Moral relativism is the view that moral judgments are true or false only relative to some particular standpoint (for instance, that of a culture or a historical period) and that no standpoint is uniquely privileged over all others. It has often been associated with other claims about morality: notably, the thesis that different cultures often exhibit radically different moral values; the denial that there are universal moral values shared by every human society; and the insistence that we should refrain from passing moral judgments on beliefs and practices characteristic of cultures other than our own.
Relativistic views of morality first found expression in 5th century Greece, but they remained largely dormant until the 19th and 20th centuries. During this time, a number of factors converged to make moral relativism appear plausible. These included a new appreciation of cultural diversity prompted by anthropological discoveries; the declining importance of religion in modernized societies; an increasingly critical attitude toward colonialism and its assumption of moral superiority over the colonized societies; and growing skepticism toward any form of moral objectivism, given the difficulty of proving value judgments the way one proves factual claims.
For some, moral relativism, which relativizes the truth of moral claims, follows logically from a broader cognitive relativism that relativizes truth in general. Many moral relativists, however, take the fact-value distinction to be fundamental. A common, albeit negative, reason for embracing moral relativism is simply the perceived untenability of moral objectivism: every attempt to establish a single, objectively valid and universally binding set of moral principles runs up against formidable objections. A more positive argument sometimes advanced in defense of moral relativism is that it promotes tolerance since it encourages us to understand other cultures on their own terms.
Critics claim that relativists typically exaggerate the degree of diversity among cultures since superficial differences often mask underlying shared agreements. In fact, some say that there is a core set of universal values that any human culture must endorse if it is to flourish. Moral relativists are also accused of inconsistently claiming that there are no universal moral norms while appealing to a principle of tolerance as a universal norm. In the eyes of many critics, though, the most serious objection to moral relativism is that it implies the pernicious consequence that “anything goes”: slavery is just according to the norms of a slave society; sexist practices are right according to the values of a sexist culture. Without some sort of non-relative standard to appeal to, the critics argue, we have no basis for critical moral appraisals of our own culture’s conventions, or for judging one society to be better than another. Naturally, most moral relativists typically reject the assumption that such judgments require a non-relativistic foundation.
In the view of most people throughout history, moral questions have objectively correct answers. There are obvious moral truths just as there are obvious facts about the world. Cowardice is a bad quality. A man should not have sex with his mother. Heroes deserve respect. Such statements would be viewed as obviously and objectively true, no more open to dispute than the claim that seawater is salty.
This assumption was first challenged in fifth century Greece. The idea was that moral beliefs and practices are bound up with customs and conventions, and these vary greatly between societies. The historian Herodotus tells the story of how the Persian king Darius asked some Greeks at his court if there was any price for which they would be willing to eat their dead father’s bodies the way the Callatiae did. The Greeks said nothing could induce them to do this. Darius then asked some Callatiae who were present if they would ever consider burning their fathers’ bodies, as was the custom among Greeks. The Callatiae were horrified at the suggestion. Herodotus sees this story as vindicating the poet Pindar’s dictum that “custom is lord of all”; people’s beliefs and practices are shaped by custom, and they typically assume that their own ways are the best.
Herodotus’ anecdote is not an isolated moment of reflection on cultural diversity and the conventional basis for morality. The sophists—notably Protagoras, Gorgias, and some of their followers—were also associated with relativistic thinking. As itinerant intellectuals and teachers, the sophists were cosmopolitan, impressed by and prompted to reflect upon the diversity in religions, political systems, laws, manners, and tastes they encountered in different societies. Protagoras, who famously asserted that “man is the measure of all things,” seems to have embraced a wholesale relativism that extended to truth of any kind, but this view was uncommon. More popular and influential was the contrast that many drew between nomos (law, custom) and physis (nature, natural order). In Plato’sGorgias, for instance, Callicles, a student of Gorgias, argues that human laws and conventional notions about justice are at odds with what is right according to nature (which is that the strong should dominate the weak). This view is not truly relativism, since it asserts a certain conception of justice as objectively correct, but Callicles’ stress on the merely conventional status of ordinary morality points the way towards relativism.
More radical is the position advanced by the sophist Thrasymachus in Book One of Plato’s Republic when he claims that “justice is nothing but the advantage of the stronger.” According to one interpretation, Thrasymachus is arguing that nothing is objectively right or wrong; moral language is simply a tool used by the powerful to justify the moral and legal systems that serve their interests. This view echoes the one expressed by the Athenians in Thucydides’ “Melian Dialogue” when they dismiss the Melian’s complaint that Athenian policy toward them is unjust. So, relativistic thinking seems to have been in the air at the time. Strictly speaking, it is a form of moral nihilism rather than moral relativism, but in rejecting the whole idea of objective moral truth it clears the ground for relativism.
Even though moral relativism makes its first appearance in ancient times, it hardly flourished. Plato vigorously defended the idea of an objective moral order linked to a transcendent reality while Aristotle sought to ground morality on objective facts about human nature and well-being. A few centuries later, Sextus Empiricus appears to have embraced a form of moral relativism, partly on the basis of the diversity of laws and conventions, and partly as a consequence of his Pyrrhonian skepticism that sought to eschew dogmatism. In his Outlines of Pyrrhonism, Sextus catalogues the tremendous diversity to be found between cultures in the laws and customs relating to such things as dress, diet, treatment of the dead, and sexual relations, and concludes: “seeing so great a diversity of practices, the skeptic suspends judgment as to the natural existence of anything good or bad, or generally to be done” (Sextus, Outlines of Pyrrhonism, 1, 14). But Hellenistic skepticism gave way to philosophy informed by Christianity, and moral relativism effectively became dormant and remained so throughout the period of Christian hegemony in Europe. According to the monotheistic religions, God’s will represents an objective moral touchstone. Scriptural precepts such as “Thou shalt not kill” constitute absolute, universally binding, moral truths. Relativism thus ceased to be an option until the advent of modernity.
Many scholars see the first reappearance of a relativistic outlook in the writings of Montaigne, which, not coincidentally, came on the heels of the publication of Sextus’ writings in the 1560s. In “On Custom,” Montaigne compiles his own list of radically diverse mores to be found in different societies, and asserts that “the laws of conscience which we say are born of Nature are born of custom.” (Montaigne, p. 83). In his famous essay “On Cannibals,” written around 1578, Montaigne describes the lives of so-called barbarians in the new world, noting their bravery in battle, the natural simplicity of their morals, and their uncomplicated social structure. “All this is not too bad,” he says, “but what’s the use? They don’t wear breeches.” The thrust of the essay is thus to criticize the ethnocentrism of the “civilized” Europeans who naively think themselves morally superior to such people. Furthermore, Montaigne advances as a general thesis that “each man calls barbarism whatever is not his own practice; for indeed it seems we have no other test of truth and reason than the example and pattern of the opinions and customs of the country we live in” (Montaigne, p. 152).
In the centuries following, further trends in modern philosophy helped prepare the way for moral relativism by chipping away at people’s faith in the objectivity of ethics. In the 17th century, Hobbes argued for a social contract view of morality that sees moral rules, like laws, as something human beings agree upon in order to make social living possible. An implication of this view is that moral tenets are not right or wrong according to whether they correspond to some transcendent blueprint; rather, they should be appraised pragmatically according to how well they serve their purpose.
Hume, like Montaigne, was heavily influenced by ancient skepticism, and this colors his view of morality. His argument, that prescriptions saying how we should act cannot be logically derived from factual claims about the way things are, raised doubts about the possibility of proving the correctness of any particular moral point of view. So, too, did his insistence that morality is based ultimately on feelings rather than on reason. Hume was not a relativist, but his arguments helped support elements of relativism. With the remarkable progress of science in the 19th and 20th centuries, the fact-value distinction became entrenched in mainstream philosophy and social science. Science came to be seen as offering value-neutral descriptions of an independently existing reality; moral claims, by contrast, came to be viewed by many as mere expressions of emotional attitudes. This view of morality suggests that all moral outlooks are on the same logical plane, with none capable of being proved correct or superior to all the rest.
There are relativistic tendencies in Marx’s critique of bourgeois morality as an ideology expressing certain class interests. According to one interpretation, Marx holds that there is no objectively true moral system, only interest-serving ideologies that use moral language. But Marx wrote little about ethics, so it is hard to pin down his philosophical views about the nature of morality and the status of moral claims.
Nietzsche, on the other hand, wrote extensively and influentially about morality. Scholars disagree about whether he should be classified as a relativist, but his thought certainly has a pronounced relativistic thrust. His famous pronouncement that “God is dead” implies, among other things, that the idea of a transcendent or objective justification for moral claims—whether it be God, Platonic Forms, or Reason—is no longer credible. And he explicitly embraces a form of perspectivism according to which “there are no moral phenomena, only moral interpretations of phenomena” (Beyond Good and Evil, 108). It is true that Nietzsche likes to rank moralities according to whether they are expressions of strength or weakness, health or sickness; but he does not insist that the criteria of rank he favors constitute an objectively privileged vantage point from which different moralities can be appraised.
These philosophical ideas prepared the ground for moral relativism mainly by raising doubts about the possibility of demonstrating that any particular moral code is objectively correct. But anthropological research in the 19th and 20th centuries also encouraged relativism. Indeed, many of its leading contemporary champions from Franz Boas to Clifford Gertz have been anthropologists.
One of the first to argue at length for moral relativism was William Sumner. In his major work, Folkways, published in 1906, Sumner argues that notions about what is right and wrong are bound up with a society’s mores and are shaped by its customs, practices, and institutions. To those living within that society, the concept of moral rightness can only mean conformity to the local mores. Sumner acknowledges that if members of a culture generalize its mores into abstract principles, they will probably regard these as correct in an absolute sense. This may even be psychologically unavoidable. But it is not philosophically legitimate; the mores themselves cannot be an object of moral appraisal since there is no higher tribunal to which appeals can be made.
The work of Franz Boas was also tremendously influential. Boas viewed cultural relativism—a commitment to understanding a society in its own terms—as methodologically essential to scientific anthropology. From an objective, scientific standpoint one may not pass moral judgment on the beliefs and practices that inhere within a culture, although one may objectively assess the extent to which they help that society achieve its overarching goals. Many of Boas’ students helped disseminate this approach, and some, such as Melville Herskovits and Ruth Benedict, made more explicit its implications with respect to ethics, arguing that a relativistic outlook can help combat prejudice and promote tolerance.
The debate over moral relativism in modern times has thus not been an abstract discussion of interest only to professional philosophers. It is thought to have implications for the social sciences, for international relations, and for relations between communities within a society. In 1947, the American Anthropological Association submitted a statement to the UN Commission on Human Rights criticizing what some viewed as an attempt by the West to impose its particular values on other societies in the name of universal rights. The statement declared that:
Standards and values are relative to the culture from which they derive so that any attempt to formulate postulates that grow out of the beliefs or moral codes of one culture must to that extent detract from the applicability of any Declaration of Human Rights to mankind as a whole (American Anthropologist, Vol. 49, No. 4, p. 542).
It went on to assert that “man is free only when he lives as his society defines freedom” (ibid. p. 543). Needless to say, the statement caused some controversy since many members of the AAA did not agree with the position it laid out.
More recently, discussions of relativism have been at the center of debates about how societies with large immigrant populations should deal with the problem of multiculturalism. To what extent should the practices of minorities be accepted, even if they seem to conflict with the values of the majority culture? In France, a law was passed in 2011 banning face veils that some Muslim women view as required by Islam. Those supporting the ban appeal to values they consider universal such as sexual equality and freedom of expression (which the face veil is said to violate since it inhibits expressive interaction). But critics of the policy see it as expressing a kind of cultural intolerance, just the sort of thing that relativism claims to counter.
Defining moral relativism is difficult because different writers use the term in slightly different ways; in particular, friends and foes of relativism often diverge considerably in their characterization of it. Therefore, it is important to first distinguish between some of the positions that have been identified or closely associated with moral relativism before setting out a definition that captures the main idea its adherents seek to put forward.
Descriptive relativism is a thesis about cultural diversity. It holds that, as a matter of fact, moral beliefs and practices vary between cultures (and sometimes between groups within a single society). For instance, some societies condemn homosexuality, others accept it; in some cultures a student who corrects a teacher would be thought disrespectful; elsewhere such behavior might be encouraged.
Descriptive relativism is put forward as an empirical claim based on evidence provided by anthropological research; hence it is most strongly associated with the work of anthropologists such as William Sumner, Ruth Benedict and Meville Herskovits. There is a spectrum of possible versions of this thesis. In its strongest, most controversial form, it denies that there are any moral universals—norms or values that every human culture endorses. This extreme view is rarely, if ever, defended, since it seems reasonable to suppose that the affirmation of certain values—for instance, a concern for the wellbeing of the young– is necessary for any society to survive. But Benedict seems to approach it when she writes of the three societies she describes in Patterns of Culture that “[t]hey are oriented as wholes in different directions….traveling along different roads in pursuit of different ends and these ends and these means in one society cannot be judged in terms of those of another society, because essentially they are incommensurable” (Patterns of Culture, p. 206). In its weakest, least controversial form, descriptive relativism merely denies that all cultures share the same moral outlook. A well-known version of this has been defended by David Wong, who describes his position as “pluralistic relativism.”
The somewhat simple form of descriptive relativism, which takes any differences between the moral beliefs or practices of two cultures as evidence of a difference in moral outlooks, has been heavily criticized both by social scientists such as Solomon Asch and by philosophers such as Michele Moody-Adams. One objection is that it is difficult to establish the relativist’s claims about moral diversity in an evaluatively neutral way; for the empirical researcher who asserts that a particular moral belief is representative of a culture will have to grant the opinions of some members of that culture authoritative status while ignoring or glossing over internal conflicts and ongoing cultural changes. Another objection is that many apparent moral differences between cultures are not really fundamental disagreements about questions of value—that is, disagreements that would persist even if both parties were in full agreement about all the pertinent facts. For instance, the taboo against homosexuality in some cultures may rest on the belief that homosexuality is a sin against God that will result in the sinner suffering eternal damnation. The point of conflict between these cultures and those that tolerate homosexuality may thus be viewed as being, fundamentally, not about the intrinsic rightness or wrongness of homosexuality but the different factual beliefs they hold concerning the consequences of homosexuality.
In light of such difficulties, contemporary defenders of descriptive relativism usually prefer a fairly modest, tempered version of the doctrine. Wong, for instance, holds that human nature and the human condition set limits to how much moral systems could diverge while still counting as true moralities; but he argues that the experience of “moral ambivalence”—which occurs when one disagrees with another person’s moral views yet recognizes that their position is reasonable—is nevertheless common and usually arises when the parties put shared values in a different order of priority.
Cultural relativism asserts that the beliefs and practices of human beings are best understood by grasping them in relation to the cultural context in which they occur. It was originally put forward as, and remains today, a basic methodological principle of modern anthropology. It was championed by anthropologists like Sumner and Boas who saw it as an antidote of the unconscious ethnocentrism that may lead social scientists to misunderstand the phenomena they are observing. For instance, ritualistic infliction of pain may look, on the surface, like a punishment aimed at deterring others from wrongdoing; but it may in fact be viewed by those involved in the practice as serving a quite different function, such as purging the community of an impurity.
Ironically, an extension of this argument in favor of the view that what appears on the surface to be similar acts can have different “situational meanings” has been used as an objection to descriptive relativism. Thus, Gestalt psychologist Karl Duncker, argued that the action by an Eskimo of killing his aged parent, where this is socially sanctioned as a way to spare their suffering, is not the same act as the killing of a parent in a society where such an action would generally be condemned as murder. Since the meaning of each act differs, we should not infer that the values of the two societies are necessarily in conflict.
The term cultural relativism is sometimes also used to denote the corollary methodological principle that social scientists, if they wish their work to have scientific status, should describe and analyze what goes on in the cultures they are studying, carefully eschewing any normative appraisal of what they observe.
Ethical non-realism is the view that there is no objective moral order that makes our moral beliefs true or false and our actions right or wrong. The term “objective” employed here is notoriously difficult to explicate; it means something like “independent of human desires, perceptions, beliefs and practices” (although the meaning of the term “independent” is equally hard to pin down). According to an ethical realist, a sentence like “slavery is wrong” is true or false regardless of the speaker’s state of mind or the norms prevailing in his or her community. This is the view held by most philosophers in the Western canon from Plato and Aristotle to Kant, Mill, and G. E. Moore. It continues to be widely held, and leading contemporary defenders of ethical realism include Thomas Nagel, John McDowell, and Richard Boyd.
Ethical non-realists obviously reject ethical realism, but not all for the same reasons; consequently there are several types of ethical non-realism. The most head-on rejection of ethical realism is perhaps the sort of moral error theory defended by J. L. Mackie. He argues that all moral claims are, strictly speaking, false since they posit properties (for example, goodness, wrongness, fairness) that are “ontologically queer” in being quite unlike any of the properties of things that we can perceive by normal empirical means. In the absence of any special faculty for detecting such properties, and therefore of any real evidence for their existence, we should conclude that they don’t exist; hence all statements that assert or presuppose that they exist are false.
A skeptical attitude toward moral realism can be more tentative than this. Hume is often interpreted as a moral skeptic who denies the possibility of proving by reason or by empirical evidence the truth of moral statements since our moral views rest entirely on our feelings. More recently, Michael Ruse, has defended an updated version of Hume, arguing that we are conditioned by evolution to hold fast to certain moral beliefs, regardless of the evidence for or against them; consequently, we should not view such beliefs as rationally justified. And Walter Sinnott-Armstrong has shown how difficult it is to refute moral skepticism, especially the sort of non-dogmatic Pyrrhonian skepticism which holds that one may be justified within a restricted context in affirming a certain moral belief—for instance, in court it is wrong to lie as opposed to telling the truth—yet not be able to justify the claim that lying, or even perjury, is wrong in some absolute, objective sense.
Ethical non-realism is typically presupposed by moral relativists, but it is not the whole of moral relativism. Clearly, no one who believes in the absolute authority of divine law or the intrinsic value of a rational will would be likely to embrace relativism. But merely denying that morality has an objective foundation of this sort does not make one a relativist; for moral relativism also asserts that moral claims may be true or false relative to some particular standpoint such as that of a specific culture or historical period.
Ethical non-cognitivism is the view that moral judgments are neither true nor false since they are not “truth-apt,” meaning they are not the kind of utterances that can have a truth-value. In this respect they are like questions or commands rather than like indicative sentences such as “Grass is green.” The most common kinds of ethical non-cognitivism in the twentieth century are forms of expressivism which view moral statements as expressions of evaluative attitudes. An especially influential version of this view, first put forward by Ogden and Richards, and later elaborated upon by A.J. Ayer and C.L. Stevenson, is emotivism. According to emotivism, moral judgments express the speaker’s feelings towards the thing being judged. So, saying “Nelson Mandela is a good man” expresses approval of Mandela; it is like saying “Hurrah for Mandela!” Other forms of ethical non-cognitivism have built on this idea. Prescriptivism, for instance, the view developed by R. M. Hare, acknowledges that moral statements can express emotional attitudes but sees their primary function as that of prescribing how people should behave. Thus, “stealing is wrong” is a way of saying “Don’t steal!” More recent versions of expressivism however, such as Simon Blackburn’s “quasi-realism,” hold that while moral claims are not, strictly speaking, true or false, we are justified in treating them as if they are, both in our ethical reasoning and in our practice.
Most forms of ethical non-cognitivism, like moral relativism, have been fueled by acceptance of a fact-value gap. But unlike ethical non-cognitivism, moral relativism does not deny that moral claims can be true; it only denies that they can be made true by some objective, trans-cultural moral order. It allows them to be true in the humbler, relativistic sense of being rationally acceptable from a particular cultural vantage point.
Meta-ethical relativism holds that moral judgments are not true or false in any absolute sense, but only relative to particular standpoints. This idea is essential to just about any version of moral relativism. Relativizing truth to standpoints is a way of answering in advance the objection that relativism implies that the same sentence can be both true and false. The relativity clause means that the same sentence—say, “slavery is unjust”—can be both true and false, but not in exactly the same sense, since the term “unjust” contains an implicit reference to some particular normative framework. The situation is analogous to that in which one person says “It is raining” and another person says “It is not raining.” If they are standing together at the same place and at the same time, they cannot both be right. But if they are speaking at different times or from different locations (standpoints) this is possible.
Saying that the truth of a moral claim is relative to some standpoint should not be confused with the idea that it is relative to the situation in which it is made. Only the most extreme rigorists would deny that in assessing a moral judgment we should take the particular circumstances into account. Most people would agree that lying in court to avoid a fine is wrong, while lying to a madman to protect his intended victim is justified. The particular circumstances surrounding the action alter its character and hence our appraisal of it.
Some meta-ethical relativists focus more on the justification of moral judgments rather than on their truth. Gilbert Harman, for instance, argues that when we say someone ought to do something, we imply that she has a “motivating reason”—that is, certain desires and intentions–to perform the act in question. But whether or not the person has these desires and intentions, and hence feels obliged to perform the action, is largely determined by the prevailing norms of the community to which she belongs. Feelings of moral obligation provide a justification for particular beliefs and practices; but these only arise through agents being embedded in particular social groups whose moral outlook they share.
Most moral relativists endorse some version of meta-ethical relativism. But meta-ethical relativism is not quite fully-fledged moral relativism; for one could consistently affirm it and still insist that one particular standpoint was demonstrably superior to all others. It is the denial of this possibility that gives moral relativism a more radical edge and is responsible for much of the criticism it attracts.
Normative relativism is the view that it is wrong to judge or interfere with the moral beliefs and practices of cultures that operate with a different moral framework to one’s own, that what goes on in a society should only be judged by the norms of that society. It is a prescriptive position adopted initially by many anthropologists reacting against the ethnocentrism characteristic of the colonial era. Melvelle Herskovits, for instance, affirms that “… in practice, the philosophy of relativism is a philosophy of tolerance” (Cultural Relativism, p. 31). Similar claims can be found in the writings of Ruth Benedict and Edvard Westermarck.
Because it is prescriptive, many would say that what is being described here is not really a form of relativism but is, rather, a position entailed by moral relativism. The motive behind it is to avoid arrogance and promote tolerance. But normative relativists can also argue that judging other cultures is misguided since there are no trans-cultural criteria to which one can refer in order to justify one’s judgment. Whether or not meta-ethical relativism entails normative relativism is a major bone of contention. Bernard Williams disparages with the label “vulgar relativism” the sort of thinking that simplistically infers tolerance from relativity. Geoffrey Harrison argues that while moral relativism, properly understood, is essentially a meta-ethical position about morality, the claim that we should be tolerant is one made from within a particular moral point of view; the latter does not follow the former, therefore, since they belong to different levels of discourse. And David Wong, while defending both meta-ethical and normative relativism, agrees that the former does not, by itself, entail the latter, some sort of independent principle of liberal political theory being also needed to support a non-interventionist position.
Moral relativism has been identified with all the above positions; and no formula can capture all the ways the term is used by both its advocates and its critics. But it is possible to articulate a position that most who call themselves moral relativists would endorse.
1. Moral judgments are true or false and actions are right or wrong only relative to some particular standpoint (usually the moral framework of a specific community).
2. No standpoint can be proved objectively superior to any other.
According to this view, “slavery is unjust” is true relative to the moral framework of most 21st century Norwegians, but it is false relative to the moral perspective of most white Americans in South Carolina in the 18th century. Regarding the second clause in the definition, moral philosophers from the time of Plato have sought to demonstrate the objective correctness (and hence the superiority) of a given moral outlook by showing how it conforms to God’s will, or corresponds to a metaphysical moral order, or is entailed by dictates of Reason, or accords with basic intuitions, or best meets the needs of human nature. According to the moral relativist, all such attempts fail, for they all rest on premises that belong to the standpoint being defended and need not be accepted by people who do not share that point of view.
Thus, a critic of slavery could no doubt prove the truth of what she says to anyone who accepts her basic premises—for example, that all races are equally human, and that all human beings should enjoy the same basic rights. But the argument will not convince someone who denies these premises. To them, such a “proof” of slavery’s wrongness will appear question begging, and they can reject it without being inconsistent or irrational.
The fact that one moral outlook cannot be conclusively proved superior to another does not mean, however, that it cannot be judged superior; nor does it imply that one cannot give reasons for preferring it. Gilbert Harman, for instance, holds that he can consistently affirm basic tenets of liberal morality while recognizing that his reasons for doing so may not be “motivating reasons” to someone belonging to a different moral culture, and so will have no persuasive power. A moderate moral relativist like David Wong argues that some moralities are better than others on the grounds that they better serve the needs and purposes that people in all cultures share. But within the parameters imposed by the common human condition, significant variation in moral outlook is possible. For instance, between the individualistic ways of thinking that are characteristic of the modern West and the community-centered outlooks more typical of Asia—to take an example Wong considers in depth—one can express a preference, but one cannot justify it by appealing to neutral criteria of superiority. Thomas Scanlon, an even milder kind of relativist, also defends the idea that one can view another society’s moral norms as worthy of respect while still having cogent reasons for preferring one’s own.
Moral relativists typically relativize the truth of moral judgments to cultures, which may encompass an entire society or historical period (China, Victorian England) but can also designate a subculture within a society (the Pennsylvania Amish, urban street gangs). In principle, the standpoint in question could be narrowed to that of a single individual, in which case, the relativism becomes a form of moral subjectivism. But this is not a widely held position since it seems to reduce to the idea that whatever an individual believes to be right is right, and that would seem to undermine the whole idea of morality.
The main arguments for moral relativism are not necessarily all compatible. For instance, some relativists presuppose that value judgments are fundamentally different from factual judgments (which can be objectively true), while others see the truth of both kinds of judgment as irreducibly relative to some conceptual or cultural framework. The arguments given here thus represent different routes by which one may arrive at a relativistic view of morality.
Textbooks often suggest that relativists argue from the plain fact that different cultures have different moral belief systems to a relativistic view of morality; but this is an oversimplification. The path seems to be more along the following lines. Awareness of the existence of diverse moralities (a) casts doubt on the idea that there is a single true morality, and (b) encourages the idea that the morality of one’s own culture has no special status but is just one moral system among many.
The fact of diversity—if it is a fact, which some question (see section 4a below)—does not logically entail moral relativism. It does not even entail that objectivism is false. After all, there are diverse views on how human beings came to exist, but that does not imply that there is no single, objectively correct account. Nor can moral relativism really claim to explain the diversity of moral systems, although this claim is sometimes made on its behalf. For how can the mere absence of something—in this case, an objective and universally binding moral code—explain the phenomenon in question? The suggestion seems to rest on the premise that if there were an objective moral truth, there would not be such moral diversity. Presumably, the idea underlying this premise is that cultures would have by now converged on the objective moral truth. But the absence of an objective truth does not explain this lack of convergence. At most, it is merely a condition that makes diversity more likely. Cultures have different sporting preferences: Brazilians love soccer; Pakistanis prefer cricket; Mongolians are passionate about horse racing. But no one would suggest that these differences are explained by the absence of a single, objectively superior game that everyone should play.
To be sure, an objectivist has to explain why so many people seem to have failed to discover the one true moral code, while relativists are excused from this task. But explanations referencing the usual suspects—ignorance, habit, tradition, unreason, fear, self-interest, and so on—are possible.
Thus, diversity by itself proves very little. Relativists nevertheless see it as suggestive, often pointing to an analogy between moralities and religions. The existence of many different religions does not prove that none of them can claim to be the one true religion. But it obviously does raise the question of how the objective truth of any religion could possibly be demonstrated. And in the case of moralities, too, the question arises: how is it possible to prove that one is superior to all the others?
The untenability of moral objectivism is probably the most popular and persuasive justification for moral relativism–that it follows from the collapse of moral objectivism, or is at least the best alternative to objectivism. The argument obviously rests on the idea that moral objectivism has been discredited. In its oldest and most widespread form, the idea that a moral code has objective validity rests on the belief that it has some sort of divine sanction. With the decline in religious faith that is a hallmark of modernity, this foundation for morality was shaken. Consequently, much moral philosophy from the 17th century onwards has been devoted to establishing an alternative, secular foundation, one that can claim universal validity without appealing to dubious metaphysical doctrines. This is what Alasdair MacIntyre has dubbed the “enlightenment project.”
But despite the efforts of Kant, Mill, and their successors, many remain skeptical about the possibility of proving the objective truth or the universal validity of moral claims. The fact that the moral objectivists themselves cannot agree about which moral system is correct, or what its philosophical foundation should be, encourages this skepticism. But it also rests on forceful philosophical considerations. Moral judgments, say the critics of objectivism, have an irreducible evaluative component. They assert, assume, or imply that a state of affairs is good or bad, that an action is right or wrong, or that something is better than something else. But if one accepts—as many do—that value judgments are logically distinct from factual statements and cannot be derived from them, then any attempt to justify a moral claim must rest on at least some value-laden premises. And these basic moral presuppositions will not be susceptible to proof at all.
For example, an argument to prove that a husband should not beat his wife will probably rest on the assumption that men and women should enjoy equal rights. But how does one prove this to someone who categorically denies it? How does one prove that the intrinsic value of happiness should be the foundation of our moral judgments to someone who thinks that family honor is the most important value of all? Or how does one prove that individual rights are a primary good to someone whose theoretical bottom line is that individuals should be subservient to the state?
The increase in skepticism towards moral objectivism is one of the most significant shifts that has taken place in moral philosophy over the past two centuries. This trend has been reinforced by the apparent contrast between natural science and moral discourse. Science is generally thought to describe an independently existing, objective reality; and scientists from all over the world largely accept the same methodology, data, theories and conclusions, except in the case of disputes at the cutting edge of research. Ethics exhibits nothing like this degree of convergence. Gilbert Harman is one of the best-known defenders of moral relativism along these lines. But other critics of objectivism, such as Alasdair MacIntrye and Richard Rorty, have carved out relativistic positions that don’t rest on acceptance of a sharp distinction between facts and values.
Moral relativism is not the only response to the perceived problems with moral objectivism. As noted earlier, ethical non-realism, ethical non-cognitivism, emotivism, moral subjectivism, and moral skepticism are other possible responses, for the mere denial of objectivism, like the mere fact of cultural diversity, does not logically entail moral relativism. It does, however, undoubtedly make people more receptive to a relativistic outlook.
The majority of moral relativists do not embrace cognitive relativism, which offers a relativistic account of truth in general, not just the truth of moral judgments. However, some do, and this is another path to moral relativism
One of the merits of this approach to moral relativism is that it can help to clarify fundamental questions about what is meant by talk about the relativity of moral claims. What does it mean, after all, to say that moral norms are “relative to” some culture? If we are merely saying that what people think about right and wrong is influenced by the cultural environment, then the claim seems banal. If we are saying that moral beliefs and practices are causally determined by the surrounding culture, then unless one is a strict determinist, the thesis seems to be obviously false; for members raised in the same cultural community can adopt very different moral outlooks. The philosophically interesting claim at the heart of most forms of moral relativism is that moral statements are true (or false) relative to some normative standpoint, usually one characteristic of some particular culture. But what does “true relative to” mean, precisely? From an objectivist or realist point of view, the phrase makes little sense since what determines the truth or falsity of a statement is whether or not it accords with objective reality. The cognitive relativist, however, argues that this notion of truth is philosophically vacuous since it employs the notion of an independent, objective reality that lies beyond any possible experience.
Cognitive relativism holds that (a) the truth value of any judgment is relative to some particular standpoint (for example, a conceptual scheme or theoretical framework); and (b) no standpoint is metaphysically privileged over all others—there is no “God’s eye point of view” that yields the objective truth about reality. Relativists of this sort are not so impressed by the fact-value distinction. They do not view truth as a property that sentences possess in virtue of their correspondence to an independent reality. Rather, they argue that we call a sentence “true” when it coheres with the rest of our beliefs, perceptions, values, and assumptions—in other words, when it is rationally acceptable or appears justified according to our general conceptual scheme. On this view, “the earth moves around the sun” is false relative to a medieval conceptual scheme and is true relative to ours. Similarly, “homosexuality is morally wrong” is true relative to the perspective of conservative Christians and false relative to that of twenty-first century liberals. There is no essential difference between the two cases. And in both cases, it is not possible to demonstrate logically the superiority of one standpoint over the other.
This is more or less the position defended by Richard Rorty, even though he rejects the relativist label. Rorty likes to describe himself as following in the footsteps of William James and John Dewey, although his interpretation of his pragmatist predecessors is controversial. According to him, the term “true” is an “empty compliment” we pay to statements that we consider sufficiently well supported by the network of other assumptions, beliefs, and experiences that surround them.
The idea that moral relativism promotes tolerance is a normative argument. The key idea is that moral relativism encourages a certain humility. Becoming aware of the merely relative validity of one’s own moral norms makes one less likely to fall into arrogant ethnocentrism and less inclined to pass moral judgment on the beliefs and practices found in other cultures. In effect, the argument is that moral relativism entails normative relativism (see above). Ruth Benedict states the idea forcefully at the end of her influential work Patterns of Culture, when she expresses her hope that, on the basis of the sort of anthropological research she has described, “we shall arrive at a more realistic social faith, accepting as grounds of hope and as new bases for tolerance the coexisting and equally valid patterns of life which mankind has created for itself from the raw materials of existence” (Patterns of Culture, p. 257). Benedict, in fact, takes the argument a step further, arguing that the relativistic outlook she champions can be positively beneficial in helping to combat bigotry, racism, chauvinism and other forms of prejudice.
One reason for thinking that a relativistic view of morality might foster tolerance is that it will also incline us to be more self-critical. Edvard Westermarck makes this connection in his 1932 work Ethical Relativity when he says, “Could it be brought home to people that there is no absolute standard in morality, they would perhaps be on the one hand more tolerant and on the other more critical in their judgments” (Ethical Relativity, p. 59). As mentioned earlier, however, even some thinkers sympathetic to relativism, such as Harrison and Wong, are suspicious of the claim that moral relativism by itself necessarily entails a tolerant attitude toward alternative moralities. And critics of relativism, such as W.T. Stace and Karl Popper, argue that if relativism does indeed imply universal tolerance, that this constitutes an objection to it, since some things—like oppressively intolerant moral systems—should not be tolerated (see section 4g below).
The objection that relativists exaggerate cultural diversity is directed against descriptive relativism more than against moral relativism as defined above; but it has figured importantly in many debates about relativism. In its simplest form, the argument runs as follows. Every human culture has some sort of moral code, and these overlap to a considerable extent. There is a common core of shared values such as trustworthiness, friendship, and courage, along with certain prohibitions, such as those against murder or incest. Some version of the golden rule—treat others as you would have them treat you—is also encountered in almost every society. The existence of these universal values is easy to explain: they enable societies to flourish, and their absence would jeopardize a society’s chances of survival.
The claim that every society must share these basic commitments thus links up with findings in evolutionary ethics. It is also supported, according to some, by the results of the “moral sense test,” a research project conducted by Harvard’s Primate and Cognitive Neuroscience Laboratory. The project is an internet-based study of the moral intuitions of people from all over the world. The responses are sufficiently uniform, according to the laboratory’s director, Mark Hauser, to support the idea that there is a “universally shared moral faculty” common to all human beings and rooted in our evolutionary heritage. Such universalist claims are sometimes cited by those seeking to establish a generally agreed upon set of human rights or human capacities, a foundation for the work of organizations and bodies like the United Nations.
The argument that relativists exaggerate the diversity among moral systems is also advanced in a subtler form, an early version of which can be found in the Dialogue that Hume appended to his Enquiry Concerning the Principles of Morals. What appear to be striking differences in moral outlook turn out, on closer examination, to be superficial disagreements masking underlying common values. For example, some nomadic cultures have considered infanticide to be morally acceptable, while in other societies it is viewed as murder. But those carrying out infanticide may be motivated by the knowledge that they lack the resources to support the child. Their action is thus prompted by a concern for the well being of the community, and perhaps, also, a desire that the child be spared avoidable suffering—values that would be recognized and approved by people in other societies where, since additional children would be less of a burden, infanticide is prohibited. In this case, the apparent difference in values is explained by the different circumstances of the societies in question.
Other seeming differences may be explained by reference to the different factual beliefs that people hold. Take the issue of slavery. Some societies have seen nothing wrong with slavery; others view it is a moral abomination. This would seem to mark a basic and serious disparity in moral perspectives. Yet both parties may subscribe to the principle that “all men are created equal.” Their disagreement may be over whether or not the people being enslaved are fully human. And defenders of slavery in the United States did indeed used to argue that blacks were sub-human and could therefore legitimately be treated like animals rather than as human beings.
The critics of relativism thus argue that before declaring a moral difference between cultures to be fundamental we should look carefully to see whether the difference does not, at bottom, arise out of disparate living conditions or rest on conflicting factual beliefs.
The question of whether or not there are universal values has been at the center of many of the debates about moral relativism. But the expression “universal values” is ambiguous, and how it is understood affects the kind of relativism that it calls into question.
(i) “Universal values” can mean moral values or norms to which every culture, as a matter of fact, is committed. If there are universal values in this sense, then it is an objection to a strong version of descriptive relativism which sees cultural diversity as sufficiently radical to preclude any common ground that all cultures share. It is worth noting that descriptive relativism would also become false in the event of humanity eventually converging on a single moral outlook or of a catastrophe that wiped out all cultures except one. But neither scenario would falsify moral relativism as defined above, since it is not an empirical theory about anyone’s actual beliefs or practices; it is, rather, a view about the status of moral judgments and the limitations on how they can be supported.
(ii) “Universal values” can mean moral values or norms that everyone ought to affirm. This is a normative universalism. It is likely that most who hold this view see these universal values as constitutive of an objectively correct moral point of view. Understood in this way, the position is incompatible with relativism. But the view that there are, as a matter of fact, universally shared values does not entail this normative universalism. After all, every society might agree that homosexuality is wicked or that men should have dominion over women. It would not follow that everyone should embrace these values.
When relativists say that the truth of moral claims and the rightness of actions is relative to the norms and values of the culture in which they occur, they seem to assume that members of that culture will generally agree about the moral framework which they supposedly share. This may sometimes be the case; but such homogeneous and relatively static cultures are increasingly uncommon. Today, many cultures contain sub-communities that disagree sharply on matters such as abortion, capital punishment, euthanasia, polygamy, women’s rights, gay rights, drug use, or the treatment of animals. Given that this is so, which set of norms and values are we supposed to refer to when judging a belief or practice? If the relevant norms are those of the sub-culture to which the person making the claim belongs, then the relativist position seems in danger of spiraling down toward subjectivism, since there can be many sub-cultures, and some of them can be quite small.
From the other direction comes the objection that relativists tend to ignore the extent to which cultures overlap and influence one another. These criticisms are related, as both accuse relativists of presupposing an oversimplified and outdated view of what a culture is. This charge seems to have some purchase on the sort of relativism that treats the validity of moral claims as relative to specific identifiable cultures. It seems less damaging, though, to the kind of relativism that relates moral claims to general normative standpoints without requiring that these be identified with actual communities.
The most serious objection to moral relativism is that relativism implies that obvious moral wrongs are acceptable. The objection is that if we say beliefs and actions are right or wrong only relative to a specific moral standpoint, it then becomes possible to justify almost anything. We are forced to abandon the idea that some actions are just plain wrong. Nor can we justify the idea that some forms of life are obviously and uncontroversially better than others, even though almost everyone believes this. According to the relativists, say the critics, the beliefs of slave-owners and Nazis should be deemed true and their practices right relative to their conceptual-moral frameworks; and it is not possible for anyone to prove that their views are false or morally misguided, or that there are better points of view. To many, this is a reductio ad absurdum of moral relativism.
This line of attack appears compelling against normative relativism, the view that what goes on within a society should only be judged by the prevailing norms of that society. If that is one’s position, then one must hold that in a culture where, say, adulterers are stoned to death, this practice is morally right, since it is justified according to the only norms that matter— those of the society in question. The argument is less persuasive, however, against the position identified as “moral relativism” in section 2 above, since this version of relativism allows the beliefs and practices within a culture to be judged according to norms external to that culture. With this view, stoning adulterers is right relative to some moral standpoints (for instance, that of ancient Israel) and wrong according to others (for instance, that of modern liberalism). So relativists who happen to be liberal-minded denizens of the modern world are still free to judge what goes on elsewhere by their own moral norms. What makes their position relativistic is their denial that there is any neutral, transcultural court of appeal to provide an objective justification for preferring one standpoint over another.
To many critics, however, this denial is precisely what renders relativism unacceptable. In their view, both versions of relativism put all moralities on the same plane and make one’s choice between them arbitrary. In responding to this criticism, moral relativists would seem to have three options.
(i) Assert that all moralities are indeed on the same plane and we have no reasons for favoring some over others. However, virtually no one takes this position since it amounts to a form of moral nihilism.
(ii) Argue that the beliefs and practices of a culture should be appraised according to how well they enable that culture to realize the goals it sets for itself. This allows for an assessment that avoids judging according to an external standard. True, the general criterion of efficiency or success being used here could be called transcultural; but the relativist can plausibly argue that the criterion is one that every culture would accept; for to reject it would amount to saying that one did not care whether one’s society flourished or failed.
However, for the relativists, this line of defense only sets the problem back a step. The critic will next pose the question: Regarding the goals societies set for themselves, do we have any reason for preferring some goals over others? Suppose a society’s overarching goals include realizing racial purity or achieving world domination. If relativists allow for no way of appraising such goals, insisting that any preferences we express are arbitrary, then, the critics will say, their position is once more shown to be beyond the pale of common sense.
(iii) A third option for relativists is to embrace what might be called (following Richard Rorty) an “ethnocentric” position. Relativists of this stripe continue to insist that all moralities are in the same boat insofar as none can be conclusively proved in some absolute sense to be true or false, right or wrong, or better than any other available moral outlook. But, they argue, it does not follow from this that relativists cannot consistently prefer some moralities over others, nor that they cannot offer reasons for their preference. They simply admit that when they appraise moralities, they do so according to norms and values constitutive of their particular moral standpoint, one that they probably share with most other members of their cultural community. Thus, a relativist might condemn laws prohibiting homosexuality in the name of such values as happiness, freedom, and equality. But she does not claim that she can prove that this normative standpoint is objectively superior to that of the culture outlawing homosexuality. Possibly those she is criticizing might share her values, in which case they may be open to persuasion. But they might have different basic values; for instance, they may favor executing homosexuals in order to realize a certain vision of moral purity. In that case, the standoff seems to be at the level of fundamental values. And when that is the case, the relativist may accept that she cannot demonstrate the objective superiority of her views in a non question-begging way—that is, without making assumptions that those she is trying to persuade will reject.
To the critic, moral relativism implies that one moral view is just as good or as bad as any other, and to take this line is to countenance immorality. But the difference between Western academics who are moral relativists and their fellow academics who criticize them is clearly not a deep difference in moral values. They all are likely to praise democracy and condemn discrimination. The difference is, rather, at the meta-ethical level in their view of the status of moral judgments and the kind of justification they allow. The critics believe some sort of objective bulwark is needed to prevent the slide toward an “anything goes” form of moral nihilism. The relativists see this anxiety as mistaken since what it asks for is both impossible and unnecessary. In their view, an “ethnocentric” justification of one’s views is the only kind available, and it is enough.
If the rightness or wrongness of actions, practices, or institutions can only be judged by reference to the norms of the culture in which they are found, then how can members of that society criticize those norms on moral grounds? And how can they argue that the prevailing norms should be changed? If, for instance, a society has a caste system under which one caste enjoys great privileges while another caste is allowed to do only menial work, then this system will necessarily appear just according to its own norms. So there will be nothing to criticize.
One apparent way for the relativist to avoid this objection is to point out that most societies are imperfect even by their own lights; what actually happens usually falls short of the ideals espoused. For instance, an official commitment to equality is belied by discriminatory laws. Thus, a society can be self-critical by noticing gaps between its practices and its ideals. This is a weak response, however, since the sort of self-criticism it allows is quite limited. Often, the most important kind of self-criticism involves a demand that the ideals themselves be changed, as, for instance, when the American and French revolutions articulated new egalitarian values. Can moral relativism make sense of a society’s own members rejecting the prevailing norms?
The answer is that it all depends on the precise sort of moral relativism being espoused. If the particular standpoint, by reference to which moral claims are appraised, has to be that constituted by the prevailing norms in a society, then it is hard to see how those norms themselves can be criticized. But if the relativist only insists that moral claims are true or false relative to some particular standpoint, then this does not follow. In that case, the prevailing moral norms can be judged wrong from an alternative point of view, which may be the one the relativist favors. For instance, the current treatment of animals on American factory farms could be criticized by an American relativist who adopts the standpoint of a utilitarian committed to the minimization of unnecessary suffering.
Closely related to the argument concerning a society’s capacity for self-criticism is the objection that moral relativism implies there is no such thing as moral progress. A society may change its norms by, say, ending systematic discrimination against certain groups, or becoming less indifferent to the suffering of animals. But if there is no neutral point of view from which such changes can be appraised, how can one argue that they constitute progress? Indeed, from the point of view of the old norms, any changes must appear suspect, since the old norms dictate what is right.
Like the previous objection, this argument has the form of a reductio ad absurdum. Almost everyone believes that moral progress can and does occur within a society. The abolition of slavery is a paradigm of such progress. So, any theory implying that such changes do not constitute progress must be false. By the same token, moral relativism can also be criticized for not allowing the possibility of moral decline, which also presumably occurs at times.
One response a relativist could offer to this objection is simply to embrace the conclusion and insist that moral progress is a chimera; but this undeniably goes against what most people view as ethical common sense. The more common and more plausible response, therefore, is, once again, for the relativist to take the “ethnocentric” line. On this view, moral progress is possible, but not relative to objective, trans-cultural criteria. It can only be gauged by reference to some particular moral standpoint that cannot be conclusively proved superior to other points of view. Thus, relativists, like everyone else, will view the abolition of slavery as progress because they affirm values such as freedom, equality, and individual happiness. They simply deny that it represents progress in some more objective sense—from “the God’s eye point of view,” so to speak.
A standard objection to cognitive relativism, which is sometimes advanced against moral relativism, is that it is pragmatically self-refuting. The basic idea behind it is that moral relativists, whatever their official meta-ethical position, cannot avoid being implicitly committed to certain fundamental norms and values, and they presuppose this commitment in the very act of arguing for moral relativism. So, the content of the theory is at odds with the practice of affirming or defending it. Jürgen Habermas develops this line of argument by claiming that anyone participating in rational discourse reveals, through that very act, a commitment to certain values that belong to a normative notion of rationality: for instance, values such as sincerity or open-mindedness.
Relativists, however, are likely to be skeptical about the universality of these alleged implicit commitments. To them, the concept of rationality in question is characteristic of a particular time and place. To be sure, they may, as modern Western liberals, embrace values such as sincerity or open-mindedness. But they can still plausibly deny that they have an objective duty to do so, or that such values are necessarily embedded in all acts of communication and must therefore be viewed as universal.
What does it mean for a moral belief to be true relative to a particular culture? If it merely means that most members of that culture hold that belief, then it is a somewhat grandiose and misleading way of stating a simple fact. Presumably, therefore, relativists mean something more by it. In addition, they cannot be simply making the banal point that someone belonging to that culture who rejects the belief in question is in the minority, or is perceived to be mistaken by the majority. The relativist thesis seems to be that in some sense the truth (or falsity) of a person’s moral beliefs is either determined by or constituted by their coherence (or lack of coherence) with the prevailing moral outlook in that person’s community. This raises a number of awkward issues. It seems to imply, for instance, that the majority can never be wrong on moral matters. And a corollary of that is that within a given community, dissidents must always be wrong. These ideas go against our normal ways of thinking.
A further problem for the relativist thesis is that it seems not to take into account exactly how the prevailing moral norms in a society were established. If they gained ascendancy over time, shaped by collective experience, then one could perhaps view them as the outcome of an implicit social contract, and in that sense to have some claim to rationality. But what if they were initially imposed on a society forcibly by conquerors or dictatorial rulers? Does that make a difference? It certainly sounds odd to say that a moral statement that once was false can be made true by the establishment of a new religious or political order and the consolidation of its ideas.
Moral relativists are thus under some pressure to explain why they go beyond simple factual statements about what the majority in a society believes, insisting on advancing a philosophical claim about the truth of moral statements. This is one reason some would give for viewing moral relativism as an instance of a more general relativism that sees the truth of any statement as a function of its coherence with a broader theoretical framework. Relativists who base their position on a sharp distinction between facts and values must work with two distinct notions of truth: factual claims are made true by correspondence to reality; moral claims are made true by cohering with or being entailed by the surrounding conceptual scheme. Those who see truth of any kind as ultimately a matter of inter-subjective agreement may be better positioned to avoid this problem.
A good deal of the debate surrounding moral relativism has focused on its claim to exemplify and foster tolerance. There are at least three lines of criticism against this claim.
(i) Tolerance is not the same as respect.
Showing genuine respect for a culture means taking its beliefs seriously, and that means viewing them as candidates for critical appraisal. The relativist eschews any evaluation of other cultures’ norms in the name of tolerance; however, this attitude is actually patronizing. It suggests that the beliefs could not withstand critical scrutiny, or perhaps that they are just not worth appraising.
(ii) Moral relativists inconsistently posit a principle of tolerance as a universal obligation.
Relativists say we should be tolerant of beliefs and practices found in other cultures. This is a normative claim. If it applies to everyone, then it is a trans-cultural moral principle, in which case relativism is false. If, on the other hand, relativism is true, then this principle of tolerance does not express a trans-cultural obligation binding on everyone; it merely expresses the values associated with a particular moral standpoint.
Tolerance is, of course, a central value espoused by modern liberal societies. But according to the relativist’s own position, members of other societies where tolerance is not viewed so positively have no reason to accept the idea that one ought to be tolerant. So for other societies, the fact that relativism promotes tolerance is not a point in its favor, and relativists have no business preaching tolerance to them.
It would not be self-contradictory for moral relativists to hold that all moral principles have only a relative validity except for the principle of tolerance, which enjoys a unique status. But the resulting position would be peculiar. The relativistic viewpoint would be significantly modified and some account would be owed of why the principle of tolerance alone has universal validity. For this reason, a more common relativistic response to the criticism is along the lines suggested by David Wong. Relativists can simply accept that the obligation to be tolerant has only relative validity or scope. It applies to those whose general moral standpoint affirms or entails tolerance as a value; and only these people are likely to be swayed by the argument that relativism promotes tolerance.
(iii) The relativist’s advocacy of tolerance is morally misguided since not everything should be tolerated.
This is, in effect, another version of the charge that moral relativism entails an “anything goes” attitude that countenances obvious wrongs in other societies such as religious persecution or sexual discrimination. It even requires us to be tolerant of intolerance, at least if it occurs in another culture.
Clearly, this is a problem for anyone, relativist or not, who elevates the principle that we should be tolerant to an absolute, exceptionless rule. But for relativists who do not do this, the problem will seem less pressing. Tolerance, they will argue, is one of the values constitutive of their standpoint—a standpoint they share with most other people in modern liberal societies. From this standpoint, intolerance can and will be criticized, as will other policies and practices, wherever they occur, that seem to cause unhappiness or unnecessarily limit people’s prospects. The relativistic stance is useful, however, in helping to make us less arrogant about the correctness of our own norms, more sensitive to cultural contexts when looking at how others live, and a little less eager in our willingness to criticize what goes on in other cultures.
The more difficult, practical question concerns not whether we should ever criticize the beliefs and practices found in other cultures, but whether we are ever justified in trying to impose our values on them through diplomatic pressure, economic sanctions, boycotts, or military force. This question has arisen in relation to such practices as satee in India, persecution of religious or ethnic minorities, female circumcision, and legalized violence against women. But it is not a problem that only moral relativists have to confront.
Over the years moral relativism has attracted a great deal of criticism, and not just from professional philosophers. One reason for this, of course, is that it is widely perceived to be a way of thinking that is on the rise. Indeed, by the end of the twentieth century it had become a commonplace among teachers of moral philosophy in the US that the default view of morality held by the majority of college students was some form of moral relativism. Another reason for so much trenchant criticism is that a relativistic view of morality is thought by many to have pernicious consequences. For example, in September 2011, Pope Benedict XVI blamed it for the riots that had taken place in Britain a few weeks earlier, arguing that “[w]hen policies do not presume or promote objective values, the resulting moral relativism … tends instead to produce frustration, despair, selfishness and a disregard for the life and liberty of others” (National Catholic Reporter, Sept. 12, 2011).
However, the attitude labeled “moral relativism” by the pope and others who worry about the moral health of contemporary society is not a well defined or rigorously defended philosophical position. It typically amounts to little more than a skepticism about objective moral truth, often expressed as the idea that beliefs and actions are not right or wrong per se, only right or wrong for someone. Philosophers like Gilbert Harman, David Wong, and Richard Rorty who defend forms of moral relativism seek to articulate and defend philosophically sophisticated alternatives to objectivism. As they see it, they are not countenancing immorality, injustice, or moral nihilism; rather, they are trying to say something about the nature of moral claims and the justifications given for them. The main problem they face is to show how the denial of objective moral truth need not entail a subjectivism that drains the rationality out of moral discourse. Their critics, on the other hand, face the possibly even more challenging task of justifying the claim that there is such a thing as objective moral truth.
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Last updated: May 30, 2012 | Originally published: