We often talk about how things could have been, given different circumstances, or about how things might be in the future. When we speak this way, we presume that these situations are possible. However, sometimes people make mistakes regarding what is possible or regarding what could have been the case. When what seems possible to a person is not really possible, this person is subject to a modal illusion. With a modal illusion either (i) things seem like they could have been otherwise when they could not have been otherwise or (ii) things seem as if they could not have been otherwise when they could have been otherwise. The most widely discussed cases are instances of the former. Certain impossibilities seem (at least to some people) to be possible. Because of these illusions, there are certain necessary truths (truths which could not have been false) that are mistakenly thought to be contingent. Of particular concern to philosophers working on modal illusions are certain necessary truths that are known a posteriori, and which strike some people as contingent. The most discussed examples are found in Saul Kripke’s Naming and Necessity (1972), the work that sparked the contemporary interest in modal illusions.
While many elementary necessary truths seem to be necessary, the “necessary a posteriori” do not always seem to be so. For example, it is obviously a necessary truth that two is greater than one. It does not seem that things could have been otherwise. On the other hand, it is also a necessary truth that water is composed of H2O (as Kripke (1972) explains), but this might not seem to be necessary. The proposition expressed by the sentence ‘water is H2O’ strikes some people as contingently true because it seems that water could have been composed of something else. However, water could not have been composed of anything other than H2O since that’s what water is. Anything else would not be water. We came to know the composition of water through experience and so one might think that we could have had different experiences that would have shown that water was composed of XYZ, for example, and not H2O. However, the idea that things could have been otherwise and that the proposition is merely contingently false is a modal illusion.
Unless otherwise specified, the terms ‘necessary,’ ‘contingent,’ ‘possible,’ ‘impossible,’ and all of their cognates refer to metaphysical notions. The phrases ‘could have been,’ ‘could not have been,’ and so forth are also used in a metaphysical sense. If p is necessarily true, then p could not have been false. If p is necessarily false, then p could not have been true. The propositions expressed by the sentence ‘2 is greater than 1’ is necessarily true since it could not have been false, for example. If p is contingently true, then although p is true, it could have been false. For example, the proposition expressed by the sentence, ‘John McCain lost the 2008 U.S. Presidential election,’ is contingently true since it could have been false. McCain could have won the 2008 election. If p is possible, then either p is true or p is contingently false. The proposition expressed by the sentence ‘McCain won the 2008 election’ is false, but it is possible that McCain could have won the 2008 election.
Certainly, a person can be mistaken about the modal properties of many different types of statements or propositions. A person might mistakenly believe that a contingent truth known a priori is necessarily true. Kripke (1972) gives examples of the “contingent a priori” that may also be illusory. Consider Kripke’s example, ‘stick S is one meter,’ said of the stick used to fix the reference of ‘one meter.’ Kripke points out that ‘stick S is one meter’ is contingent because stick S could have been a different length; it could have been longer or shorter than one meter. Yet, the speaker knows that stick S is one meter a priori because stick S is being used to fix the referent of ‘one meter.’ Before one knows how long the stick actually is, one knows that it is one meter long. It strikes some people as false that stick S could have been longer or shorter than one meter since stick S is fixing the reference of ‘one meter.’ Stick S could have been many lengths, but it could not have been longer than or shorter than one meter since ‘one meter’ refers to whatever length stick S happens to be. Those who are struck by the appearance that stick S could not have been longer or shorter than one meter, are subject to a modal illusion. (However, this does not seem to be a common mistake made regarding Kripke’s examples of the “contingent a priori”. Rather, it seems that when a person doubts the Kripkean examples of the “contingent a priori”, the person believes that these truths are knowable a posteriori. One might argue that while it is necessary that stick S is one meter, one could only have known that through experience.)
There may also be “contingent a posteriori” truths that are thought to be necessary. For example, Kripke (1972, p. 139) points out that it is sometimes mistakenly thought that light could not have existed without being seen as light. “The fact that we identify light in a certain way seems to us to be crucial even though it is not necessary; the intimate connection may create an illusion of necessity.” It is merely contingently true that light is seen as light, but some might think it is necessarily true and that things could not have been otherwise.
Finally, there are certainly necessary a priori truths that strike some people as merely contingently true. Any mistake about what could have been the case or could not have been the case is a modal illusion. However, the most commonly discussed examples of modal illusions are Kripke’s examples of the “necessary a posteriori” and therefore, these will be the focus of this entry. Sections 3 through 8 below provide an overview of the most prominent explanations offered by contemporary philosophers regarding how or why a person subject to a modal illusion of the necessary a posteriori comes to make the mistake.
The following are the three most commonly discussed examples of modal illusions of the “necessary a posteriori”:
(a) Hesperus is Phosphorus.
(b) Water is H2O.
(c) This table is made of wood. (Said of a table originally made of wood.)
The examples above do strike many people as contingent on first consideration. However, the propositions expressed by each of the above sentences are necessary. For example, ‘Hesperus is Phosphorus’ is both necessary and knowable a posteriori. Given that Hesperus is Phosphorus, Hesperus is necessarily Phosphorus since being self-identical is a necessary property (Any object is necessarily identical to itself.) Yet, we came to know that Hesperus is Phosphorus through empirical means. The proposition expressed by the sentence might seem contingent to someone if that person thought that Hesperus could have been distinct from Phosphorus. (b) and (c) are also necessary since composition is a necessary property of an object or substance. But of course, we need empirical evidence to know the composition of water or this table and so both (b) and (c) are a posteriori.
Although (a), (b), and (c) are necessary truths, the following propositions are necessarily false, but may seem to some people to be merely contingently false to some people:
(a1) Hesperus is distinct from Phosphorus.
(b1) Water is XYZ.
(c1) This table is made of ice. (Said of a table originally made of wood.)
It might seem that Hesperus could have been distinct from Phosphorus, that water could have been composed of XYZ, or that this table could have been made of ice. A person might consider this table, think about what it could have been made of and come to the mistaken conclusion that it could have been made of ice and then conclude that the proposition expressed by the sentence ‘this table is made of ice’ is merely contingently false. But of course, this table could not have been made of ice. Given that this table is made of wood, it is necessarily made of wood. Any table made of ice would not be this same table.
Of course, some philosophers deny that these examples are necessary. In that case, there is no modal illusion to explain since what seems contingent is contingent and what seems possible is possible. However, each of the accounts considered below all attempt to explain the illusion in these cases because each of them accepts the Kripkean conclusions about the necessary nature of the above examples.
The correct solution to the problem of modal illusions will have an important impact on many philosophical issues because it is common for philosophical arguments to rely upon thought experiments about what is and is not possible. For example, in the philosophy of mind, some say that they can conceive of mental activity without any physical activity or of a mental entity existing in the absence of a physical entity. Indeed, this was part of Descartes’ argument. Descartes relied on the seeming possibility that his mind or soul could exist without his body. Descartes’ narrator claimed that he could imagine being deceived about having a body, but he could not imagine being deceived about being a thinking being. So it seems that the mind or soul could exist or could have existed without the body. If this is true, then physicalism must be false.
The possibility of a philosophical zombie is often used in arguments against a physical reduction of consciousness. Some people believe that philosophical zombies could have existed. One might imagine a being completely identical in every respect to a human being, however this being is not conscious; there is no mental activity whatsoever. There are no emotions, thoughts, beliefs, fears, desires and so forth even though there are all the corresponding neurological events happening in the body. Moreover, the zombie exhibits all the behaviors of a person with emotions, thoughts, beliefs, fears, desires and so forth. For example, it acts angry when there are the neurological firings in the brain that normally occur when a person experiences anger. However, the zombie does not feel anger; the zombie does not feel anything! If these sorts of creatures could have existed, then mental activity does not supervene on physical activity. All the physical facts would be the same as they actually are but there would be no mental facts.
Another example many dualists use is that many people are struck by the feeling that pain could exist or could have existed without the corresponding physical activity in the body. Some say that they can imagine pain, the sensation, without the correlated neurological, physical activity in the body that occurs whenever a person has pain (call that C-Fiber stimulation). If this represents a genuine metaphysical possibility, then pain and other conscious events are not identical with, or reducible to, physical events.
Dualists use the sort of reasoning in these examples to show that there is no necessary connection between the mental and the physical, as perhaps these are modal illusions. Perhaps zombie worlds, body-less souls, and pain in the absence of C-Fiber stimulation are not really possible. It may be the case that although a philosophical zombie seems possible it is not possible, just as it is the case XYZ-water seems possible, even though it is not possible. In responding to arguments that rely on these appearances of possibility, many physicalists point to the Kripkean examples of the “necessary a posteriori”, arguing that these examples strike many people as contingent even though they are necessary. So even if it is necessary that mental events are physical events and even if it is true that mental events could not have existed without the corresponding physical events, it might seem as though they could have, just as it might seem as though water could have existed without being H2O even though it could not have.
Depending on the correct account of modal illusions, the seeming possibilities of philosophical zombies and of a purely mental world may or may not count as modal illusions. Different explanations of modal illusions have different consequences for the materialist/dualist debate because only some explanations of modal illusions will count zombie worlds and body-less souls as modal illusions.
Some explanations of what modal illusions are contend that the person who is struck by the feeling that things could have been otherwise does not really have an impossible situation in mind. Instead, the situation the person considers is one in which there are similar objects or a similar substance and the situation has been redescribed. This family of accounts, called Similarity Accounts, includes Kripke’s own. According to Kripke, it might seem possible that this (wooden) table could have been made of ice because we claim that we can imagine this table being made of ice. However, Kripke (1972, p. 114) says, “this is not to imagine this table as made of…ice, but to…imagine another table, resembling this one in all the external details made of…ice.” According to Kripke, the intuition that leads a person to conclude that this table could have been made of ice is not an intuition about this table but an intuition about a similar one. The intuition must be redescribed.
Kripke (1972, p. 142) also argues that the necessarily false propositions ((a1), (b1), and (c1)) could not have been true but some “appropriate corresponding qualitative statement” for each is true. Kripke (1972, p. 143) claims that the sentence, ‘two distinct bodies might have occupied in the morning and the evening, respectively, the very positions actually occupied by Hesperus-Phosphorus-Venus’ is true and should replace the “inaccurate statement that Hesperus might have turned out not to be Phosphorus”. It is unclear whether Kripke wants to maintain that the person subject to the modal illusion really has that corresponding statement in mind or whether he simply wants to maintain that this corresponding statement should replace the false statement the person does have in mind. In either case, Kripke adopts a Similarity Account approach in saying that the person has the false belief because she considers a situation in which some planet similar to Hesperus is distinct from some planet similar to Phosphorus – and not a situation in which Hesperus is not Phosphorus. Similarity Accounts argue that if Hesperus could not have been distinct from Phosphorus, then when a person claims to believe that they could have been distinct, it cannot be because she has imagined a scenario or situation in which they are distinct since there is no such possible scenario or situation.
Kripke goes on to ague that there is no similar explanation about the belief that pain could have existed in the absence of C-Fiber stimulation. One can imagine that pain could have existed in the absence of C-Fiber stimulation; there is no redescription necessary because there is no other feeling that is very much like pain that the person imagines. To be a pain is to be felt as a pain, according to Kripke, and so if we imagine the sensation of pain without C-Fiber stimulation, the sensation we imagine must be pain – otherwise, wha would the similar phenomenon be if not pain?
The appearance of pain without C-Fiber stimulation is not like the appearance of water without hydrogen and oxygen, according to Kripke. It is not true that to be water is to be experienced as water. A person can have all the experiences of water and yet the substance could be something else. When one imagines water composed of XYZ, according to these accounts, the person has imagined this similar substance – one that is experienced as water but is not water. However, when one imagines pain existing in the absence of C-Fiber stimulation, there is no phenomenon similar to pain that the person really imagines. One cannot have all the experiences of pain without there being pain. So Similarity Accounts are unable to explain the false intuition that pain could have existed in the absence of C-Fiber stimulation because this intuition is not false and so not a modal illusion.
According to Similarity Accounts, the reason a person believes that something impossible could have been the case is because she imagines a situation that could have been the case for some similar objects or substances. It might seem that water could have been composed of XYZ because a person might imagine some substance very similar to water in all qualitative respects, but this substance will not really be water.
Consider a true modal belief, such as the belief that John McCain could have won the 2008 U.S. Presidential election. Normally, we would say that this is a belief regarding John McCain himself and not someone similar to John McCain in the relevant respects. Indeed, this is what Kripke wants to hold about true modal beliefs. Kripke (1972, p. 44) writes, “When you ask whether it is necessary or contingent that Nixon won the election, you are asking the intuitive question whether in some counterfactual situation this man would in fact have lost the election.” He adamantly opposes the idea that the intuition is about some man similar to Nixon, yet he claims that the intuition that this (wooden) table might have been made of ice is not about this table. There may be a reason to explain true and false modal intuitions in this non-uniform way, but without an argument, we have no reason to claim that our false modal intuitions are about objects similar to the objects we claim they are about while our true modal intuitions are about the very objects we claim they are about.
Such a theory is also non-uniform in how it would be extended to treat false non-modal beliefs. The belief that New York City is the capital of New York State is a false non-modal belief. (It is a false belief, yet the belief is not at all about what could have been the case.) If a Similarity Account were extended to explain how or why a person has false beliefs more generally, the account would say that the person comes to this belief because he has an intuition that some city, similar to New York City in the relevant respects, is the capital of New York State. This is clearly an implausible explanation of such a false belief. We have no reason to believe that our common false beliefs stem from true beliefs about similar objects.
Now consider a necessary falsehood that a person mistakenly believes is true. Any mathematical falsehood would count. The mathematical falsehood that 18 squared is 314 (it is actually 324) is necessarily false; it could not have been true, but someone might mistakenly believe it is true. If a Similarity Account were extended to treat false beliefs more generally, the account would say that the person who believes that 18 squared is 314 does not really have 18 in mind but some number similar to 18 in the relevant respects. This is what the theory would say to explain any false mathematical beliefs. Because many (if not all) Similarity Accounts argue that one can never imagine impossibilities (which is Barcan Marcus’ claim in “Rationality and Believing the Impossible” (1983)), then no one could ever believe that a mathematical falsehood either could have been true or even is true. But clearly, we are capable of believing mathematical falsehoods.
In many occurrences of modal illusions, a person will come to realize that the proposition expressed by the sentence is necessary and will still be struck by the feeling that things could have been otherwise. As Alex Byrne (2007, p. 13) says, “A modal illusion, properly so-called, would require the appearance that p is possible in the presence of the conviction that p is impossible.” For example, a person who has read Kripke many times and acknowledges that water is necessarily H2O may still be struck by the appearance that water could have been XYZ. Call this a “person in the know.” A Similarity Account cannot explain the modal illusion in these cases. The subject in the know at once believes that water is necessarily composed of H2O and is struck by the feeling that things could have been otherwise. A Similarity Account would say that the intuition is that some other substance, similar to water in the relevant respects. The sentence ‘water could have been XYZ’ needs to be replaced.
Our subject in the know might say, “I know that it is impossible that p but it still sure seems like p could have been the case.” A Similarity Account might argue that what our subject really means is that “I know that it is impossible that p* but it still sure seems like p* could have been the case.” In that case, the account would need to explain why it is p* she has in mind in both instances. But more importantly, the account would need to explain this new illusion: if p* is possible and it strikes her as possible, why does she claim to know that it is impossible that p*? p* is possible and so according to this type of explanation, she must have a different proposition in mind. Might that be p**?
Similarity Accounts also cannot explain the illusion that this very table could have been made of ice. Imagine a person points to a wooden table and claims, “this very table is made of wood, but it could have been made of ice.” The person cannot be more specific about which table he means to consider; it is this very one in front of him, one that is made of wood. It would be absurd to say that the person is considering some other similar table that is made of ice. Our subject has said that the table he means to consider is made of wood. He could even have said, “It seems to me that any wooden table could have been made of ice.” Similarity Accounts fail to explain this illusion as well. It cannot be that our subject means to consider a specific table but mistakenly considers some similar one. He is making the claim about any wooden table, whatsoever. What is he considering in this case if the Similarity Account is correct?
Another type of account that seeks to explain how modal illusions of the “necessary a posteriori” arise makes use of the two-dimensional semantic framework proposed by philosophers such as David Chalmers and Frank Jackson. This sort of approach aims to explain how a person might mistakenly think that a necessary proposition is contingent. As opposed to a traditional view of reference, the two-dimensional semantic framework proposes that there are two intensions of certain words. According to one common view of reference, a concept determines a function from possible worlds to referents. The function is an “intension” and it determines the “extension”. Two-Dimensionalism proposes that sometimes there are two intensions because often there is no single intension that can do all the work a meaning needs to do.
For example, Chalmers and Jackson explain that ‘water’ has two intensions. Under the common view of reference, the concept “water” determines a function from possible worlds to water/H2O. The function is an intension and determines that the extension of ‘water’ is always water/ H2O. But according to the two-dimensional framework, there are two different intensions, two different functions from possible worlds to extensions. While the secondary intension of ‘water’ always picks out water/ H2O, the primary intension picks out the “watery stuff” of a world – the clear, drinkable, liquid that fills the lakes, rivers, and oceans in a possible world. In certain possible worlds, that stuff is composed of XYZ and so it might seem as if the proposition expressed by the sentence ‘water is XYZ’ is merely contingently false. That is an illusion caused by conflating the primary and secondary intensions of ‘water.’ The primary intension is meant to capture the “cognitive significance” of the term, which is what a person subject to a modal illusion must have in mind.
Certain sentences thus express two different propositions depending on the two different intensions of the terms in the sentence. According to Two-Dimensionalists, the primary proposition determines the epistemic property of the sentence (whether it is a priori or a posteriori) while the secondary proposition determines the modal property of the sentence (whether it is necessary or contingent). With any example of the Kripkean “necessary a posteriori”, the primary proposition is a posteriori but not necessary, while the secondary proposition is necessary but not a posteriori. The secondary proposition in this case, that water is H2O, is necessary in the standard Kripkean sense, but it is not a posteriori because the secondary intension always picks out H2O in any possible world; we do not need to do empirical investigation to know that water is water. The primary proposition is not necessary since the watery stuff of a world could be composed of H2O, XYZ, or something else. However, it is a posteriori. We need empirical evidence to know what water is composed of in any world.
Jackson (1997, p.76) holds that the secondary proposition is “normally meant by unadorned uses of the phrase ‘proposition expressed by a sentence’” and Chalmers (1996, p. 64) too says that the secondary proposition “is more commonly seen as the proposition expressed by a statement.” Therefore, one might say that the proposition expressed by ‘Hesperus is Phosphorus’ is necessary. If it seems contingent to a person, that is a modal illusion and the illusion is explained by the fact that the primary proposition is not necessary. According to this sort of account, when a person is subject to a modal illusion and concludes that a necessary truth is contingent, she does not consider the proposition expressed. Rather, the sentence misdescribes the situation she is considering. Her mistake is not simply in concluding that the proposition is contingent but in reporting what proposition she is considering. Two-Dimensionalist Accounts have this feature in common with Similarity Accounts: the person subject to the modal illusion does not have some impossible situation in mind. The situation she has in mind is not described correctly.
Chalmers uses his Two-Dimensionalist explanation of modal illusions to argue for dualism. According to Chalmers, pain in the absence of C-Fiber stimulation is not a modal illusion. In The Conscious Mind, Chalmers (1996, p. 133) says, “with consciousness, the primary and secondary intensions coincide.” The primary intension of ‘pain’ picks out painful sensations, feelings experienced as pain, but the secondary intension of ‘pain’ also picks out painful sensations, feelings experienced as pain, since what it means to be a pain is to be experienced as a pain. It does not always pick out C-Fiber stimulation. So, painy-stuff cannot be misdescribed by the word ‘pain’ since all that it is to be a pain is to be felt as a pain. The secondary proposition – the proposition that backs the necessity or contingency of a sentence – expressed by ‘pain is C-Fiber stimulation’ is contingent. The proposition could have been false since the secondary intension of ‘pain’ picks out something other than C-Fiber stimulation in some possible worlds. The person who believes that the proposition expressed by the sentence ‘pain is C-Fiber stimulation’ is contingently true has not made a mistake.
While Jackson once used his account of modal illusions to defend a dualist theory, he now supports physicalism. Given his physicalist commitments, Jackson should hold that a person who is struck by the feeling that pain could have existed in the absence of C-Fiber stimulation is under a modal illusion. Given his Two-Dimensionalist commitments, however, it is hard to know what he would say to explain the illusion. A Two-Dimensionalist Account of the illusion that pain could have existed in the absence of C-Fiber stimulation should say that the person who believes this imagines a situation in which the primary intension of ‘pain’ picks out something just like pain, but is not pain. It is unclear how a Two-Dimensionalist could make this sort of approach work since, as Chalmers (1996, p. 133) and Kripke (1972, p. 151) have noted, ‘pain’ always picks out pain and not painy-stuff. There is no painy-stuff that is not pain. But perhaps what Jackson wants to argue is that while we believe we are imagining a world in which there is pain and no C-Fiber stimulation, there really must be C-Fiber stimulation in that situation.
Consider again the person in the know who is subject to a modal illusion. Two-Dimensionalist accounts fail to explain the illusion in these cases. Chalmers argues that it might seem as if the proposition expressed by the sentence ‘water is XYZ’ is contingently false because the sentence is used to express something true in some possible worlds. Chalmers (2007, p. 67) says that the person subject to the modal illusion considers “a conceivable situation – a small part of a world” in which watery stuff (and not water) is XYZ but the subject misdescribes the situation she is considering using the term ‘water.’ According to Chalmers (1996, p. 367, footnote 32), there is a “gap between what one finds conceivable at first glance and what is really conceivable.” It might seem conceivable that water could have been XYZ, but it is not really conceivable since it is impossible. While this may be a plausible explanation in the typical cases of modal illusions, it is an implausible explanation for what happens in the case of our subject in the know. This person knows enough to recognize that there might be a situation in which the watery stuff at a world is composed of XYZ and thus makes the primary proposition expressed by the sentence ‘water is XYZ’ true, but she does not have that proposition or situation in mind. Rather, it strikes her as possible – even though she believes it is not possible – that water could have been XYZ and that the proposition expressed (the secondary proposition) is contingently false. The person in the know would explicitly consider the secondary proposition and it might still strike her as merely contingently false.
The Two-Dimensionalist explanations also fail to explain modal illusions involving ‘This table is made of wood’ or other sentences that use demonstratives. Imagine our subject is asked whether it seems that this table could have been made of ice and a certain wooden table is pointed to. If it strikes our subject as possible, she is subject to a modal illusion. Given that the table is made of wood, it could not have been made of anything else. According to a Two-Dimensionalist explanation of modal illusions, the reason it might seem as if this table could have been made of ice is that our subject has imagined a scenario in which the primary proposition expressed by the sentence ‘this table is made of ice’ is true. It is unclear what scenario or possible world would verify the sentence. If there is one table referred to when our interrogator uses the phrase ‘this table’ and points to a specific table, what might the primary intention of ‘this table’ pick out if not this very one?
Nathan Salmon (2005, p. 234) argues that in using the demonstrative and ostensively referring to the table, “I make no reference – explicit or implicit, literal or metaphorical, direct or allusive – to any … table other than the one I am pointing to.” There is no similar table our subject is asked to consider. It is stipulated when she is asked whether it seems that this very table could have been made of ice that she is to consider this very table. When asked to imagine this very table being made of ice, either one can or one cannot. If one can, the object of belief is this very table and one is subject to a modal illusion. If one comes to the conclusion that this table could have been made of ice, one has come to a conclusion about this very table. It is an incorrect conclusion, but that doesn’t mean that it wasn’t this table the person considered when reasoning to this mistaken conclusion.
Finally, consider another less discussed example of the “necessary a posteriori”. Kripke (1972) argues that every person necessarily has the parents that he or she has. Still, it seems to many people as if other people could have been their parents. If it seems to a person that she could have had different parents, that person must be subject to a modal illusion. According to Two-Dimensionalist Accounts, the reason a person makes this mistake is because she imagines a possible world in which someone very much like herself has parents other than the ones she actually has. If our subject, for example believes that ‘I am the daughter of the Queen of England,’ is merely contingently false, it is because she considers a world that would verify the primary proposition. The primary proposition, ostensibly, is true in some possible worlds, worlds in which someone very much like the speaker is the daughter of the Queen of England.
It seems very unlikely that a person would mean to imagine a world in which she is the daughter of the Queen of England and instead imagines a world in which someone just like her is the daughter of the Queen of England. It seems strange that any one would mistakenly and unknowingly use the word ‘I’ to refer to someone other than himself or herself. Furthermore, Chalmers (2006) argues that what makes the primary proposition true in certain possible worlds is not that the speakers of that world use the terms in a certain way. The way they use the terms are irrelevant. We are concerned with how we use the terms and what those terms would pick out in other possible worlds. So in this case, it is not because there is some doppelganger of our subject who uses ‘I’ to refer to herself that the sentence ‘I am the daughter of the Queen of England’ is true. It is a matter of how our subject uses the term and what the word ‘I’ would pick out in this other possible world. But given that our subject could not have been the daughter of the Queen of England (since she is not), it is unclear to whom ‘I’ refers in this possible world if not the subject herself.
Chalmers (1996) explains that the “necessary a posteriori” express two propositions; one is necessary and the other is a posteriori but not necessary. Chalmers (1996, p. 64) claims that a statement is necessarily true in the first (a priori) sense if the associated primary proposition holds in all centered possible worlds (that is, if the statement would turn out to express a truth in any context of utterance). A statement is necessarily true in the a posteriori sense if the associated secondary proposition holds in all possible worlds (that is, if the statement as uttered in the actual world is true in all counterfactual worlds).
A statement such as ‘Hesperus is Phosphorus,’ for example, is not necessary in the first, a priori, sense because the primary proposition does not hold in all possible worlds – it does not express a truth in any context of utterance. However, it is necessary in the secondary sense since the secondary proposition holds in all possible worlds. The statement, as uttered in the actual world, is true in all counterfactual worlds. This is because the secondary proposition expresses something like “Venus-Hesperus-Phosphorus is Venus-Hesperus-Phosphorus.” Chalmers says that that this secondary proposition is not a posteriori, however. The primary proposition is a posteriori but not necessary, while the secondary proposition is necessary but not a posteriori. If it is not a posteriori, it would be either a priori or not knowable. This example seems to perhaps be a priori since it would not take any empirical investigation to know that Venus is Venus and certainly, this is fact that we can know.
But consider a statement such as ‘water is H2O.’ This statement is necessary in the secondary sense because the secondary proposition holds in all possible worlds. The statement, as uttered in the actual world, is true in all counterfactual worlds since the secondary intension of ‘water’ always picks out H2O. But the secondary proposition is not a posteriori. Then it is either a priori or it is not knowable at all. Since we of course can know that water is H2O, it must be knowable a priori, but it is unclear how in the world a person could know the composition of water without empirical evidence.
The objection can also be made using ‘This table is made of wood.’ The secondary proposition expressed by this sentence (said of a table actually originally made of wood) is necessary in the secondary sense because the sentence, as uttered in this world, is true in all counterfactual worlds. But again, the secondary proposition is not both necessary and a posteriori. Either it is not knowable at all or else it is knowable a priori. Since we can of course know that this table is made of wood, that must be something we can know a priori, but it is even more implausible that we can know that fact a priori than it is plausible that we can know the composition of water a priori. How could we know what any table is made of without empirical evidence?
Yet Two-Dimensionalist Accounts rely on this idea to explain modal illusions of the “necessary a posteriori”. It is because one proposition is a posteriori and not necessary while the other proposition is necessary and not a posteriori that we make these modal mistakes. The proposition expressed (the necessary one) may seem contingent because the primary proposition is not necessary and because the primary proposition is not knowable a priori, one might imagine that it could have been false since one can imagine a possible world in which it is false. But if the secondary proposition is not a priori either, then we have no need to posit a primary proposition to explain the illusion.
Finally, Two-Dimensionalist Accounts assume that a person cannot imagine impossibilities, but it seems quite plausible that we can and often do imagine or believe impossibilities. We believe mathematical falsehoods, for example, which are surely impossible. Two-Dimensionalists maintain that the scenario imagined has been misdescribed and it is not an impossible scenario that the person believes to be possible. But if a person can believe that the mathematically impossible is possible, it is a natural extension to say that a person can believe other impossibilities are possible, including metaphysical impossible scenarios such as that water could have been XYZ.
Chalmers (1996, p. 97) recognizes that some mathematical falsehoods are conceivable in a sense; both Goldbach’s Conjecture and its negation are conceivable “in some sense” but “the false member of the pair will not qualify as conceivable” in Chalmers’ usage since there is no scenario that verifies the false member of the pair. Call Goldbach’s Conjecture g and its negation ¬g. When a person claims to believe ¬g, assuming g is true, the belief must be misdescribed. Chalmers (1996, p. 67) says that although one might claim to believe that Goldbach’s Conjecture is false, he is only “conceiving of a world where mathematicians announce it to be so; but if in fact Goldbach’s Conjecture is true, then one is misdescribing this world; it is really a world in which the Conjecture is true and some mathematicians make a mistake.” This might be a plausible explanation of what is going on in the Goldbach case since, at this time, we do not know which is true and which is false, but consider any very complicated mathematical proposition that is known to be true. If someone claims to believe it is false, Chalmers would have to argue that the person has misdescribed the world imagined. This is clearly not the case in most occurrences of false mathematical beliefs. The mathematician who has erred does not imagine a situation in which the complicated mathematical proposition is “announced” to be false; he believes it is false. Two-Dimensionalist Accounts cannot explain these common mathematical false beliefs.
Rather than invoking a substitute object of thought and saying that there is only one sense of ‘possibility’ relevant to the discussion, another approach to modal illusions would be to maintain that there is only one object of thought under consideration but different senses of ‘possibility’ are in play. One way to do this is to hold that it is possible that water is XYZ, for example, in some non-metaphysical sense. Such Possibility Accounts deny the assumptions made by Similarity Accounts and Two-Dimensionalist accounts that one cannot believe the impossible and that when one claims to believe the impossible, one has misdescribed or redescribed one’s belief. Possibility Accounts argue that the person does have in mind some impossible world, or at least some impossible situation, and mistakenly believes that it is possible or could have obtained. The reason the impossible situation might seem possible is because it is possible in some other sense.
There are many occurrences of modal illusions in which there is no similar substance or object that can serve as the object of thought and explain the illusion. Possibility Accounts deny that the false modal intuition is about some other object or substance and instead claim that the belief is about a metaphysically impossible situation and that the reason it strikes many people as possible is that it is possible in an epistemic sense. Of course there are many definitions of ‘epistemic possibility.’ According to some theorists, p is epistemically possible if p is true for all one knows. According to others, p is epistemically possible if p is not known to be false. And according to others, p is epistemically possible if p cannot be known to be false a priori. It is some version of this last definition that many theorists rely on to explain modal illusions of the “necessary a posteriori” using a Possibility Account. Since all of the examples discussed here are necessary and a posteriori, they cannot be known to be false a priori. Therefore, each example is epistemically possible. Since each example is epistemically possible, it might seem to a person that things could have been otherwise even though things could not have been otherwise. The appearance of metaphysical possibility is explained by the epistemic possibility.
This type of account claims that a person subject to a modal illusion can – and usually does – have a metaphysical impossibility in mind, but it also claims that when the person believes the proposition expressed by the sentence ‘Hesperus is distinct from Phosphorus’ is contingently false, the proposition the person thinks is contingently false is the proposition expressed by the sentence and not some other. It is not that she believes that the sentence could have expressed something else and thus could have been true. Rather, she believes of the proposition expressed that it could have been true.
Possibility Accounts are thought to be able to explain those modal illusions that the other two types of accounts cannot explain. For example, when the person in the know says, “I know that it is impossible that p but it still sure seems like p could have been the case,” the Possibility Account argues that the subject can at once know that p is (metaphysically) impossible and be struck by the feeling that p is possible if p is possible in some other sense. Consider, too, the failed attempts to explain the modal illusion that this very table could have been made of ice. If this table could have been made of ice in some other sense, then the reason one might think that it could have been made of ice (in a metaphysical sense) is clear. Possibility accounts then must be able to explain how these impossibilities are possible in some other sense.
Stephen Yablo, a prominent defender of Possibility Accounts of modal illusions, claims that while water could not have been XYZ in a metaphysical sense, water could have been XYZ in a “conceptual” sense: if p is conceptually possible, then p could have turned out to be the case. Yablo explains that if p is metaphysically possible then p could have turned out to have been the case. There are certain propositions that while metaphysically impossible are conceptually possible. Such a proposition p could not have turned out to have been the case even though it could have turned out to be the case. This explains modal illusions of the “necessary a posteriori”. All of the examples so far considered are conceptually possible even though they are metaphysically impossible. (a1), (b1), and (c1) could have turned out to be so.
Yablo insists that conceptually possibility should not be reduced to the a priori, but without reducing it, ‘conceptual possibility’ could be cashed out in any number of ways. For instance, consider again Goldbach’s Conjecture. In some sense, either g or ¬g “could turn out to be the case” since we don’t know which is true. But in another sense, only g or ¬g could turn out to be the case since, if g is false, it is not only necessarily false, but logically impossible. Even though we don’t know right now whether g or ¬g is true, only one could turn out to be true in a certain sense. It is not clear whether or not something such as Goldbach’s conjecture could turn out to be true.
On the other hand, Yablo (1993, pp. 29-30) argues that it is conceptually possible that “there should be a town whose resident barber shaved all and only the town’s non-shavers.” This means that it could have turned out to be the case that there is a town whose resident barber shaves all and only the town’s non-shavers. However, it certainly could not have turned out to be the case that there is a town whose resident barber shaves all and only the non-shavers. The example is different than Goldbach’s conjecture. In that case, the necessary falsehood is unknown, so in some sense, the necessary falsehood could turn out to be the case. In the barber case, however, we know that the proposition is false, so it could not turn out to be true. And if it could not turn out to be the case, then such a town is not conceptually possible, contrary to Yablo’s claims.
Other Possibility Accounts avoid this problem by defining ‘epistemic possibility’ or ‘conceptual possibility’ in another way. For example, Scott Soames says that p is epistemically possible if and only if p is a way the world could conceivably be and that p is a way the world could conceivably be if we need evidence to rule out that it is the way the world is. For example, it is epistemically possible that water is XYZ because it is conceivable that the world is such that water is composed of XYZ. We do need evidence to rule out that this is the way the world is because we need evidence to know the composition of water. For all instances of the “necessary a posteriori”, one does need evidence to rule out metaphysical impossibilities that are epistemically possible. On the other hand, one does not need evidence to rule out that the world is such that there is a town whose resident barber shaves all and only the town’s non-shavers. This is not epistemically possible and not an example of the “necessary a posteriori”.
According to the schema Soames offers to identify instances of the “necessary a posteriori”, (a) is not an example of the “necessary a posteriori”. Soames argues that the proposition expressed by the sentence ‘Hesperus is Phosphorus’ is necessary, but it is not a posteriori since the proposition expressed is something like “Venus is Venus.” Clearly we do not need empirical evidence to know that is true and we do not need empirical evidence to rule out that the world is such that Venus is not Venus (or that Hesperus is not Phosphorus). If we do not need evidence to rule out that this is the way the world is, then it is not epistemically possible.
The problem with Soames’ account is that we did need evidence to know that Hesperus is Phosphorus. The ancients who made this discovery did not do it from the armchair; they needed empirical evidence. Soames (forthcoming, p. 16) claims that “the function of empirical evidence needed for knowledge that Hesperus is Phosphorus is not to rule out possible world-states in which the proposition is false…evidence is needed to rule out possible states in which we use the sentence … to express something false.” The ancients though did not need empirical evidence to rule out worlds in which the sentence is used to express something false. They needed evidence to know that Hesperus and Phosphorus were the same.
Furthermore, it seems that Soames could argue similarly regarding the other two example: Soames could say that we did not need evidence to rule out a possible world-state in which the proposition that water is H2O is false, but we needed evidence to rule out possible states in which we use the sentence ‘water is H2O’ to express something false. This is similar to what the Two-Dimensionalists argue, although Soames gives rather forceful and convincing arguments against Two-Dimensionalism himself. He does not adopt this strategy for either of the other two examples. Although Soames’ general explanation is promising, it is a problem that he rejects the explanation for one important example of modal illusions of the “necessary a posteriori”.
A Possibility Account might say that a philosophical zombie is epistemically possible but not metaphysically possible or that pain in the absence of C-Fiber stimulation is epistemically possible but not metaphysically possible. This is a common position taken by those who adopt a Possibility account. Chalmers (1996, p. 137) explains: “On this position, “zombie worlds” may correctly describe the world that we are conceiving, even according to secondary intensions. It is just that the world is not metaphysically possible.” Chalmers (1996, p. 131) claims that this is “by far the most common strategy used by materialists” and recognizes Bigelow and Pargetter (1990) and Byrne (1993) among that camp.
However, not all Possibility Accounts defend this view in the way Chalmers describes. According to some Possibility Accounts, the reason the examples of the “necessary a posteriori” strike some people as contingent is because one cannot know that their negations are false a priori. Because we cannot know that the propositions expressed by the sentences ‘philosophical zombies exist’ and ‘pain is not C-Fiber stimulation’ are false a priori, these are epistemic possibilities. Since they are epistemically possible, it might seem to some people that they are metaphysically possible even if they are not – even if physicalism is true.
On the other hand, one could adopt a Possibility Account and deny physicalism. In that case, one could allow that philosophical zombies and pain in the absence of C-Fiber stimulation are both epistemically possible and metaphysically possible. One could adopt a Possibility Account of modal illusions but deny that the dualist intuitions count as modal illusions. Accordingly, the propositions expressed by the sentences ‘philosophical zombies do not exist,’ and ‘pain is C-Fiber stimulation’ would not count as genuine instances of the “necessary a posteriori”.
There is a common view that conceivability implies possibility. Gendler and Hawthorne (2007) discuss this alleged implication in detail in their introduction to Conceivability and Possibility. According to this view it cannot both be true that water could not have been XYZ and that someone might conceive that water is XYZ. If conceivability implies possibility and a person conceives that water is or could have been XYZ, then it must be possible that water could have been XYZ. However, given Kripke’s convincing arguments, most will reject this conclusion. On the other hand, if conceivability implies possibility and water could not have been XYZ, then a person who says she conceives that water is or could have been XYZ must not really be conceiving what she claims to conceive. This motivates some who adopt a view claiming the belief needs to be redescribed. Given the objection to such accounts – including the strong objection that we do believe impossibilities – it seems equally objectionable to claim that the person is not really conceiving of water when she claims to conceive that water might have been XYZ.
There does not seem to be an independent reason to maintain the link between conceivability and possibility. If conceivability does not imply possibility, then it might be the case that while water could not have been XYZ, one might conceive that it could have been. If conceivability does not imply possibility, some version of a Possibility Account would have more force. While there does not seem to be an independent reason to maintain the link between conceivability and possibility, there are many reasons to reject it. First of all, our modal intuitions are not infallible, so we would have no reason to believe that whatever seems possible is possible. To think so is to give more credit than is due to our modal intuitions. If our modal intuitions were infallible, we would be unable to explain other modal errors that we make, such as our mathematical errors. Secondly, modal justification itself is not something philosophers have come to agree upon. We are still not sure what justifies our modal knowledge and so we cannot hold, at this time, that our modal intuitions always count as knowledge. Finally, our a posteriori justification in general is fallible. Since this is so, we have good reason to think that our a posteriori justification when it comes to modal truths might also be fallible.
Chalmers objects to Possibility Accounts, or what he calls “two-senses views,” because he believes such accounts are committed to incorporating impossible worlds into their metaphysics. If p is impossible, yet epistemically possible, it must be true in some possible world, but if p is metaphysically impossible, it is true in no possible world. Therefore, it seems that there are metaphysically impossible worlds in which p is true or at which p is true. The idea of countenancing world that are impossible strikes many philosophers as highly problematic.
However, not all possibility accounts, or two-senses views, are committed to impossible worlds. If the definition of ‘possibility’ relies on possible worlds, this might be a valid concern, but not all Possibility Accounts rely on such a definition. For example, Yablo makes no mention of possible worlds. According to Yablo, p is conceptually possible if p is a way the world could have turned out to be. Yablo (1996) insists that a way the world could have turned out to be is not a possible world; it is not an entity at all. A way the world could have been or could be is analogous to a way one feels or a way a bird might build a nest and when one talks about a way a bird might build a nest, one does not make reference to a thing.
Perhaps the most forceful objection to a Possibility Account is that it presumes there is some sort of primitive notion of metaphysical modality that is left undefined, one that cannot be identified or analyzed in non-modal terms. Those who use the terms ‘metaphysically necessary’ or ‘metaphysically possible’ have only explained how they use the term, but no one has given an analysis of what these terms mean. The question arises as to what may be meant by ‘water is necessarily H2O’, as it seems to beg the question, “If this does not just reduce to possible worlds or to the a priori, then what does it reduce to, if anything?”
Some have argued that these notions are vague and that, although there are examples of what most people mean by metaphysically necessary and possible, there is no clear way to decide what counts as metaphysically possible in the problematic cases, including cases that have the dualists’ concerns at their center.
This is a strong objection but perhaps not an insurmountable one. While there are no clear definitions of these terms in the literature, most philosophers who use them have a basic understanding of what they mean. There is some intuitive sense that philosophers, following Kripke, have in mind. Furthermore, philosopher and non-philosophers alike do think that, although things are one way, some things could have been otherwise. It is this notion that philosophers are referring to when they use the term ‘metaphysical possibility.’ Kripke himself recognizes that there are no good definitions for these terms and that there are no necessary and sufficient conditions spelled out for either metaphysical necessity or metaphysical possibility. Still, we have a basic understanding of these notions. If p is necessary, p could not have been otherwise and ¬p could not have been true. If p is false but possible then p could have been the case even though it is not actually the case.
Buffalo State College
Last updated: June 20, 2010 | Originally published: June 20, 2010
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