G. E. Moore was a highly influential British philosopher of the early twentieth century. His career was spent mainly at Cambridge University, where he taught alongside Bertrand Russell and, later, Ludwig Wittgenstein. The period of their overlap there has been called the “golden age” of Cambridge philosophy. Moore’s main contributions to philosophy were in the areas of metaphysics, epistemology, ethics, and philosophical methodology. In epistemology, Moore is remembered as a stalwart defender of commonsense realism. Rejecting skepticism on the one hand, and, on the other, metaphysical theories that would invalidate the commonsense beliefs of “ordinary people” (non-philosophers), Moore articulated three different versions of a commonsense-realist epistemology over the course of his career.
Moore’s epistemological interests also motivated much of his metaphysical work, which to a large extent was focused on the ontology of cognition. In this regard, Moore was an important voice in the discussion about sense-data that dominated Anglo-American epistemology in the early twentieth century.
In ethics, Moore is famous for driving home the difference between moral and non-moral properties, which he cashed-out in terms of the non-natural and the natural. Moore’s classification of the moral as non-natural was to be one of the hinges upon which moral philosophy in the Anglo-American academy turned until roughly 1960.
Moore’s approach to philosophizing involved focusing on narrow problems and avoiding grand synthesis. His method was to scrutinize the meanings of the key terms in which philosophers expressed themselves while maintaining an implicit commitment to the ideals of clarity, rigor, and argumentation. This aspect of his philosophical style was sufficiently novel and conspicuous that many saw it as an innovation in philosophical methodology. In virtue of this, Moore, along with Bertrand Russell, is widely acknowledged as a founder of analytic philosophy, the kind of philosophy that has dominated the academy in Britain and the United States since roughly the 1930s.
Moore also had a significant influence outside of academic philosophy, through his contacts in the Cambridge Apostles and the Bloomsbury group. In both academic and non-academic spheres, Moore’s influence was due in no small part to his exceptional personality and moral character.
George Edward Moore was born on November 4, 1873, one of seven children of Daniel and Henrietta Moore. There were eight Moore children in all, as Daniel had a daughter from his first wife. G. E. Moore was raised in the Upper Norwood district of South London. His early education came at the hands of his parents: his father taught him reading, writing, and music; and his mother taught him French. Moore was a more-than-competent pianist and composer. At eight he was enrolled at Dulwich College, where he studied mainly Greek and Latin, but also French, German, and mathematics. At eighteen he entered Cambridge University, where he began as a student in Classics.
His first two years of University study proved to be less than challenging, his time at Dulwich having already prepared him exceptionally well in Greek and Latin. It was during this time that Moore became interested in philosophy. As he later reminisced:
I had indeed at Dulwich read Plato’s Protagoras …; but I was certainly not then very keenly excited by any of the philosophical questions which that dialogue raises …. What must have happened, during this second year at Cambridge, was that I found I was very keenly interested in certain philosophical statements which I heard made in conversation. (Moore 1942a, 13)
The conversations in question involved such notables as Henry Sidgwick, James Ward, and J.M.E. McTaggart, who became his teachers, and Bertrand Russell—then a student two years ahead of Moore—who for a time became his friend and philosophical ally. Moore’s and Russell’s relationship was lifelong, but it became strained early on. It was Russell who convinced Moore to study Moral Science, a division of philosophy in the British University system. In 1896, Moore took first-class honors in both Classics and Moral Science. After this, he attempted to win a Prize-Fellowship, as McTaggart and Russell had done before him. He succeeded in 1898, on his second attempt, and remained at Cambridge as a Fellow of Trinity College until 1904.
Beginning around 1897, and continuing through his time as a Fellow, Moore began to act as a “professional” philosopher, participating in the doings of the extant philosophical societies (such as the Aristotelian Society and the Moral Sciences Club) and publishing his work. Many of his best known and most influential works date from this period. It was also during this period that Moore instigated the momentous break from the then dominant philosophy of Absolute Idealism that would prove to be the first step toward the rise of analytic philosophy.
After his fellowship ended, Moore left Cambridge for a period of seven years, during which time he lived in Edinburgh and Richmond, Surrey, and worked independently on various philosophical projects. He returned to Cambridge in 1911 as a lecturer in Moral Science, and he remained there for the majority of his career, and, indeed, his life. He earned a Litt.D. in 1913, was elected a fellow of the British Academy in1918, and was chosen as James Ward’s successor as Professor of Mental Philosophy and Logic in 1925. He occupied that position until 1939, when he retired and was succeeded by Wittgenstein. From 1940 to1944 Moore was a visiting professor at several universities in the United States. He then returned to Cambridge, but not to teaching. He served as editor of Mind, the leading philosophical journal of the day, from 1921 to 1947. In 1951, he was awarded the British Order of Merit.
Beyond his professional career, Moore had a successful family life. In 1916 at age 43, he married Dorothy Ely, who had been his student. The couple had two sons: Nicholas (b.1918) and Timothy (b. 1922). By all accounts, Moore was an exemplary husband and father.
Moore died in Cambridge on October 24, 1958. He is buried in St. Giles’ churchyard.
Two facts make it difficult to separate Moore’s contributions to metaphysics from his contributions to epistemology. First, his main contributions to metaphysics were in the ontology of cognition, which is often treated as a branch of epistemology. Second, his main contributions to epistemology were motivated by what he called the “commonsense” or “ordinary” view of the world, and this is properly a metaphysical conception, a worldview or Weltanschauung. Consequently, the next section treats Moore’s metaphysics and his epistemology together.
Moore became interested in philosophy at a time when Absolute Idealism had dominated the British universities for half a century, in a tradition stretching from S.T. Coleridge and T.H. Green to F.H. Bradley and J.M.E. McTaggart. McTaggart was Moore’s earliest philosophical mentor. Moore’s earliest philosophical views were inherited directly from him.
Absolute Idealism is a brand of metaphysical monism. It implies that, although the world presents itself to us as a collection of more or less discrete objects (this bird, that table, the earth and the sun, etc.), it really is one indivisible whole, whose nature is mental (or spiritual, or ideal) rather than material. Thus it is also a form of anti-realism, since it claims that the world of ordinary experience is something of an illusion—not that the objects of ordinary experience do not exist, but that they are not, as we normally take them to be, discrete. Instead, every object exists and is what it is at least partly in virtue of the relations it bears to other things—more precisely, to all other things. This is called the doctrine of internal relations, which Moore understood as the view that all relations are necessary. On this view, my coffee cup is not just the apparently self-contained entity that I lift off the table and draw to my lips. Instead, it contains, as essential parts of itself, relations to every other existing thing; thus, as I draw it to my lips, I draw the universe along with it, and am responsible for, in a sense, reconfiguring the universe. Since, on this view, everything that exists does so only in virtue of its relations to everything else, it is misleading to say of any one thing, for example, my coffee cup, that it exists simpliciter. The only thing that exists simpliciter is the whole—the entire network of necessarily related objects.
Though Moore accepted Absolute Idealism for a short while in his undergraduate years, he is best remembered for the views he developed in opposition to it. In fact, what is most characteristic of Moore’s mature philosophy is a thoroughgoing realism about what he came to call the “commonsense” or “ordinary” view of the world. This involves a lush metaphysical pluralism (the belief that there are many things that exist simpliciter) that stands in sharp contrast to the monism of the Absolute Idealists.
Inklings of Moore’s misgivings about Absolute Idealism begin to appear as early as 1897, in his first (unsuccessful) Prize-Fellowship dissertation on “The Metaphysical Basis of Ethics.” Though in it he openly identifies with the British Idealist school, it is here that Moore first raises a point that proved to be the hole in the Idealists’ dike. The Idealists’ doctrine of the internality of all relations has implications for the ontology of cognition. Specifically, it implies that objects of knowledge/cognition are not independent of their knowers. In other words, being known (cognized, perceived, etc.) makes a difference to the nature and being of the thing being known, the “object” of knowledge. Indeed, it was this aspect of the view which marked it as Idealist, as the Idealists commonly posited a great Mind, often simply called “the Absolute,” that “grounded” the whole of reality by cognizing it. And it is this view in the ontology of cognition that Moore obliquely rejects in his 1897 dissertation. He does not address it directly and in specie, but only in the restricted context of moral epistemology. In discussing Kant’s moral epistemology, Moore argues that Kant’s conception of practical reason conflates the faculty of judgment with judgments themselves (that is, bearers of objective truth), which he thinks should be kept separate. To maintain a sharp distinction between cognitive faculties and their activities, on the one hand, and their objects, on the other, is a staple of Austro-German philosophy from Bolzano and Lotze to Husserl, and it is likely that Moore got the idea from reading in that tradition (cf. Bell 1999).
At this point, Moore had neither the doctrine of internal relations nor British Idealism in his sights. It is probably more accurate to say that he was objecting to what is frequently called psychologism—the view that apparently objective truths (for example, of logic, mathematics, ethics, etc.) are to be accounted for in terms of the operations of subjective cognitive or “psychological” faculties. Psychologism was common to nearly all versions of Kantian and post-Kantian Idealism, including British Absolute Idealism. It was also a common feature of thought in the British empirical tradition, from Hume to Mill. For the British Idealists, psychologism was a consequence of the doctrine of internal relations as the latter applies to the ontology of cognition.
It was not long before Moore recognized this. Accordingly, he expanded the scope of his 1897 criticism from the ontology of moral knowledge to the ontology of knowledge in general, and this quickly became the principal weapon in his rebellion against British Idealism. This began in earnest in his successful 1898 Prize-Fellowship dissertation, which formed the basis for his first influential paper, “The Nature of Judgment” (Moore 1899). In both of these works, Moore pushes the anti-psychologistic distinction between subjective faculties/activities and their objects. He couples this, however, with a peculiar account of the nature of truth, of propositions and of ordinary objects.
The Idealist F.H. Bradley had held that truth was a matter of correspondence between a judgment (which was made up of ideas) and its object. At first glance Bradley’s view appears to be the classical correspondence theory of truth, but it is actually a peculiar inversion of that theory. On the classical correspondence theory, the “truth maker” is the object, not any subject who does the believing of this truth. That is, facts makes truths be true; believers don’t do this. But, given the Idealists’ views about the ontological priority of the mental/ideal and the internality of all relations, it follows that any judgment’s being true is ultimately due to the great Mind, the Absolute. Thus, as Moore notes at the beginning of his paper, while Bradley affirms that truth is not a relation between reality and our judgments, but rather judgments “in themselves,” he does not remain true to this view, and ends up flirting with psychologism.
Replacing Bradley’s overtly psychologistic terms “idea” and “judgment” with the more neutral terms “concept” and “proposition,” and maintaining his anti-psychologistic distinction between subject and object, Moore rejects the Idealistic inversion of the correspondence theory of truth. He does not simply revert to the classical version, however. Instead, he seeks to secure the objectivity of truth by eliminating the notion of correspondence entirely. Truth could not be a matter of correspondence between proposition and object, Moore argues, since in a case like “2+2=4” we regard the proposition as true even though there is no object in the empirical world to which the proposition corresponds. Thus, propositions must be regarded as true (or false) “in themselves,” without reference either to a subject which entertains them as elements in occurrent acts of consciousness, or to any object beyond them which they might be “about.” Instead, when a proposition is true, it is because a peculiar relation obtains among the concepts that make it up. Since this view casts the proposition as its own truth-maker, it has been called the “identity theory” of truth, (cf. Baldwin 1991). Moore sums up his view this way:
A proposition is composed not of words, nor yet of thoughts, but of concepts. Concepts are possible objects of thought; but this is no definition of them. … It is indifferent to their nature whether anybody thinks them or not. They are incapable of change, and the relation into which they enter with the knowing subject implies no action or reaction [on the part of the proposition]. … A proposition is a synthesis of concepts; and just as concepts are themselves immutably what they are, so they stand in infinite relations to one another equally immutable. A proposition is constituted by any number of concepts, together with a specific relation between them; and according to the nature of this relation the proposition may be either true or false. What kind of relation makes a proposition true, what false, cannot be further defined, but must be immediately recognised. (Moore 1899, 179-180)
Thus understood, propositions seem to be a lot like Platonic Forms: they are unchanging bearers of truth that exist independently of any “instances” of consciousness. Historically, there is nothing peculiar in this (apart from its appearance in the British context, perhaps). In fact, these views of Moore’s are in keeping with what may be called the “standard” nineteenth and early-twentieth century view of propositions held by Bolzano, Frege, Russell, W.E. Johnson, and L.S. Stebbing (cf. Willard 1984, 180 f.; Bell 1999).
What is novel in Moore, however, is his identity theory of truth, and his related identification of ordinary objects with propositions. One aspect of the standard view was that whenever a proposition happened to be involved in an occurrent act of consciousness, it played the role of “object”—the act was immediately of or about the proposition. Thus, prima facie, the only form of epistemological realism compatible with the standard view is “indirect” or “representative” realism. This is the view that the external world is not given to us directly, but only as mediated by a surrogate object, like a proposition or, in Moore’s later philosophy, a sense-datum. But this aspect of the standard view chaffed against Moore’s growing partiality for common-sense (or “naïve”) realism, which assumes direct realism in epistemology. Thus, in order to secure direct, cognitive access to the external world, Moore cleverly eliminated the would-be mediators by identifying propositions with the objects of ordinary experience themselves.
His first move in this direction was to show that the identity theory of truth applies to propositions that, unlike “2+2=4,” do seem to require a relation to something outside themselves in order to be true. For instance, it is hard to see how the sentence “The cat is on the mat” could be true in itself, apart from a relation to some state of affairs in the empirical world. However, Moore says:
… this description [of truth] will also apply to those cases where there appears to be a reference to existence. Existence is itself a concept; it is something which we mean; and the great body of propositions, in which existence is joined to other concepts or syntheses of concepts are simply true or false according to the relation in which it stands to them. (Moore 1899, 181)
So, “The cat is on the mat” is true when the concepts constitutive of it (“cat,” “mat,” “on,” and so forth) are united with the concept “existence” by that indefinable, internal relation that is truth. Thus also for “The cat exists.” It is not that the proposition is true only if the cat exists; rather, it is that the cat exists only if the proposition is true in virtue of its own internal structure.
By making existence both dependent on truth and, like truth, internal to a proposition, Moore is in effect identifying the class of existents with the class of true propositions that involve the concept “existence” as a constituent. As Moore goes on to say “an existent is seen to be nothing but a concept or complex of concepts standing in a unique relation to the concept of existence,” and thus “it now appears that perception is to be regarded philosophically as the cognition of an existential proposition” (Moore 1899, 182-3). In this way, “the opposition of concepts to existents disappears,” (Moore 1899, 183), and Moore secures a direct realist account of cognition.
By the same token, he commits himself to what is, on the face of it, an unlikely view of the world: given the identity theory of truth, “it seems necessary to regard the world as formed of concepts” (Moore 1899, 182). But, Moore reminds us, this is not to be taken as a claim that reality is at bottom mentalistic or Ideal; for his account of concepts and propositions has already made clear that these exist independently of any acts of thinking. Thus, he says:
…the description of an existent as a proposition … seems to lose its strangeness, when it is remembered that a proposition is here to be understood, not as anything subjective—as an assertion or affirmation of something—but as the combination of concepts which is affirmed. (Moore 1899, 183)
Whether this really does alleviate the description’s strangeness is contestable; but it is clear that Moore means for it to be consistent with our commonsense view of the world. Unfortunately, however, the view has a peculiar consequence that is anything but commonsensical. Bertrand Russell called it the problem of “objective falsehoods.” Given Moore’s theory of truth and its attendant realism about propositions, false propositions have, or may have, the same ontological status as true propositions. At the very least, they are somehow “there” to be asserted or affirmed just as true propositions are. Moreover, since truth and falsity are prior to and independent of existence, there is no obvious reason why a false proposition could not include “existence” as a concept just as a true one can. By 1910, Bertrand Russell—who at first accepted Moore’s views—had convinced both himself and Moore that they were to be rejected precisely for these reasons (see Russell 1906, 1910; Moore 1953; see also the discussion of these matters in Baldwin 1991).
Nonetheless, Moore had held this view of truth and reality for approximately a decade, during which time many of his most influential works were published. Among these was his celebrated paper “The Refutation of Idealism” (Moore 1903b). Here he tackles Idealism head-on and in specie. Asserting that all forms of Idealism rest on the claim that esse is percipi (“to be is to be perceived,” or, as Moore treats it, “to be is to be experienced”), Moore argues that the claim is false. He begins by analyzing in great detail several possible meanings of the formula “esse is percipi.” Ultimately, he determines that Idealists take it to be an analytic truth, in that it is proved by the law of contradiction. Thus, they also believe existence and cognition to be somehow identical. According to this, for yellow to exist just is for someone to have a sensation of yellow. In identifying yellow and the sensation of yellow, the Idealist “fails to see that there is anything whatever in the latter that is not in the former” and thus, for him, “yellow and the sensation of yellow are absolutely identical” (Moore 1903b, 442). But, according to Moore, this is a mistake. Careful attention to the sensation of yellow, on the one hand, and yellow, on the other, will reveal that they are not identical. As he says, “the Idealist maintains that object and subject are necessarily connected, mainly because he fails to see that they are distinct” (Moore 1903b, 442); but Moore thinks he can show that they are distinct, and he deploys two arguments to this end.
His first argument turns upon what would later come to be called the paradox of analysis—an intractable problem that, ironically, would plague Moore’s own later work. The paradox can be explained in terms of the familiar act of defining a term. In any case of definition, one is confronted with two bits of language: the term to be defined (the definiendum) and the term that does the defining, the definition itself (the definiens). Both definiendum and definiens are supposed to have the same meaning—else the latter would not be able to illuminate the meaning of the former. But if both terms mean the same, it is hard to see how giving a definition could be illuminating. Consider the case of the definiendum “bachelor” and its definiens “unmarried man.” In order for “unmarried man” to be a good definition of “bachelor,” it must mean the same as “bachelor.” But if it means exactly the same thing, then it seems that saying “‘bachelor’ means ‘unmarried man’” shouldn’t be any different from saying “‘bachelor’ means ‘bachelor’” or “‘unmarried man’ means ‘unmarried man.’” And yet there does seem to be a difference in that we find the one informative; but the others, not. Thus it seems that there is a difference in meaning between “bachelor” and “unmarried man.”
In sum, then, the paradox is this: a term and its definition must say the same thing in order for the definition to be correct, and yet they must say something different in order for the definition to be informative. The paradox can be put into the form of a dilemma:
Now, this paradox functions in Moore’s first argument against the formula “Esse is percipi” in the following way. The formula itself can be read as a definition. Just as we say, “A bachelor is an unmarried man,” so the Idealist says, “To exist is to be cognized,” or “Yellow is the sensation of yellow.” However, if the two really were identical, it would be superfluous to assert that that they were; thus, the fact that the Idealist sees some need to assert the formula reveals that there is, as with any definiendum and its definiens, some difference between existence and cognition, or yellow and the sensation of yellow. As Moore says,
Of course, the proposition [that is, the formula] also implies that experience is, after all, something distinct from yellow—else there would be no reason to insist that yellow is a sensation: and that the argument [that is, the formula] both affirms and denies that yellow and the sensation of yellow are distinct is what sufficiently refutes it. (Moore 1903b, 442)
The argument may seem decisive. However, we should note that it turns upon Moore’s decision to push the Idealists toward the second horn of the “paradox of analysis” dilemma. Both horns are utterly destructive to “knowledge by description” (of which definitional knowledge is a type), so the Idealists would fare no better with the first horn. But the paradox of analysis is a problem not only for the Idealists, but for everyone who wants to affirm the practice of giving a definition, or, as Moore would later call it, an “analysis” of a concept. Thus, one might be inclined to hold off on embracing either horn, and instead concentrate on resolving the paradox. Charity requires that we extend this reprieve to our adversaries as well. Indeed, except for the fact that Moore hadn’t yet fully grasped the scope of the paradox lying just below the surface of his argument, we’d have to say that he was being terribly unfair by insisting that the Idealists hurry up and impale themselves on the second horn.
Moore’s second argument is much better. It is essentially an application of the now familiar, anti-psychologistic distinction between subject and object. He begins by comparing a sensation of blue with a sensation of green. These are the same in one respect, in virtue of which they are both called “sensations”; but they differ in another respect, in virtue of which the one is said to be “of blue” and the other “of green.” Moore gives the name “consciousness” to the respect in which they are the same, and the respects in which they are different he calls “objects” of sensation or of consciousness. Thus, he says, every sensation is a complex of consciousness and object.
Having distinguished consciousness from object, Moore goes on to distinguish object from sensation. Focusing now on a single sensation, the sensation of blue, Moore says that, when it exists, either (1) consciousness alone exists, (2) the object alone (that is, blue) exists, or (3) both exist together (presumably this is the sensation of blue). But each of these possibilities represents a different state of affairs: neither (1) consciousness alone, nor (3) consciousness and blue together are identical to (2) blue. Thus it is not the case that the sensation of blue is identical to blue, and it is therefore false that esse is percipi.
This negative conclusion of Moore’s essay is the refutation of idealism, properly speaking. However, the essay also has a positive conclusion, which purports to establish the truth of a direct realist account of cognition. Most philosophers in the modern period have accepted some form of representationalism, according to which we have direct cognitive access only to our own mental states (ideas, impressions, perceptions, judgments, etc.). But, according to Moore, what his analysis of consciousness shows is that, “whenever I have a mere sensation or idea, the fact is that I am then aware of something which is … not an inseparable aspect of my experience;” and this has the monumental consequence that,
there is … no question of how we are to ‘get outside the circle of our own ideas and sensations.’ Merely to have a sensation is already to be outside that circle. It is to know something which is as truly and really not a part of my experience, as anything which I can ever know. (Moore 1903b, 450)
Consistent with his 1899 view, we have direct cognitive access to the objects of our experience.
The direct realism of Moore’s early period depended heavily upon an ontology of cognition that included both his propositional realism and his identity theory of truth. When the problem of objective falsehoods finally drove him to abandon both, a revised account of cognition was required to secure some form of epistemological realism. For instance, no longer could he explain the difference between “2+2=4” and “The cat is on the mat” by referring to the presence of the concept “existence” in the latter proposition. Instead, Moore now cashed out the difference in terms of what he called “sense-data.”
Examples of include color patches (the octagonal patch of red associated with a stop sign) and appearances (the elliptical appearance of a coin when viewed at an angle). Beyond examples of this sort, exactly what sense-data are was never made sufficiently clear by Moore or others. Thanks largely to Moore, their nature was kept a matter of ongoing debate in the early twentieth century.
Most proponents of sense-data construed them as mental entities responsible for mediating our sensory experiences of external objects. For example, in perceiving a stop-sign, what one is immediately conscious of is some set of sense-data through which are conveyed the stop-sign’s size, shape, color, and so on. The stop-sign itself remains “outside the circle of ideas,” or rather, sense-data, and we are thus aware of it only indirectly. In its usual form, sense-data theory is a form of representationalism consistent with indirect realism, not direct realism.
Moore initially accepted this representationalist view of sense-data; but he was not long content with it, since it seemed to leave the commonsense view of the world open to skeptical doubts of a familiar, Cartesian variety. Consequently, he modified sense-data theory to make it a form of direct realism, just as he had previously done with proposition theory. His strategy in both cases was the same: by making the purported mental-mediators identical with external objects, he would eliminate the need for a mediator and make external objects directly available to consciousness. Thus, for a period of about fifteen years, Moore attempted off-and-on to defend a view according to which sense-data were identical to external objects or parts of such objects. For instance, a sense-datum could be identical to the whole of an object in the case of a sound, while for visible objects, which always have “hidden” sides (the underside of a table or the back side of a coin, for example) a single sense-datum could be identical to only a part of the object’s surface.
Ultimately, Moore could not sustain this sense-data version of direct realism any better than his previous, propositional version. It gave way under the weight of arguments such as the argument from illusion and the argument from synthetic incompatibility. The latter runs as follows. Suppose that person A is looking at the front side of a coin straight-on, and person B is looking at the same coin from an angle. To A, the front side of the coin appears to be circular; to B, it appears to be elliptical. The sense-data theorist accounts for this by saying that A is seeing a circular sense-datum, while B is seeing an elliptical sense-datum. But, given that A and B are looking at the same part of the coin’s surface (the whole surface of the front side), Moore’s proposal that sense-data are identical to parts of the surfaces of external objects entails that the whole surface of the front side of the coin is both circular and elliptical at the same time; but this implies a contradiction, and so cannot be true.
The argument from illusion raises problems analogous to the problem of “objective falsehoods,” which drove Moore from his early propositional realism. On the representationalist version of sense-data theory, we can explain the difference between true perceptions and false (illusory) perceptions by referring to the correspondence and lack of correspondence between a sense-datum and the external object it represents. On Moore’s direct realist version, however, it makes no sense to speak of a sense-datum as failing to correspond to the object. Since sense-data are identical to objects or their parts, there can be no sense-data without there being—or, rather their being—an object, and this implies both that illusion is impossible (which flies in the face of experience) and that all those experiences that we would normally call “illusory” really aren’t—the “illusory object” really exists if illusory sense-data exist.
By 1925, Moore conceded that he could find no way around these sorts of arguments (cf. Moore 1925), hence he fell back on a version of indirect realism.
With his failed attempt to sustain a direct realist version of sense-data theory, Moore had come to the end of his rope in trying to work out an adequate, realist ontology of cognition. This did not lead to his abandoning either epistemological or metaphysical realism in general, however. To do so would have been a genuine possibility, since to abandon direct realism is to admit that we have no direct evidence of the existence of the commonsense world. While “indirect” or “representational” versions of realism are possible, it is nonetheless natural to see representationalism as opening the door to the very sort of anti-realism (in forms like idealism, phenomenalism, and so on) that Moore had labored to overthrow.
Instead of sliding down the potentially slippery slope from representationalism to anti-realism, however, Moore dug in his heels, insisting that we are justified in accepting the commonsense view of the world despite the fact that we cannot adequately explain, ontologically, how the world is given to us. As Moore himself put it, “We are all, I think, in the strange position that we do know many things…and yet we do not know how we know them.” (Moore 1925; in 1959, 44).
This approach comes through clearly in Moore’s 1925 paper “A Defense of Common Sense.” Here, Moore acknowledges that direct realism, indirect realism, and phenomenalism are more or less equally matched contenders for the correct account of cognition. Since we cannot determine the correct account, we do not know how it is that we know. However, he argues, it would be wrong to see this as grounds for calling into question that we know or what we know. Indeed, there are many things that we know perfectly well, despite our inability to say how we know them. Among these “beliefs of common sense” are such propositions as “There exists at present a living human body, which is my body,” “Ever since it [this body] was born, it has been either in contact with or not far from the surface of the earth,” and “I have often perceived both body and other things which formed part of its environment, including other human bodies” (Moore 1925; in 1959, 33).
Moore claims that he knows these and many other propositions to be certainly and wholly true; and one of the other propositions that Moore claims to know with certainty is that others have also known the aforementioned propositions to be true of themselves, just as he knows them to be true of himself. By claiming that these propositions of common sense (hereafter CS propositions) are certainly true, Moore means to oppose the skeptic who would deny that we know anything with certainty. By claiming that CS propositions are wholly true, he means to oppose the Idealist, who would claim that no statement about some isolated object can be true simpliciter, since each object has its identity only as a part of the whole universe.
In support of his view, Moore claims that each CS proposition has an “ordinary meaning” which specifies exactly what it is one knows when one knows it. This “ordinary meaning” is perfectly clear to most everyone, except for some philosophers who
seem to think that [for example] the question “Do you believe that the earth has existed for many years past?” is not a plain question, such as should be met either by a plain “Yes” or “No,” or by a plain “I can’t make up my mind,” but is the sort of question which can be properly met by: “It all depends on what you mean by ‘the earth’ and ‘exists’ and ‘years’….” (Moore 1925; in 1959, 36)
But Moore thinks that to call things into question this way is perverse; and, far from being the task of philosophy, it actually undermines that task. For even the skeptic tacitly assents to the truth of CS propositions, at least in referring to himself as a philosopher, by making references to other philosophers with whom he may disagree, and so on:
For when I speak of ‘philosophers’ I mean, of course (as we all do), exclusively philosophers who have been human beings, with human bodies that have lived upon the earth, and who have at different times had many different experiences. (Moore 1925; in 1959, 40)
On the face of it, Moore’s general idea seems to be that the truth of CS propositions, and hence of the commonsense view of the world, is built into the terms of our ordinary language, so that if some philosopher wants to say that some CS proposition is false, he thereby disqualifies the very medium in which he expresses himself, and so speaks nonsensically. Either that or he is using terms in something other than their ordinary senses, in which case his claims have no bearing on the commonsense view of the world.
Since the bounds of intelligibility seem to be fixed by the ordinary meanings of CS propositions, the job of the philosopher begins by accepting them as starting points for philosophical reflection. Then, the philosopher questions not their truth, but what Moore calls their correct analysis. Giving an analysis resembles giving a definition, and in fact it is very difficult to say what distinguishes the two. For Moore, the difference is ontological: definition is performed upon words, analysis upon propositions and concepts. But both involve setting forth two terms that are supposed to mean the same, one of which is supposed to elucidate the other. In definition these are the definiendum (the term being defined) and the definiens (the term doing the defining); in analysis, they are the analysandum (the term being analyzed) and the analysans (the term doing the analyzing). Both may take the same verbal form, for example, “A brother is a male sibling” or “‘Brother’ means ‘male sibling’.” These sentences could express either an analysis or a definition, depending upon the intentions of the speaker. The difference cannot be determined just be looking. This was a matter of great confusion for Moore’s contemporaries. In any case, it is as analyses of CS propositions that views like direct realism, indirect realism, sense-data theory, phenomenalism, and the like have their place in philosophy. These views should not, according to Moore, disqualify or in any way challenge the commonsense view of the world, but only give us a deeper understanding of what it is to have a sensory experience, or to think a thought, etc.
Moore’s new approach to defending common sense is also apparent in what is arguably his most famous paper, “Proof of an External World” (Moore 1939). Here, after expending considerable effort to nail down the meaning of “external object” as “something whose existence does not depend on our experience,” Moore claims that he can prove some such objects exist
By holding up my two hands, and saying, as I make a certain gesture with the right hand, ‘Here is one hand’, and adding, as I make a certain gesture with the left, ‘and here is another’. (Moore 1939; in 1993, 166)
Moore’s complete line of thought seems to be this: “Here is one hand” is a CS proposition with an ordinary meaning. Using it in accordance with that meaning, presenting the hand for inspection is sufficient proof that the proposition is true—that there is indeed a hand there. Ditto for the other hand. But a hand, according to the ordinary meaning of “hand,” is a material object; and a material object, according to the ordinary meaning of “material object,” is an external object. Because there are two hands, and because hands are external objects, it follows that there is an external world, according to the ordinary meaning of “external world.”
Neither Moore’s defense of common sense nor his proof of an external world were universally convincing. Some misunderstood the latter as an attempt to disprove skepticism. Taken this way, it is clearly a miserable failure. However, as Moore himself later insisted, he never meant to disprove skepticism, but only to prove the existence of the external world:
I have sometimes distinguished between two different propositions, each of which has been made by some philosophers, namely (1) the proposition ‘There are no material things’ and (2) the proposition ‘Nobody knows for certain that there are any material things.’ And in my latest British Academy lecture called ‘Proof of an External World’ … I implied with regard to the first of these propositions that it could be proved to be false in such a way as this; namely, by holding up one of your hands and saying ‘This hand is a material thing; therefore there is at least one material thing’. But with regard to the second of the two propositions …. I do not think I have ever implied that it could be proved to be false in any such simple way … (Moore 1942b, 668)
Even without this misunderstanding, however, Moore’s new approach to promoting common sense is open to the charge of begging the question by simply assuming that CS propositions are true according to their ordinary meanings. Wittgenstein put the point bluntly: “Moore’s mistake lies in this—countering the assertion that one cannot know that, by saying ‘I do know it’” (Wittgenstein 1969, § 521). By stonewalling the skeptic in this way, Moore was in effect refusing to recognize that, lacking a plausible, direct realist account of cognition, there are legitimate grounds for questioning the truth of CS propositions. If it is possible that direct realism is false, then it is possible that none of our experiences connect us with the commonsense world. Thus, we have no indubitable evidence for there being such a world, and, supposing there are such things as CS propositions and their ordinary meanings, it is possible that they fail to represent reality accurately. Thus, both Moore’s defense and his proof are ill-founded, and can be maintained only by begging the question. Or so the objection goes.
Some have attempted to defend Moore, or at least Moorean style rejoinders to skepticism, by taking seriously Moore’s claim that he was not trying to disprove skepticism, and his admission that this would be a very hard thing to do. If we put aside the issue of proof, we can interpret Moore’s new approach as first, making a clean division between the ontology of cognition and what has come to be recognized as the other main aspect of epistemology—criteriology; and, second, attempting to deal with skepticism solely in terms of the latter. Whereas the ontology of cognition deals with the problem of how we know, criteriology deals with the problem of what we know, in the sense of what we are justified in believing. On this view, then, the issue is not whether commonsense realism is certainly true and skepticism certainly false; rather, the issue is what we ought to believe or regard as true given that we can neither prove nor disprove either position. On this interpretation, central to the Moorean approach is what has come to be called “the G. E. Moore shift” (a term coined by William Rowe). Consider a standard sort of skeptical argument:
Employing the G. E. Moore shift, we rearrange the propositions of the skeptic’s argument, thus:
The strategy can be generalized as follows, where CS is any proposition of common sense (such as “I am sure that I have a body”), and S is any skeptical proposition (such as “I cannot tell the difference between waking and dreaming”):
The Skeptic’s Argument
Moore’s Response (using “the shift”)
Both arguments are valid, but only one can be sound. Since both accept the conditional (1), the question of soundness comes down to the question of whether S or CS is true. And here Moore and the skeptic would be at an impasse, except that (according to Moore) we have more reason to believe any proposition of common sense than any skeptical proposition. That is because every skeptical proposition worth its salt is going to rest on some speculative account of the ontology of cognition that puts a mental surrogate (such as a proposition or a sense-datum) in place of what we would normally say was the object of our experience. But, given the highly uncertain nature of theories in the ontology of cognition, we are wise to treat them and claims based on them (as all legitimate skeptical claims are) with suspicion, and to refuse to let them bear too much weight in our decisions about what to believe. Thus, we should always end up on the side of commonsense.
In fact, this seems to be Moore’s procedure in a late paper called “Four Forms of Scepticism.” Taking as his S the claim made by Bertrand Russell that “I do not know for certain that this is a pencil,” Moore claims that it rests upon several assumptions, one of which is the denial of direct realism. And even though he admits to agreeing with Russell that direct realism is likely false, Moore nonetheless advocates rejecting S:
of no one of these [presuppositions of S] …do I feel as certain as that I do know for certain that this is a pencil. Nay, more: I do not think it is rational to be as certain of any one of these…propositions, as of the proposition that I do know that this is a pencil. (Moore 1959, 226)
It is clear that Moore is using the “shift” strategy. What is not clear is just what the source of justification for CS is supposed to be. In this case, at least, the shift seems to involve an appeal to a criterion of justification—and of rationality—that is not affected by the fact that we lack an adequate account of cognition. But Moore never tells us exactly what this criterion is. Since Moore, it has been the norm to attempt to do criteriology apart from the ontology of cognition, and the question about the criterion (or criteria) for justification remains a central matter of debate.
Moore’s ethical views are presented in two books and two papers: Principia Ethica, Ethics, “The Conception of Intrinsic Value,” and “Is Goodness a Quality?” (respectively: Moore 1903a, 1912, 1922b, and 1932). Despite being vastly outnumbered by his writings on epistemology and metaphysics, his work in ethics was just as influential. The discrepancy in volume is due mainly to the fact that the details of Moore’s ethical views were far more stable, undergoing far less revision and development, than those of his metaphysical and epistemological views.
Moore’s most important ethical work is Principia Ethica. It had a profound impact in both philosophy and culture almost immediately upon its publication. In it, Moore lays out a version of ethical realism consistent with his early propositional realism and its attendant doctrines. In accordance with his “identity theory” of truth, ethical propositions, just like non-ethical propositions, are objectively true or false in themselves. Combined with his view that ordinary objects are identical to true existential propositions, this implies that ordinary objects which possess value do so intrinsically: they are true existential propositions that involve the concept “good.” Thus, an object’s status as good or bad (or, in the aesthetic realm, beautiful or ugly) depends on nothing outside of itself—neither its causes and effects nor its relationship to human beings, their preferences, or their judgments. It depends solely on the involvement of “good” as a concept, or, in the idiom of existence, a property.
Ethical propositions, then, differ from non-ethical ones only in virtue of the kinds of concepts they involve. Specifically, ethical propositions involve a range of unique concepts that we call “ethical” or “moral,” such as “good,” “right,” “duty,” etc. The most fundamental of these is “good”; the others count as moral concepts/properties only because they bear logical relationships (in the broad sense of “relations of meaning”) to “good.” This point will be discussed further below. For now, we will focus on Moore’s views concerning the nature of “good” itself.
The central thesis of Principia Ethica is that “good” is a simple, non-natural concept (or property). As we shall see (in Section 3b), it is not completely clear what Moore means by “non-natural.” What he means by “simple” however, is clear enough; so we shall start with that. For something to be ontologically simple (which is the sense in question here) is for it to possess no parts, to admit of no divisions or distinctions in its own constitution. A simple is not made up out of anything, and thus cannot be broken down into anything. Simples are therefore unanalyzable. In the case of “good,” it is a concept not made up of other concepts. Consequently it cannot be analyzed—broken down into constituents—in the way that “bachelor” can (see Section 2b). Moore illustrates the situation by comparing “good” to color concepts like “yellow.” Color concepts cannot be known by analytic description, but only by acquaintance, that is, direct cognition. Attempts at description or definition (that is, analysis) such as “yellow is a color brighter than blue,” fail to capture the essence of yellow. Likewise, purported analyses of “good,” in terms concepts like “pleasure” or “desire” or “evolutionary progress,” fail to capture what is meant by “good.”
Moore demonstrates the unanalyzability of “good” by what has come to be known as “the open question argument”: for any definition of “good”—“good(ness) is X”—it makes sense to ask whether goodness really is X, and whether X really is good. For instance, if we say “goodness is pleasure,” it makes sense to ask, “is goodness really pleasure?” and “is pleasure truly good?” Moore’s point is that every attempt at definition leaves it an open question as to what good really is. But this could be the case only if the definition failed to capture all of what is meant by “good.” Consider the case discussed above: “a bachelor is an unmarried man.” Here it makes no sense to respond “yes, but is a bachelor really an unmarried man?” or “but is every unmarried man really a bachelor?” The reason it doesn’t is that the full meaning of “bachelor” is captured by “unmarried man.” On the other hand, the reason it makes sense to ask these kinds of questions about purported definitions of “good” is that they fail to capture its full meaning. Since this is true of every purported definition of “good,” “good” cannot be defined; it can only be recognized in particular cases through acts of intuitive apprehension.
On this account, any ethical theory that attempts to define the good—and nearly all of them do—errs. Moore famously dubbed this particular error “the naturalistic fallacy.” In general, the fallacy “consists in identifying the simple notion which we mean by ‘good’ with some other notion” (Moore 1903a, 58); or, negatively, the “failure to distinguish clearly that unique and indefinable quality which we mean by good” (Moore 1903a, 59). To this extent, it is clear what Moore means by “the naturalistic fallacy.” However, his choice of “naturalistic” to describe this error is quite puzzling, as is his description of “good” as a non-natural property. In the modern era, “nature” has frequently been used as a synonym for the material world, the world studied by the natural sciences. Accordingly, “naturalistic” has usually been reserved for philosophical views amenable to the natural sciences, views like scientism, empiricism, materialism, and so on. In the Principia, Moore’s direct statements about the meanings of “natural,” “naturalistic,” etc., are in keeping with this norm. At one point, he describes “nature” (and hence the natural) as “that which is the subject-matter of the natural sciences and also of psychology” (Moore 1903a, Ch. 2 § 26). He also offers two alternative characterizations of the natural. The first is in terms of temporality, the second in terms of the capacity for independent existence in time (this latter applies specifically to properties). Even here he does not depart from the norm, for the objects of scientific inquiry are usually taken to be temporal individuals such as events or material individuals at varying levels of granularity (atoms, molecules, cells, “ordinary middle-sized objects,” planets, etc.).
On the one hand, then, Moore’s use of “natural” seems to be unremarkable. What is peculiar, on the other hand, is his use of “naturalistic” to describe the fallacy of equating “good” with any other concept. Moore’s “naturalistic fallacy” is not a matter of mistaking the temporal for the atemporal. Neither is it a matter of mistaking the empirical and the scientific for the non-empirical and non-scientific. This description might apply to hedonistic views that equate good with pleasure, since pleasure can be treated as an object of empirical study either for psychology or physiology. However, Moore means to charge even metaphysical theories of ethics—such as those of Aristotle, Aquinas and Kant—with commiting the naturalistic fallacy (cf. Moore 1903a, Ch. 4), and none of these equates goodness with something empirical or scientific in the modern sense. In fact, the naturalistic fallacy is really just a matter of mistaking the non-synonymous for the synonymous (thus William Frankena suggested in an important 1939 paper that it should be called “the definist fallacy”), and this has nothing to do with the distinction between the natural and the non-natural per se, as that distinction is normally understood.
All this points to the fact that either Moore has a much broader understanding of “natural” than he admits to in the Principia, or “naturalistic fallacy” is not an apt name for the phenomenon at issue. In the Principia, Moore seems prepared to accept the latter possibility when he claims “I do not care about the name: what I do care about is the fallacy. It does not matter what we call it, provided we recognise it when we meet with it” (Moore 1903a, Ch. 1, § 12). However the natural/non-natural terminology must have meant more to him than he let on, for he retained it throughout his career, even parting ways with ordinary usage to do so. This occurs in a 1922 paper on “The Conception of Intrinsic Value.” Here, Moore holds that value concepts alone are to be counted as non-natural, so that “non-natural” is practically equivalent to “moral” and “natural” to “non-moral.” Thus, in the end, it seems that Moore did have a much broader understanding of “natural”—and a correspondingly narrower conception of “non-natural”—than is articulated in the Principia.
Although it is the focus of his later book Ethics, only a single chapter of the Principia is given to what Moore called “practical ethics.” This is the area of ethics that has to do with behavior, and hence deals in concepts like “right,” “permissible,” “obligatory,” and the like. In both places, Moore promotes a view that has come to be called “ideal utilitarianism.”
Moore’s account of intrinsic value is limited to objects; it does not include actions. Actions, for Moore, possess value only instrumentally, insofar as they are productive of good consequences. Thus “right,” “duty,” and “virtue” are different ways of labeling actions (or dispositions to act) that are useful as means to good ends. They differ in meaning only insofar as the secondary details of the causal situation differ: “duty” marks a action as productive of more good than any possible alternative, “right” or “permissible” marks an action as productive of no less good than any possible alternative (Moore 1903a, Ch. 5, § 89), while virtues are dispositions to perform particularly unattractive duties:
as duties from expedient actions, so virtues are distinguished from other useful dispositions, not by any superior utility, but by the fact that they are dispositions, which it is particularly useful to praise and to sanction, because there are strong and common temptations to neglect the actions to which they lead. (Moore 1903a, Ch. 5, § 103)
Moore’s view is that there is no important difference in meaning between concepts like “duty” “right” and “virtue” on the one hand, and “expedient” or “useful” on the other. In this he agrees with the classic utilitarians Jeremy Bentham and John Stuart Mill. However, whereas classic utilitarianism is hedonistic (that is, it defines good in terms of pleasure), Moore defends the sui generis status of “good” (see Section 3a). Moore’s utilitarianism is not, therefore, hedonistic. Instead, it is said to be ideal. To understand what this means, we must note two features of Moore’s view.
First, Moore’s utilitarianism is pluralistic. Since, on Moore’s account, “good” is a property/concept whose meaning is completely independent of any others, it can be instanced in any number of wholes—objects or states of affairs—of a variety of types. This means that many different kinds of objects can have intrinsic value—not just states of pleasure, as the classic utilitarians have it.
Second, “good” for Moore is a degreed property—one object or state of affairs can have more or less value than another. This is implicit in the way Moore distinguished between “duty” and “right.” “Duty” concerns producing the most good possible, while “right” concerns producing no less good than other options. Both definitions assume that possible outcomes (states of affairs) can be ranked in respect of their degrees of value. This is made explicit in Chapter 6 of the Principia, where Moore articulates his conception of an ideal state of affairs. In general, Moore says, an ideal state is one that is “good in itself in a high degree” (Moore 1903a, Ch. 6, § 110). Ideal utilitarianism, therefore, will be a brand of utilitarianism in which actions are to be ordered not to the greatest happiness or pleasure, but to those states of affairs possessing the highest degree of good.
Indeed, as Moore has set things up, duty will always be directed toward some ideal state (toward the state with the highest degree of good). Thus, to know which states are ideal, and, more specifically, which are most valuable and hence the most ideal, is crucial for practical ethics. According to Moore, the most valuable states we know of are the pleasures of personal relationships and aesthetic enjoyment. Thus, he concludes, “the ultimate and fundamental truth of Moral Philosophy” is that
it is only for the sake of these things [that is, the two ideal states of aesthetic and interpersonal enjoyment]—in order that as much of them as possible may at some time exist—that any one can be justified in performing any public or private duty; that they are the raison d’être of virtue; that it is they—these complex wholes themselves, and not any constituent or characteristic of them—that form the rational ultimate end of human action and the sole criterion of social progress. (Moore 1903a, Ch. 6, § 110)
Moore’s ethical theory had a tremendous influence both within and beyond the academy. Within the academy, non-cognitive theories of ethics dominated until nearly 1960. This was the logical consequence of adapting Moore’s ethical theory to a naturalistic worldview. Both his own and subsequent generations of philosophers took to heart Moore’s treatment of moral value as non-natural and his corresponding refusal to allow any characterization of good in natural terms. In doing so, however, they either failed to recognize or simply ignored the fact that Moore’s use of “natural” etc. was somewhat idiosyncratic. Taking these terms in their standard sense, Moore’s claims about “good” indicated that it was not merely indefinable, but unknowable by any scientific or “natural” means. Together with a scientistic outlook that restricted either the knowable or the existent to the scientifically verifiable, this yielded the view that “good” was unknowable.
It was essentially this view—albeit given a linguistic twist—that provided the theme upon which the most prominent ethical theories of the early- to mid-1900s counted as so many variations. This began with the logical positivist treatment of ethics. According to the logical positivists’ “verifiability principle of meaning,” the meaning of a proposition is its manner of empirical verification. If a proposition cannot be verified empirically, it is thereby revealed as meaningless. Given the Moorean characterization of “good” as non-natural and the usual sense of “non-natural” as connoting, among other things, “non-empirical,” the verification principle made ethical propositions meaningless. Still, ethical discourse obviously plays an important role in human life. According to the logical positivists, this was to be explained by treating ethical propositions not as statements of fact, but as expressions of emotion. For example, “honesty is good” is to be taken as equivalent to “hooray for honesty!” This view, commonly called “emotivism,” was popularized by A. J. Ayer in his book Language, Truth and Logic (Ayer 1936), and later modified by C. L. Stevenson (1944, 1963).
To an extent, emotivism had been anticipated in Moore’s treatment of practical ethics, in his view that
the true distinction between duties and expedient actions is not that the former are actions which it is in any sense more useful or obligatory or better to perform, but that they are actions which it is more useful to praise and to enforce by sanctions, since they are actions which there is a temptation to omit. (Moore 1903a, Ch. 5, § 101)
In other words, the language of practical ethics adds to non-ethical language only the connotation of approval or disapproval and their consequent “hortatory force” (cf. Daly 1996, 45-47). In emotivisim this claim was extended to all ethical discourse.
The larger part of the mid-century debate over the status of ethical claims was taken up with creative rejections of emotivism which were nonetheless in keeping with the basic Moorean disjunction between the moral and the natural(/empirical/scientific). Such alternatives came from Stuart Hamphire (1949), J. O. Urmson (1950), Stephen Toulmin (1950), and R. M. Hare (1952). British and American philosophers began to part ways with the Moorean disjunction only in the late 1950s and early 1960s, due largely to the work of Elizabeth Anscombe (Anscombe 1958) and Phillipa Foot (1958, 1959, 1961).
Beyond the academy, Moore’s emphasis on the value of personal relationships and aesthetic experiences endeared him to members of the Bloomsbury group, who embraced Moore as their patron saint. Bloomsbury was a group of avant-garde writers, artists, and intellectuals that proved to be immensely influential in culture beyond the academy. The group included (among others) Clive Bell, Roger Fry, Desmond McCarthy, John Maynard Keynes, and Leonard and Virginia Woolf. Many of the Bloomsbury men were also members of the Cambridge Apostles, and had first met each other and Moore in that context. Moore had been elected to this secret student society in 1894. As members of Bloomsbury, they embraced Moore’s idealization of friendship and aesthetic enjoyment as the highest human goods, and, through their own example and through their work, conveyed at least some of Moore’s views and values beyond the halls of academia and into the broader culture.
However, they also used Moore’s intuition-based moral epistemology as a justification for flouting the mores of their culture, especially in the area of sexual ethics. In fact, on account of Bloomsbury’s reputation for moral laxity, Moore’s views were often unfairly criticized as encouraging libertine behavior. This is clearly a case of guilt by association, as Moore himself never claimed that “free love” was a good. The closest he comes to the topic is in discussing social conventions about chastity as an example of rules that might, under certain circumstances, be suspended (Moore 1903a, ch. 5, §§ 95-96). However, far from endorsing that they actually be suspended, he argues that it is obligatory to obey the conventions of one’s society, since this will usually generate a state of greater good (in the form of social harmony) than violating them.
The situation with Bloomsbury illustrates the greatest weakness of Moore’s ethical system. It is not a theoretical weakness, but a practical one. From a theoretical perspective, intuitionism is invulnerable, and it is invulnerable because intuition is unverifiable—if someone claims to have an intuition that such and such is the case, there’s nothing anyone can do to prove or disprove it. However, because it is unverifiable, intuition can be used to justify anything. This is the practical problem with intuitionist ethics. Of course, the problem is not unique to Moore’s version of intuitionism, but attaches to intuitionism in specie.
Moore is usually regarded as an important methodological innovator. In fact his method of philosophical analysis is supposed to have been a formative inspiration for the analytic movement in philosophy. However, it is a bit misleading to speak of “Moore’s philosophical method.” Moore was what we might call an occasional philosopher. By his own admission, he possessed no innate drive to develop a systematic philosophy; rather, he was agitated into philosophizing only by the bizarre challenges some philosophers’ claims posed to his commonsense beliefs:
I do not think that the world or the sciences would ever have suggested to me any philosophical problems. What has suggested philosophical problems to me is things which other philosophers have said about the world or the sciences. (Moore 1942a, 14)
In the Library of Living Philosophers volume on Moore, V.J. McGill criticizes Moore’s piecemeal approach to philosophy. He rightly notes that Moore attempted to develop no grand system of philosophy, but worked instead in a few specific areas, for example, ethics, perception, and philosophical method. McGill blames Moore’s approach to philosophy on his commitment to a method which was simply not suited to deal with other sorts of philosophical issues. In his reply to McGill, however, Moore rejects this idea:
it is, of course true that there are ever so many interesting philosophical problems on which I have never said a word … Mr. McGill suggests that the reason why I have not dealt with some of these other questions may have been that I was wedded to certain particular methods, and that these methods were not suitable for dealing with them. But I think I can assure him that this was not the case. I started discussing certain kinds of questions, because they happened to be what interested me most; and I only adopted certain particular methods (so far as I had adopted them) because they seemed to me suitable for those kinds of questions. I had no preference for any method…. (Moore 1942b, 676)
In a sense, then, Moore did not have a method. But, of course, he did have a way of going about his philosophizing, and one might call this “Moore’s method.” In this case, the “method” would consist, first, in tackling isolated philosophical problems rather than trying to build a philosophical system. Second, in tackling one of these isolated problems, it would involve the attempt to get very clear on what was meant by the propositions and concepts essential to stating the problem—in other words, the propositions and concepts would have to be analyzed. Likewise with the propositions and concepts involved in the answer (or possible answers).
In point of historical fact, Moore’s use of analysis to solve isolated philosophical problems—and so his “method”—proved to have a greater impact on philosophy than any of his developed theories in metaphysics, epistemology, or ethics. Though his early views about truth and propositions provided a necessary metaphysical and epistemological departure from British Idealism, these merely facilitated the rise of analytic philosophy. The substance of the movement came from Moore’s use of analysis as a method. Indeed, though use of the word “analysis” in philosophy antedates Moore, it was Moore who first used it in the sense that ultimately gave the movement its name.
Unfortunately, much of Moore’s influence in this regard was based on a mistake. It was mentioned above that the empirical equivalence of definition and analysis was a source of confusion for Moore’s contemporaries. Despite Moore’s best efforts to explain otherwise, many took him to have invented and endorsed linguistic analysis. Norman Malcolm represents this common misconception when he says, “The essence of Moore’s technique of refuting philosophical statements consists in pointing out that these statements go against ordinary language” (Malcolm 1942, 349). Malcolm goes on to tie Moore’s entire philosophical legacy to his “linguistic method:”
Moore’s great historical role consists in the fact that he has been perhaps the first philosopher to sense that any philosophical statement that violates ordinary language is false, and consistently to defend ordinary language against its philosophical violators” (Malcolm 1942, 368)
But Moore explicitly rejected the idea that his analyses had been in any important sense “linguistic.” “In my usage,” he insisted, “the analysanda must be a concept, or idea, or proposition, and not a verbal expression” (Moore 1942b, 663 f.):
I never intended to use the word [“analysis”] in such a way that the analysandum would be a verbal expression. When I have talked of analyzing anything, what I have talked of analyzing has always been an idea or concept or proposition, and not a verbal expression; that is to say, if I talked of analyzing a “proposition,” I was always using “proposition” in such a sense that no verbal expression (no sentence, for instance), can be a “proposition,” in that sense. (Moore 1942b, 661)
Our survey of Moore’s metaphysics in Section 2b makes it clear enough that a Moorean proposition is anything but a linguistic entity. How, then, did this misunderstanding arise? Even a brief survey of Moore’s work will reveal that he often used terms such as “meaning,” “definition,” and “predicate” to describe what he was dealing with or looking for in his philosophical activities, and it is easy to see how these suggest that he was engaged in some linguistic enterprise. In a particularly glaring example from Principia Ethica, Moore identifies the object of his of study in clearly grammatical terms: “My discussion hitherto has fallen under two main heads. Under the first, I tried to shew what “good”—the adjective “good”—means” (Moore 1903a, Ch. 5, § 86). In this case, it seems that Moore himself conflated a linguistic entity—the adjective “good”—with a conceptual one.
With characteristic humility, Moore was quick to count himself as partially responsible for the linguistic interpretation of his method. “I have often,” he admitted, “in giving analyses, used this word ‘means’ and thus given a false impression; …” (Moore 1942b, 664 f.). Though the linguistic interpretation of Moore persisted until well after his death, recent scholarship has continued to hammer the point home that this is a mistake, and the message seems to have finally been heard.
Even apart from the linguistic error, however, the general contours of Moore’s genuine “method” seem to have had a lasting impact of their own. In his recent work on the history of analytic philosophy, Scott Soames counts as two of the movement’s three characteristic features “an implicit commitment…to the ideals of clarity, rigor, and argumentation” (Soames 2003, xiii) and “a widespread presumption…that it is often possible to make philosophical progress by intensively investigating a small, circumscribed range of philosophical issues while holding broader, systematic issues in abeyance” (Soames 2003, xv), and among its two most important achievements he includes “the recognition that philosophical speculation must be grounded in pre-philosophical thought” (Soames 2003, xi). Each of these can be traced directly back to Moore and his “method.”
It cannot be doubted that Moore was one of the most influential philosophers of the early twentieth century. It is peculiar, though, that his influence seems to have had little to do with his actual views. Though his early views about truth and propositions influenced Bertrand Russell for a time, they have long since ceased to play a role in mainstream philosophical discussions. The same can be said of his views in ethics and, except in the very general respects mentioned by Soames, philosophical methodology. Moreover, even when the influence of Moore’s ethical and methodological views was at its highest, there remains the fact that much of the detailed content of his views was ignored by those who claimed to be influenced by them. For both the “ordinary language” branch of analytic philosophy and the Bloomsbury group, Moore’s views were influential mainly in the sense that they provided forms into which they could pour their own content. And yet Moore himself was revered by all.
This puzzle about Moore’s influence has been addressed by Paul Levy (Levy 1979), who argues that Moore’s influence was due more to his character than to his views. And, in fact, the uniqueness of Moore’s character is frequently mentioned by those who knew him and have written about him. G. J. Warnock, for instance, would seem to agree with Levy when he says:
…special notice should be paid to the character of Moore…it was not solely by reason of his intellectual gifts that Moore differed so greatly from his immediate predecessors, or influenced so powerfully his own contemporaries. He was not, and never had the least idea that he was, a much cleverer man than McTaggart … or Bradley. It was in point of character that he was different, and importantly so. (Warnock 1958, 12)
Foremost among his virtues were his unwavering honesty and his devotion to clarity and truth. Moore was never afraid to appear silly or naïve in his search for truth, and so he always said exactly what he thought in the best way he knew how. He was never afraid to admit an error. He gave no appearance of trying to promote either himself or his own agenda or system. This was remarkably refreshing in a context dominated by a philosophical system that had achieved the status of orthodoxy. He held both himself and others to exacting intellectual standards while at the same time exhibiting a spirit of great generosity and kindness in his personal relationships. Gilbert Ryle, the most prominent Cambridge philosopher in the generation after Moore, describes Moore’s significance this way:
He gave us courage not by making concessions, but by making no concessions to our youth or our shyness. He treated us as corrigible and therefore as responsible thinkers. He would explode at our mistakes and muddles with just that genial ferocity with which he would explode at the mistakes and muddles of philosophical high-ups, and with just the genial ferocity with which he would explode at mistakes and muddles of his own. (Ryle 1971, 270)
Similar reports come from Moore’s associates outside of academic philosophy. For instance, Leonard Woolf (a member of Bloomsbury and the Apostles) recalls:
There was in him an element which can, I think, be accurately called greatness, a combination of mind and character and behaviour, of thought and feeling, which made him qualitatively different from anyone else I have ever known. I recognize it in only one or two of the many famous dead men whom Ecclesiaasticus and others enjoin us to praise for one reason or another. (Woolf 1960, 131)
There is no doubt that Moore’s character captured a certain philosophical ideal established by Socrates long ago. Whatever we make of Moore’s views, we can be grateful for his character and whatever influence it had and continues to have.
The most complete bibliography of Moore’s writings is found in the 1971 edition of The Philosophy of G. E. Moore (listed, as “Schilpp, ed. 1942” in section b, below).
U. S. A.
Last updated: December 30, 2005 | Originally published: