result in unpredictable social upheavals. He then decided to eliminate “philosophy” from the undergraduate curriculum and replace it with “Neo-Confucianism.” Zhang’s decision was severely criticized by Wang Kuowei in his Zhexue Pienhuo (An Answer to the Doubt of Philosophy) (1903). Wang accused Zhang of espousing a narrow-minded, vulgar Confucian mode of thinking that attempted to grant a franchise to Neo-Confucianism in an era seeking for freedom of thought. He argued that philosophy should not be deemed poisonous or useless as it comprises broader scope than politics and jurisprudence that teaches the ideas of freedom and equality, and utility should never be taken as a standard to which philosophy has to meet. The function of philosophy is to answer the metaphysical impetus of human beings for truth, goodness and beauty, instead of the need for utility. Deeply impressed by the systematic and logical rigorousness of Western philosophy, Wang contended that Western philosophy was a necessary intellectual resource for scholars who wished to analyze and reinterpret Chinese philosophy. Again, the value of Confucianism can only be properly estimated after one has full knowledge and an overall understanding of all the teachings of Chinese and Western philosophy. Neo-Confucianism is but only one of the Confucian schools and Confucianism is but only one of the schools of Chinese philosophy alongside Daoism, Mohism, Legalism, and so forth. Thus, Wang saw no reason to make Neo-Confucianism the authority of traditional learning or to exclude the teaching of Western philosophy from universities. Accordingly, Wang suggested that scholars expand the scope of traditional learning and to go beyond Neo-Confucianism or even Confucianism.

It is worth noting that Wang Kuowei himself was the first Chinese scholar to introduce Western philosophy with better understanding and deeper insight than Yan Fu. Before he was thirty, Wang had already studied Kant’s Critique of Pure Reason and Schopenhauer’s The Fourfold Root of the Principle of Sufficient Reason, The World as Will and Representation, and On the Will in Nature through Japanese and English translations, and was deeply impressed by the two German philosophers. When dealing with the most abstruse European philosophy, Wang admitted that he could hardly understand Kant. It was through studying Schopenhauer’s criticism of Kant’s doctrine of “thing-in-itself” that Kant became apprehensible to him. Wang was also familiar with Thomas Hobbes, Francis Bacon, John Locke , David Hume, Jeremy Bentham, and other Western thinkers by studying Henry Sidgwick’s Outlines of the History of Ethics. One would not be going too far in saying that Wang was the first Chinese scholar with such a broad knowledge of Western philosophy. Nonetheless, after the age of thirty, Wang gave up the study of philosophy and turned to Chinese classics, history and literature, which made him eventually one of the greatest Chinese historians, archaeologists, and men of letters. The brilliant scholar ended his own life in the Kunming Lake of Yihe Royal Garden when he was only fifty years old.

h. Thome Fang and Classical Confucianism

Among the modern Chinese philosophers who flourished in the early 1930s, Thome Fang (1899-1977) was the true follower of Wang Kuowei. He shared Wang’s refutation of the narrowness of Neo-Confucianism and confirmed Wang’s assertion of the significance of philosophy. Like Wang, Fang had received a solid classical education as a result of his family upbringing, from which he developed a strong conviction of the preeminence of traditional Chinese culture. He also had a comprehensive knowledge of Western philosophy, having received his Ph.D. in philosophy from the University of Wisconsin at Madison in 1924. Fang was in fact the first Chinese scholar to introduce a number of Western writers, including ancient Greek tragedians and the philosophers George Santayana and Alfred North Whitehead, to Chinese readers. When he began his philosophical career in 1926 by teaching at the Central University of Nanjing, he published a series of papers on science, philosophy, and life. In these papers Fang gave high appraisal to Whitehead’s opposition to scientific materialism and agreed to Whitehead’s criticism of the fallacies of “bifurcation of nature” and “misplaced concreteness,” which are the presuppositions of scientific knowledge. Among the various Western philosophical strains, Fang found that Greek philosophy was the one closest to original Confucianism and saw Whitehead’s concept of nature as “creative advance” as parallel to the concept of “creativity” in the Book of Changes, whereas he regarded modern European philosophy as constantly trapped by all kinds of dualism and thus at variance with Chinese philosophy. In “Three Types of Philosophical Wisdom” (1938), Fang maintained that there are three types of philosophical wisdom, the ancient Greek, the modern European and the classic Chinese, which represent the most significant cultural aspects in the development of human history. In Fang’s account, the ancient Greeks praised reason and took reality to be the realm of the intelligible, the modern Europeans scrutinized nature and developed science and technology successfully, whereas the Chinese eulogized humanity and enshrined universal principles–Dao--in the highest place of their philosophical system. Thus for Fang the Greek speculative wisdom, the European technological wisdom and the Chinese moderate wisdom can be characterized by rationality, efficiency, and universal equity respectively. And if these three types of wisdom can be incorporated into a coherent whole, with one complementing to the others, so Fang imagined, the most desirable form of world culture would emerge.

In addition, according to Fang, Chinese wisdom is best represented by Confucius's interpretations of the Book of Changes, Laozi’s doctrine of Dao, and Mozi’s ideal of mutual love, which he saw as the most important elements of Chinese philosophy. In contrast, Fang rejected sectarian Daoism and Neo-Confucianism as decadent forms of original Daoism and Confucianism, insofar as sectarian Daoism is greatly involved with popular folk beliefs and yinyang theory and Neo-Confucianism transforms the cosmology of the Book of Changes into a kind of materialistic cosmogony. Even so, Fang was the first modern Chinese philosopher who recognized the philosophical significance of the Book of Changes, convening regular meetings with several scholars to explore and discuss the philosophical implications of this classic text from 1935 to 1937 in Nanjing and jointly publishing Yixue Taolunji (A Collection of Papers on the Book of Changes) (1937), the first work to study the Book of Changes in connection with Western philosophy, inspiring a new generation of Chinese scholars to approach the text in this way.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Briere, O. Fifty Years of Chinese Philosophy 1898-1950. Trans. Laurence G. Thompson. London: George Allen and Unwin, 1956.
  • Chan, Wing-tsit, ed. A Source Book in Chinese Philosophy. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1963.
  • Chang, Carsun. The Development of Neo-Confucian Thought. New York: Bookman Associates, 1957.
  • Dubs, Homer H. “Recent Chinese Philosophy.” The Journal of Philosophy 35 (1938): 345-355. Fang, Thome. Chinese Philosophy: Its Spirit and Its Development. Taipei: Linking Publishing Co., Ltd., 1981.
  • Fung, Yu-lan, “Chinese Philosophy and a Future World Philosophy.” The Philosophical Review 57 (1948): 539-549.
  • Fung, Yu-lan. A Short History of Chinese Philosophy. Ed. Derk Bodde. New York: The Free Press, 1976.
  • Kwok, D.W.Y. Scientism in Chinese Thought, 1900-1950. New Haven and London: Yale University Press, 1965.
  • Schwartz, Benjamin I. In Search of Wealth and Power: Yen Fu and the West. Cambridge: Belknap Press of Harvard University Press, 1964.
  • Shen, Vincent. “Creativity as Synthesis of Contrasting Wisdoms: An Interpretation of Chinese Philosophy in Taiwan since 1949.” Philosophy East and West A Quarterly of Comparative Philosophy 43 (1993): 179-287.
  • Sun, Yat-sen. The Three Principles of the People. Trans. Frank W. Price. Taipei: China Publishing Company, 1981.

Author Information

Yih-Hsien Yu
Email: arche@thu.edu.tw
Tunghai University
Taiwan