Michel de Montaigne is widely appreciated as one of the most important figures in the late French Renaissance, both for his literary innovations as well as for his contributions to philosophy. As a writer, he is credited with having developed a new form of literary expression, the essay, a brief and admittedly incomplete treatment of a topic germane to human life that blends philosophical insights with historical anecdotes and autobiographical details, all unapologetically presented from the author’s own personal perspective. As a philosopher, he is best known for his skepticism, which profoundly influenced major figures in the history of philosophy such as Descartes and Pascal.
All of his literary and philosophical work is contained in his Essays, which he began to write in 1572 and first published in 1580 in the form of two books. Over the next twelve years leading up to his death, he made additions to the first two books and completed a third, bringing the work to a length of about one thousand pages. While Montaigne made numerous additions to the book over the years, he never deleted or removed any material previously published, in an effort to represent accurately the changes that he underwent both as a thinker and as a person over the twenty years during which he wrote. These additions add to the unsystematic character of the book, which Montaigne himself claimed included many contradictions. It is no doubt due to the unsystematic nature of the Essays that Montaigne received relatively little attention from Anglo-American philosophers in the twentieth century. Nonetheless, in recent years he has been held out by many as an important figure in the history of philosophy not only for his skepticism, but also for his treatment of topics such as the self, moral relativism, politics, and the nature of philosophy.
Michel Eyquem de Montaigne was born at the Château Montaigne, located thirty miles east of Bordeaux, in 1533. His father, Pierre Eyquem, was a wealthy merchant of wine and fish whose grandfather had purchased in 1477 what was then known as the Montaigne estate. Montaigne’s mother, Antoinette de Loupes de Villeneuve, came from a wealthy marrano family that had settled in Toulouse at the end of the 15th century. Montaigne describes Eyquem as “the best father that ever was,” and mentions him often in the Essays. Montaigne’s mother, on the other hand, is almost totally absent from her son’s book. Amidst the turbulent religious atmosphere of sixteenth century France, Eyquem and his wife raised their children Catholic. Michel, the eldest of eight children, remained a member of the Catholic Church his entire life, though three of his siblings became Protestants.
Eyquem, who had become enamored of novel pedagogical methods that he had discovered as a soldier in Italy, directed Montaigne’s unusual education. As an infant, Montaigne was sent to live with a poor family in a nearby village so as to cultivate in him a natural devotion to “that class of men that needs our help.” When Montaigne returned as a young child to live at the château, Eyquem arranged that Michel awake every morning to music. He then hired a German tutor to teach Montaigne to speak Latin as his native tongue. Members of the household were forbidden to speak to the young Michel in any language other than Latin, and, as a result, Montaigne reports that he was six years old before he learned any French. It was at this time that Eyquem sent Montaigne to attend the prestigious Collège de Guyenne, where he studied under the Scottish humanist George Buchanan.
The details of Montaigne’s life between his departure from the Collège at age thirteen and his appointment as a Bordeaux magistrate in his early twenties are largely unknown. He is thought to have studied the law, perhaps at Toulouse. In any case, by 1557 he had begun his career as a magistrate, first in the Cour des Aides de Périgueux, a court with sovereign jurisdiction in the region over cases concerning taxation, and later in the Bordeaux Parlement, one of the eight parlements that together composed the highest court of justice in France. There he encountered Etienne La Boétie, with whom he formed an intense friendship that lasted until La Boétie’s sudden death in 1563. Years later, the bond he shared with La Boétie would inspire one of Montaigne’s best-known essays, “Of Friendship.” Two years after La Boétie’s death Montaigne married Françoise de la Chassaigne. His relationship with his wife seems to have been amiable but cool; it lacked the spiritual and intellectual connection that Montaigne had shared with La Boétie. Their marriage produced six children, but only one survived infancy: a daughter named Léonor.
In 1570 Montaigne sold his office in the Parlement, and retreated to his château, where in 1571 he announced his retirement from public life. Less than a year later he began to write his Essays. Retirement did not mean isolation, however. Montaigne made many trips to court in Paris between 1570 and 1580, and it seems that at some point between 1572 and 1576 he attempted to mediate between the ultra-conservative Catholic Henri de Guise and the Protestant Henri, king of Navarre. Nonetheless, he devoted a great deal of time to writing, and in 1580 published the first two books of his Essays.
Soon thereafter Montaigne departed on a trip to Rome via Germany and Switzerland. Montaigne recorded the trip in the Journal de Voyage, which was published for the first time in the 18th century, not having been intended for publication by Montaigne himself. Among the reasons for his trip were his hope of finding relief from his kidney stones in the mineral baths of Germany, his desire to see Rome, and his general love of travel. The trip lasted about fifteen months, and would have lasted longer had he not been called back to Bordeaux in 1581 to serve as mayor.
Montaigne’s first two-year term as mayor was mostly uneventful. His second term was much busier, as the death of the Duke of Anjou made the Protestant Henri de Navarre heir to the French throne. This resulted in a three-way conflict between the reigning Catholic King Henri III, Henri de Guise, leader of the conservative Catholic League, and Henri de Navarre. Bordeaux, which remained Catholic during the religious wars that engulfed France for most of the 16th century, found itself in close proximity to Navarre’s Protestant forces in southwest France. As a mayor loyal to the king, Montaigne worked successfully to keep the peace among the interested parties, protecting the city from seizure by the League while also maintaining diplomatic relations with Navarre. As a moderate Catholic, he was well-regarded by both the king and Navarre, and after his tenure as mayor Montaigne continued to serve as a diplomatic link between the two parties, at one point in 1588 traveling to Paris on a secret diplomatic mission for Navarre.
In 1588, Montaigne published the fifth edition of the Essays, including a third book with material he had produced in the previous two years. It is a copy of this fifth edition (known as the “Bordeaux Copy”), including the marginalia penned by Montaigne himself in the years leading up to his death, which in the eyes of most scholars constitutes the definitive text of the Essays today. The majority of the last three years of his life were spent at the château. When Navarre succeeded Henri III as king of France in 1589, he invited Montaigne to join him at court, but Montaigne was too ill to travel. His body was failing him, and he died less than two years later, on September 13, 1592.
All of Montaigne’s philosophical reflections are found in his Essays. To contemporary readers, the term “essay” denotes a particular literary genre. But when Montaigne gives the title Essays to his book, he does not intend to designate the literary genre of the work so much as to refer to the spirit in which it is written and the nature of the project out of which it emerges. The term is taken from the French verb “essayer,” which Montaigne employs in a variety of senses throughout his book, where it carries such meanings as “to attempt,” “to test,” “to exercise,” and “to experiment.” Each of these expressions captures an aspect of Montaigne’s project in the Essays. To translate the title of his book as “Attempts” would capture the modesty of Montaigne’s essays, while to translate it as “Tests” would reflect the fact that he takes himself to be testing his judgment. “Exercises” would communicate the sense in which essaying is a way of working on oneself, while “Experiments” would convey the exploratory spirit of the book.
The Essays is a decidedly unsystematic work. The text itself is composed of 107 chapters or essays on a wide range of topics, including – to name a few – knowledge, education, love, the body, death, politics, the nature and power of custom, and the colonization of the New World. There rarely seems to be any explicit connection between one chapter and the next. Moreover, chapter titles are often only tangentially related to their contents. The lack of logical progression from one chapter to the next creates a sense of disorder that is compounded by Montaigne’s style, which can be described as deliberately nonchalant. Montaigne intersperses reportage of historical anecdotes and autobiographical remarks throughout the book, and most essays include a number of digressions. In some cases the digressions seem to be due to Montaigne’s stream-of-consciousness style, while in others they are the result of his habit of inserting additions (sometimes just a sentence or two, other times a number of paragraphs) into essays years after they were first written. Finally, the nature of Montaigne’s project itself contributes to the disorderly style of his book. Part of that project, he tells us at the outset, is to paint a portrait of himself in words, and for Montaigne, this task is complicated by the conception he has of the nature of the self. In “Of repentance,” for example, he announces that while others try to form man, he simply tells of a particular man, one who is constantly changing:
I cannot keep my subject still. It goes along befuddled and staggering, with a natural drunkenness. I take it in this condition, just as it is at the moment I give my attention to it. I do not portray being: I portray passing…. I may presently change, not only by chance, but also by intention. This is a record of various and changeable occurrences, and of irresolute and, when it so befalls, contradictory ideas: whether I am different myself, or whether I take hold of my subjects in different circumstances and aspects. So, all in all, I may indeed contradict myself now and then; but truth, as Demades said, I do not contradict. (F 610)
Given Montaigne’s expression of this conception of the self as a fragmented and ever-changing entity, it should come as no surprise that we find contradictions throughout the Essays. Indeed, one of the apparent contradictions in Montaigne’s thought concerns his view of the self. While on the one hand he expresses the conception of the self outlined in the passage above, in the very same essay – as if to illustrate the principle articulated above – he asserts that his self is unified by his judgment, which has remained essentially the same his entire life. Such apparent contradictions, in addition to Montaigne’s style and the structure that he gives his book, complicate the task of reading the Essays and have understandably led to diverse interpretations of its contents.
The stated purposes of Montaigne’s essays are almost as diverse as their contents. In addition to the pursuit of self-knowledge, Montaigne also identifies the cultivation of his judgment and the presentation of a new ethical and philosophical figure to the reading public as fundamental goals of his project. There are two components to Montaigne’s pursuit of self-knowledge. The first is the attempt to understand the human condition in general. This involves reflecting on the beliefs, values, and behavior of human beings as represented both in literary, historical, and philosophical texts, and in his own experience. The second is to understand himself as a particular human being. This involves recording and reflecting upon his own idiosyncratic tastes, habits, and dispositions. Thus in the Essays one finds a great deal of historical and autobiographical content, some of which seems arbitrary and insignificant. Yet for Montaigne, there is no detail that is insignificant when it comes to understanding ourselves: “each particle, each occupation, of a man betrays and reveals him just as well as any other” (F 220).
A second aim of essaying himself is to cultivate his judgment. For Montaigne, “judgment” refers to all of our intellectual faculties as well as to the particular acts of the intellect; in effect, it denotes the interpretive lens through which we view the world. In essaying himself, he aims to cultivate his judgment in a number of discrete but related ways. First, he aims to transform customary or habitual judgments into reflective judgments by calling them into question. In a well-known passage from “Of custom, and not easily changing an accepted law,” Montaigne discusses how habit “puts to sleep the eye of our judgment.” To “wake up” his judgment from its habitual slumber, Montaigne must call into question those beliefs, values, and judgments that ordinarily go unquestioned. By doing so, he is able to determine whether or not they are justifiable, and so whether to take full ownership of them or to abandon them. In this sense we can talk of Montaigne essaying, or testing, his judgment. We find clear examples of this in essays such as “Of drunkenness” and “Of the resemblance of children to their fathers,” where he tests his pre-reflective attitudes toward drunkenness and doctors, respectively. Another aspect of the cultivation of judgment has to do with exercising it through simple practice. Thus Montaigne writes that in composing his essays, he is presenting his judgment with opportunities to exercise itself:
Judgment is a tool to use on all subjects, and comes in everywhere. Therefore in the tests (essais) that I make of it here, I use every sort of occasion. If it is a subject I do not understand at all, even on that I essay my judgment, sounding the ford from a good distance; and then, finding it too deep for my height, I stick to the bank. And this acknowledgment that I cannot cross over is a token of its action, indeed one of those it is most proud of. Sometimes in a vain and nonexistent subject I try (j’essaye) to see if [my judgment] will find the wherewithal to give it body, prop it up, and support it. Sometimes I lead it to a noble and well-worn subject in which it has nothing original to discover, the road being so beaten that it can only walk in others’ footsteps. There it plays its part by choosing the way that seems best to it, and of a thousand paths it says that this one or that was the most wisely chosen. (F 219)
The third fundamental goal of essaying himself is to present his unorthodox way of living and thinking to the reading public of 16th century France. He often remarks his intense desire to make himself and his unusual ways known to others. Living in a time of war and intolerance, in which men were concerned above all with honor and their appearance in the public sphere, Montaigne presents his own way of life as an attractive alternative. While he supports the monarchy and the Catholic Church, his support is measured and he is decidedly tolerant of other views and other ways of life (see, for example, “Of Cato the Younger”). He vehemently opposes the violent and cruel behavior of many of the supporters of the Catholic cause, and recognizes the humanity of those who oppose them. Espousing an openness antithetical to contemporary conventions, he openly declares his faults and failures, both moral and intellectual. Finally, he emphasizes the values of private life and the fact that the true test of one’s character is how one behaves in private, not how one behaves in public. In other words, Montaigne challenges the martial virtues of the day that he believes have led to cruelty, hypocrisy, and war, by presenting himself as an example of the virtues of gentleness, openness, and compromise.
Just as Montaigne presents his ways of life in the ethical and political spheres as alternatives to the ways common among his contemporaries, so he presents his ways of behaving in the intellectual sphere as alternatives to the common ways of thinking found among the learned. He consistently challenges the Aristotelian authority that governed the universities of his day, emphasizing the particular over the universal, the concrete over the abstract, and experience over reason. Rejecting the form as well as the content of academic philosophy, he abandons the rigid style of the medieval quaestio for the meandering and disordered style of the essay. Moreover, he devalues the faculty of memory, so cultivated by renaissance orators and educators, and places good judgment in its stead as the most important intellectual faculty. Finally, Montaigne emphasizes the personal nature of philosophy, and the value of self-knowledge over metaphysics. His concern is always with the present, the concrete, and the human.
Rather than discursively arguing for the value of his ways of being, both moral and intellectual, Montaigne simply presents them to his readers:
These are my humors and my opinions; I offer them as what I believe, not what is to be believed. I aim here only at revealing myself, who will perhaps be different tomorrow, if I learn something new which changes me. I have no authority to be believed, nor do I want it, feeling myself too ill-instructed to instruct others. (F 108)
Yet while he disavows authority, he admits that he presents this portrait of himself in the hopes that others may learn from it (“Of practice”). Thus the end of essaying himself is simultaneously private and public. Montaigne desires to know himself, and to cultivate his judgment, and yet at the same time he seeks to offer his ways of life as salutary alternatives to those around him.
Montaigne is perhaps best known among philosophers for his skepticism. Just what exactly his skepticism amounts to has been the subject of considerable scholarly debate. Given the fact that he undoubtedly draws inspiration for his skepticism from his studies of the ancients, the tendency has been for scholars to locate him in one of the ancient skeptical traditions. While some interpret him as a modern Pyrrhonist, others have emphasized what they take to be the influence of the Academics. Still other scholars have argued that while there are clearly skeptical moments in his thought, characterizing Montaigne as a skeptic fails to capture the nature of Montaigne’s philosophical orientation. Each of these readings captures an aspect of Montaigne’s thought, and consideration of the virtues of each of them in turn provides us with a fairly comprehensive view of Montaigne’s relation to the various philosophical positions that we tend to identify as “skeptical.”
The Pyrrhonian skeptics, according to Sextus Empiricus’ Outlines of Pyrrhonism, use skeptical arguments to bring about what they call equipollence between opposing beliefs. Once they recognize two mutually exclusive and equipollent arguments for and against a certain belief, they have no choice but to suspend judgment. This suspension of judgment, they say, is followed by tranquility, or peace of mind, which is the goal of their philosophical inquiry.
In “Apology for Raymond Sebond,” Montaigne expresses great admiration for the Pyrrhonists and their ability to maintain the freedom of their judgment by avoiding commitment to any particular theoretical position. We find him employing the skeptical tropes introduced by Sextus in order to arrive at equipollence and then the suspension of judgment concerning a number of theoretical issues, from the nature of the divine to the veracity of perception. In other essays, such as the very first essay of his book, ”By diverse means we arrive at the same end,” Montaigne employs skeptical arguments to bring about the suspension of judgment concerning practical matters, such as whether the best way to obtain mercy is by submission or defiance. Introducing historical examples that speak for each of the two positions, he concludes that “truly man is a marvelously vain, diverse, and undulating object. It is hard to found any constant and uniform judgment on him” (F 5). We cannot arrive at any certain conclusion regarding practical matters any more than we can regarding theoretical matters.
If there are equipollent arguments for and against any practical course of action, however, we might wonder how Montaigne is to avoid the practical paralysis that would seem to follow from the suspension of judgment. Here Sextus tells us that Pyrrhonists do not suffer from practical paralysis because they allow themselves to be guided by the way things seem to them, all the while withholding assent regarding the veracity of these appearances. Thus Pyrrhonists are guided by passive acceptance of what Sextus calls the “fourfold observances”: guidance by nature, necessitation by feelings, the handing down of laws and customs, and the teaching of kinds of expertise. The Pyrrhonist, then, having no reason to oppose what seems evident to her, will seek food when hungry, avoid pain, abide by local customs, and consult experts when necessary – all without holding any theoretical opinions or beliefs.
In certain cases, Montaigne seems to abide by the fourfold observances himself. At one point in ”Apology for Raymond Sebond,” for instance, he seems to suggest that his allegiance to the Catholic Church is due to the fact that he was raised Catholic and Catholicism is the traditional religion of his country. In other words, it appears that his behavior is the result of adherence to the fourfold observances of Sextus. This has led some scholars, most notably Richard Popkin, to interpret him as a skeptical fideist who is arguing that because we have no reasons to abandon our customary beliefs and practices, we should remain loyal to them. Indeed, Catholics would employ this argument in the Counter-Reformation movement of the sixteenth and seventeenth centuries. (Nonetheless, the Essays would also come to be placed on the Catholic Church’s Index of Prohibited Books in the late seventeenth century, where it would remain for nearly two hundred years.)
Yet, for all the affinities between Montaigne and the Pyrrhonists, he does not always suspend judgment, and he does not take tranquility to be the goal of his philosophical inquiry. Thus Montaigne at times appears to have more in common with the Academic Skeptics than with the Pyrrhonists. For the Academics, at certain points in the history of their school, seem to have allowed for admitting that some judgments are more probable or justified than others, thereby permitting themselves to make judgments, albeit with a clear sense of their fallibility. Another hallmark of Academic Skepticism was the strategy of dialectically assuming the premises of their interlocutors in order to show that they lead to conclusions at odds with the interlocutors’ beliefs. Montaigne seems to employ this argumentative strategy in the “Apology for Raymond Sebond.” There Montaigne dialectically accepts the premises of Sebond’s critics in order to reveal the presumption and confusion involved in their objections to Sebond’s project. For example, Montaigne shows that according to the understanding of knowledge held by Sebond’s secular critics, there can be no knowledge. This is not the dogmatic conclusion that it has appeared to be to some scholars, since Montaigne’s conclusion is founded upon a premise that he himself clearly rejects. If we understand knowledge as Sebond’s critics do, then there can be no knowledge. But there is no reason why we must accept their notion of knowledge in the first place. In this way, just as the Academic Skeptics argued that their Stoic opponents ought to suspend judgment, given the Stoic principles to which they subscribe, so Montaigne shows that Sebond’s secular critics must suspend judgment, given the epistemological principles that they claim to espouse.
While many scholars, then, justifiably speak of Montaigne as a modern skeptic in one sense or another, there are others who emphasize aspects of his thought that separate him from the skeptical tradition. Such scholars point out that many interpretations of Montaigne as a fundamentally skeptical philosopher tend to focus on “Apology for Raymond Sebond,” Montaigne’s most skeptical essay. When we take a broader view of the Essays as a whole, we find that Montaigne’s employment of skeptical tropes is fairly limited and that for Montaigne, strengthening his judgment – one of his avowed goals in the Essays – does not amount to learning how to eliminate his beliefs. While working on his judgment often involves setting opinions against each other, it also often culminates in a judgment regarding the truth of these opinions. Thus Ann Hartle, for instance, has argued that Montaigne’s thought is best understood as dialectical. In a similar vein, Hugo Friedrich has pointed out that Montaigne’s skepticism is not fundamentally destructive. According to Friedrich, in cataloguing the diversity of human opinions and practices Montaigne does not wish to eliminate our beliefs but rather to display the fullness of reality.
Interpreting Montaigne as a skeptic, then, requires a good deal of qualification. While he does suspend judgment concerning certain issues, and he does pit opinions and customs against one another in order to undermine customary ways of thinking and behaving, his skepticism is certainly not systematic. He does not attempt to suspend judgment universally, and he does not hesitate to maintain metaphysical beliefs that he knows he cannot justify. Thus the spirit of his skepticism is not characterized by principles such as “I suspend judgment,” or “Nothing can be known,” but rather, by his motto, the question “What do I know?” Moreover, as Montaigne demonstrates, constantly essaying oneself does lead one to become more diffident of his or her judgment. Montaigne’s remarks are almost always prefaced by acknowledgments of their fallibility: “I like these words, which soften and moderate the rashness of our propositions: ‘perhaps,’ ‘to some extent,’ ‘some,’ ‘they say,’ ‘I think,’ and the like” (F 788). But it does not necessarily lead one to the epistemological anxiety or despair characteristic of modern forms of skepticism. Rather than despairing at his ignorance and seeking to escape it at all costs, he wonders at it and takes it to be an essential part of the self-portrait that is his Essays. Moreover, he considers the clear-sighted recognition of his ignorance an accomplishment insofar as it represents a victory over the presumption that he takes to be endemic to the human condition.
One of the primary targets of Montaigne’s skeptical attack against presumption is ethnocentrism, or the belief that one’s culture is superior to others and therefore is the standard against which all other cultures, and their moral beliefs and practices, should be measured. This belief in the moral and cultural superiority of one’s own people, Montaigne finds, is widespread. It seems to be the default belief of all human beings. The first step toward undermining this prejudice is to display the sheer multiplicity of human beliefs and practices. Thus, in essays such as “Of some ancient customs,” “Of Custom, and not easily changing an accepted law,” and “Apology for Raymond Sebond” Montaigne catalogues the variety of behaviors to be found in the world in order to draw attention to the contingency of his own cultural norms. By reporting many customs that are direct inversions of contemporary European customs, he creates something like an inverted world for his readers, stunning their judgment by forcing them to question which way is up: here men urinate standing up and women do so sitting down; elsewhere it is the opposite. Here incest is frowned upon; in other cultures it is the norm. Here we bury our dead; there they eat them. Here we believe in the immortality of the soul; in other societies such a belief is nonsense.
Montaigne is not terribly optimistic about reforming the prejudices of his contemporaries, for simply reminding them of the apparent contingency of their own practices in most cases will not be enough. The power of custom over our habits and beliefs, he argues, is stronger than we tend to recognize. Indeed, Montaigne devotes almost as much time in the Essays to discussing the power of custom to shape the way we see the world as he does to revealing the various customs that he has come across in his reading and his travels. Custom, whether personal or social, puts to sleep the eye of our judgment, thereby tightening its grip over us, since its effects can only be diminished through deliberate and self-conscious questioning. It begins to seem as if it is impossible to escape custom’s power over our judgment: “Each man calls barbarism whatever is not his own practice; for indeed it seems we have no other test of truth and reason than the example and pattern of the opinions and customs of the country we live in” (F 152).
Montaigne’s concern with custom and cultural diversity, combined with his rejection of ethnocentrism, has led many scholars to argue that Montaigne is a moral relativist, that is, that he holds that that there is no objective moral truth and that therefore moral values are simply expressions of conventions that enjoy widespread acceptance at a given time and place. Yet Montaigne never explicitly expresses his commitment to moral relativism, and there are aspects of the Essays that seem to contradict such an interpretation, as other scholars have noted.
These other scholars are inclined to interpret Montaigne as committed to moral objectivism, or the theory that there is in fact objective moral truth, and they point to a number of aspects of the Essays that would support such an interpretation. First, Montaigne does not hesitate to criticize the practices of other cultures. For instance, in “Of cannibals,” after praising the virtues of the cannibals, he criticizes them for certain behaviors that he identifies as morally vicious. For a relativist, such criticism would be unintelligible: if there is no objective moral truth, it makes little sense to criticize others for having failed to abide by it. Rather, since there is no external standard by which to judge other cultures, the only logical course of action is to pass over them in silence. Then there are moments when Montaigne seems to refer to categorical duties, or moral obligations that are not contingent upon either our own preferences or cultural norms (see, for example, the conclusion of “Of cruelty”). Finally, Montaigne sometimes seems to allude to the existence of objective moral truth, for instance in “Of some verses of Virgil” and “Of the useful and the honorable,” where he distinguishes between relative and absolute values.
Thus Montaigne’s position regarding moral relativism remains the subject of scholarly dispute. What is not a matter of dispute, however, is that Montaigne was keenly interested in undermining his readers’ thoughtless attitudes towards members of cultures different from their own, and that his account of the force of custom along with his critique of ethnocentrism had an impact on important later thinkers (see below).
Morally and politically, Montaigne has often been interpreted as a forerunner of modern liberalism. This is due to his presentation of himself as a lover a freedom who is tolerant of difference and who wishes to maintain a rather robust distinction between the private and public spheres. The question of the extent to which he is trying to transform the political values of his contemporaries, as well as the question of the extent to which Montaigne takes his position to be founded upon metaphysical principles, are both subjects of debate. Some read him as writing the Essays with primarily political intentions, and among those who subscribe to such a reading, there is disagreement as to the nature of his argument. On the one hand, some scholars argue that Montaigne’s political prescriptions are grounded on a theory of human nature combined with skepticism concerning the possibility of obtaining knowledge of transcendent truth. On the other hand, some interpret Montaigne in a more postmodern vein, arguing that he is not so much making an argument on the basis of truth claims as he is simply changing the subject, diverting the attention of his readers away from the realm of the transcendent and its categorical obligations to the temporal realm and its private pleasures. Still others hold that politics does not occupy the central place in the Essays that some might think, and that the political content of the Essays is neither dogmatic nor rhetorical, but rather is part and parcel of his fundamental project of seeking self-knowledge for himself and inspiring that same desire in others. On this interpretation, Montaigne’s political project is much more modest. He is simply offering a new moral and political figure to be considered, inviting readers to reflect for themselves on their own beliefs and practices in an effort to act as a Socratic gadfly to the slumbering French body politic. While it must be left to the reader to decide the extent to which a full-fledged political doctrine can be discovered in the Essays, as well as whether Montaigne is attempting to exert direct influence over his readers, it is nonetheless possible to identify a number of attitudes, values, and commitments that are central both to Montaigne’s moral and political thought and to modern liberalism.
First and foremost is Montaigne’s commitment to tolerance. Always amazed at the diversity of the forms of life that exist in the world, Montaigne consistently remarks his tolerant attitude toward those whose ways of life or fundamental beliefs and values differ from his own; he is not threatened by such disagreements, and he does not view those who are different as in need of correction:
I do not share that common error of judging another by myself. I easily believe that another man may have qualities different from mine. Because I feel myself tied down to one form, I do not oblige everybody else to espouse it, as all others do. I believe in and conceive a thousand contrary ways of life (façons de vie); and in contrast with the common run of men, I more easily admit difference than resemblance between us. I am as ready as you please to acquit another man from sharing my conditions and principles. I consider him simply in himself, without relation to others; I mold him to his own model. (F 169)
While radical skepticism does not in and of itself entail a tolerant attitude towards others, it seems that Montaigne’s more modest skepticism, if combined with a commitment to an objective moral order the nature of which he cannot demonstrate, might explain his unwillingness to condemn those who are different.
Montaigne’s commitment to toleration of difference produces a fairly robust distinction between the private and public spheres in his thought. When discussing his tenure as mayor in “Of husbanding your will,” for example, he insists that there is a clear distinction to be made between Montaigne the mayor and Montaigne himself. He performs his office dutifully, but he does not identify himself with his public persona or his role as citizen, and he believes that there are limits to what may be expected from him by the state. Similarly, he makes a sharp distinction between true friendship and the sort of acquaintances produced by working relationships. While he believes he owes everything to his friends and he expects the same in return, from those with whom he is bound by some professional relationship, he expects nothing but the competent performance of their offices. Their religion or their sexual habits, for example, are no concern of his (see “Of friendship”).
In part, Montaigne’s tolerance and his commitment to the separation of the private and public spheres are the products of his attitude towards happiness. Aristotelianism and Christianity, the two dominant intellectual forces of Montaigne’s time, emphasize the objective character of human happiness, the core content of which is fundamentally the same for all members of the human species. These conceptions of happiness each rest on the notion of a universal human nature. Montaigne, so impressed by the diversity that he finds among human beings, speaks of happiness in terms of a subjective state of mind, a type of satisfaction which differs from particular human being to particular human being (see “That the taste of good and evil depends in large part on the opinion we have of them,” “Apology for Raymond Sebond,” and “Of experience”). Convinced of the possibility that the content of happiness differs so significantly from one person to the next, Montaigne wishes to preserve a private sphere in which individuals can attempt to realize that happiness without having to contend with the interference of society.
Another distinctively modern feature of Montaigne’s moral thought is the fact that when he treats moral issues, he almost always does so without appealing to theology. This is not to say that he does not believe that God underwrites the principles of morality (an issue which cannot be decided on the basis of the text), but simply that Montaigne’s moral discourse is not underwritten by theology, but rather by empathetic concerns for the well being of the other and the preservation of the social bond. Thus he identifies cruelty to other living beings as the extreme of all vices (see “Of cruelty”), while dishonesty comes second in Montaigne’s ordering of the vices, since as human beings we are held together chiefly by our word (see “Of giving the lie”). Other vices he treats in terms of the degree to which they clash with society. So, for instance, he finds that drunkenness is not altogether bad, as it is not always harmful to society and it provides pleasures that add greatly to our enjoyment of life (“Of drunkenness”).
Montaigne has been thought by some to have been a hedonist, and while others would disagree with this interpretation, there is no doubt that he thinks pleasure is an integral part of a happy human life, and a very real motivating force in human actions, whether virtuous or vicious. Much of his ethical reflection centers around the question of how to live as a human being, rather than as a beast or an angel, and he argues that those who disdain pleasure and attempt to achieve moral perfection as individuals, or who expect political perfection from states, end up resembling beasts more than angels. Thus throughout the Essays the acceptance of imperfection, both in individual human beings and in social and political entities, is thematic.
This acceptance of imperfection as a condition of human private and social life, when combined with his misgivings about those who earnestly seek perfection, leads Montaigne to what has appeared to some as a commitment to political conservatism. Yet this conservatism is not grounded in theoretical principles that endorse monarchy or the status quo as good in and of itself. Rather, his conservatism is the product of circumstance. As he writes in “Of custom, and not easily changing an accepted law,” he has witnessed firsthand the disastrous effects of attempts at political innovation, and this has led him to be generally suspicious of attempts to improve upon political institutions in anything more than a piecemeal fashion. Yet this rule is not without its exceptions. In the next breath he expresses the view that there are times when innovation is called for, and it is the work of judgment to determine when those times arise.
Montaigne’s influence has been diverse and widespread. In the seventeenth century, it was his skepticism that proved most influential among philosophers and theologians. After Montaigne’s death, his friend Pierre Charron, himself a prominent Catholic theologian, produced two works, Les Trois Véritez (1594) and La Sagesse (1601), that drew heavily from the Essays. The former was primarily a theological treatise that united Pyrrhonian skepticism and Christian negative theology in an attempt to undermine Protestant challenges to the authority of the Catholic Church. The latter was more philosophically oriented, and is considered by many to be little more than a systematized version of “Apology for Raymond Sebond.” Nonetheless, it was immensely popular, and consequently it served as a conduit for Montaigne’s thought to many readers in the first part of the seventeenth century. There is also clear evidence of Montaigne’s influence on Descartes, particularly in the latter’s Discourse on Method. There, in addition to skepticism, Descartes took up a number of Montaignian themes, such as the diversity of values and practices among human beings, the power of custom to govern our judgment, and the decision, after having recognized that the philosophers have been unable to bring any of their questions to a decision after centuries of investigation, to engage in self-study. Ultimately, of course, Descartes parted ways with Montaigne quite decisively when he developed his dogmatic accounts of knowledge, the nature of the soul, and the existence of God. Pascal, on the other hand, also profoundly influenced by the Essays, concluded that reason cannot answer the theoretical question of the existence of God, and that therefore it was necessary to inquire into the practical rationality of religious belief.
In the eighteenth century, the attention of the French philosophes focused not so much on Montaigne’s skepticism as on his portrayal of indigenous peoples of the New World, such as the tribe he describes in “Of cannibals.” Inspired by Montaigne’s recognition of the noble virtues of such people, Denis Diderot and Jean-Jacques Rousseau created the ideal of the “noble savage,” which figured significantly in their moral philosophies. Meanwhile, in Scotland, David Hume’s Treatise of Human Nature showed traces of Montaigne’s influence, as did his Essays, Moral and Political.
A century later, Montaigne would become a favorite of Ralph Waldo Emerson and Friedrich Nietzsche. In Emerson’s essay “Montaigne; or, the Skeptic,” he extols the virtues of Montaigne’s brand of skepticism and remarks Montaigne’s capacity to present himself in the fullness of his being on the written page: “The sincerity and marrow of the man reaches into his sentences. I know not anywhere the book that seems less written. Cut these words, and they would bleed; they are vascular and alive.” Nietzsche, for his part, admired Montaigne’s clear-sighted honesty and his ability to both appreciate and communicate the joy of existence. In Schopenhauer as Educator, he writes of Montaigne: “the fact that such a man has written truly adds to the joy of living on this earth.”
In the twentieth century Montaigne was identified as a forerunner of various contemporary movements, such as postmodernism and pragmatism. Judith Shklar, in her book Ordinary Vices, identified Montaigne as the first modern liberal, by which she meant that Montaigne was the first to argue that cruelty is the worst thing that we do. In Contingency, Irony, and Solidarity, Richard Rorty borrowed Shklar’s definition of a liberal to introduce the figure of the “liberal ironist.” Rorty’s description of the liberal ironist as someone who is both a radical skeptic and a liberal in Shklar’s sense has led some to interpret Montaigne as having been a liberal ironist himself.
As many scholars have noted, the style of the Essays makes them amenable to a wide range of interpretations, which explains the fact that many thinkers with diverse worldviews have found the Essays to be a mirror in which they see their own reflection, albeit perhaps clarified to some degree by Montaigne’s penetrating insights into human nature. This would not be inconsistent with Montaigne’s purposes. In essaying himself publicly, he essays his readers as well, and in demonstrating a method of achieving self-knowledge, he undoubtedly intends to offer readers opportunities for self-discovery.
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Last updated: April 29, 2011 | Originally published: