This entry analyzes moral development as a perennial philosophical view complemented by modern empirical research programs. The two initial sections summarize what moral development is and why it is important for ethics and human nature theory. The “Roots” section notes historical versions of natural development in morality, touching on Confucius, Aristotle, Rousseau and Rawls. The next four sections assess current empirical research in moral psychology focusing on the cognitive-developmental approach of Piaget and Kohlberg and its philosophical theory. In the “Critical Specifics” section, controversies are taken up in stage theories of moral development focusing major rivalries in moral philosophy, critical and feminist theory. “Caring’s Different Voice” focuses on conflicts between justice and benevolence ethics. The “Pedagogical Implications” of moral cognition research are then summarized with a focus on classroom practices. Finally, “Related Research” is surveyed on the roles of moral perception, identity, empathy, convention/tradition, altruism and egoism, along with new moral-automaticity notions in cognitive science.
Human nature is naturally good. At least it leans decidedly toward an awareness of the good, and a preference for it, over evil and injustice. Despite appearances, human nature is inherently self-realizing and self-perfecting, if in moral understanding and aspiration more than practice. Morality grows in human beings spontaneously alongside physical limbs, basic mental and social capacities. Both individually and in social interaction the human species evolves mature moral conscience and character despite the many psychological and social impediments that slow or de-rail the process for a time.
These are the basic tenets of moral development in its most vital, if naive historical form–a dominant perspective in ancient ethics and traditional religion. By painting human nature in this ultimately elevated and dignified posture, moral development visions grounded an ultimate hope in human progress. They forecast the flowering of our species’ most humane and admirable potentials, leaving behind its troubled childhood.
Under critical scrutiny, moral development notions gradually surrendered their identification of human psychology with virtue. But for German idealism, however, their credibility continued to wane reaching a low ebb in the mid twentieth century when the “naturalness” of human morality seemed hardest to square with the stunning inhumanity engulfing much of the world at war. Scientifically, a continually strengthening fact-value distinction also placed “natural” and “moral” on opposite sides of the fence causing the history of moral development and perfectionist notions to seem mired in fallacy.
Only in the latter 19th century did moral development revive as a lively research field in social science led by the cognitive-developmental approach of Jean Piaget and Lawrence Kohlberg. Newfound credibility for this effort was garnered by abandoning the traditional geneticist position in moral development, which depicted even sophisticated moral reasoning as a physiologically, age-determined phenomenon. For cognitive-developmentalists, instead, natural development involves complex combinations of trial-and-error social interaction, guided only indirectly by certain implastic similarities in human motivation and basic cross-cultural institutions of social life. While these processes allow great variation in moral and quasi-moral socialization, their interaction yields remarkably similar patterns of coping. Only certain cognitive strategies seem capable of navigating basic social interaction successfully. Research suggests that the cognitive competences fueling them and their ordering in a certain sequence are practically unavoidable for functioning in human society. And these cognitive competences are decidedly moral in key and holistic respects.
In human nature theory (or axiology) moral development notions convey a sense of ourselves as dynamic and progressive beings. It is normal for us to be ever-evolving and aspiring beyond ourselves even beyond the maturity of adulthood. Being potentially perfect or self-realizing, we inherit an august natural legacy to fulfill in our individual characters and through community, which reveals our hidden but awesome inherent worth. On this view, we owe it to ourselves not to sit still or languish in anything less than the full completion and perfection of all our potentials and powers.
Morally speaking, making progress in this supremely elevated cause is less daunting than its supreme end-point would suggest. We are naturally prone toward it after all. What we are obliged to do is what comes most natural to us deep down. The physical and psychological laws that govern our fundamental nature are all pulling for us, offering staunch and unremitting supporting for our journey toward ideals. For ethical perfectionism, supporting by natural development, the difficult “why be moral?” was airily brushed aside in the answer, “Because it’s who we are, because it’s self-fulfilling, because it is what we are meant to be.”
But such answers raise powerful questions. If we are so ideal deep down, why are we such disappointments everywhere else? Why do we fall so characteristically short in our characters and communities, showing all manner of vice and corruption, and making a cruel and violent mess of our world?
The typical response to such telling observations comes packaged in “alienation theory.” Either the outside world corrupts us—a world we can not well control. Or the inside world corrupts us. The human part of our aspiration comes freighted with, and mired in, the lustful, grasping, animal portion of our heritage, a portion not only difficult to control but bent on running us morally out of control. Or most ironic, we corrupt ourselves, conspiring unwittingly with these other corrupting influences due to the imperfect state and function of our all-too-slowly developing capacities. Our aspiring saint within is dogged not only by demons without and within, but by the natural imperfection of time needed. For most of its course development provides us only formative tools for dealing with hostilities that greet us full-formed from the start, always at the top of their game. Our ongoing inadequacies entrench themselves as habits in personality and as social institutions guiding socialization, making our already thorny path thornier still by our own misguided hand.
The alienation gambit loses perfectionist ethics its edge over competitors, sharing their disadvantages. Perfectionist principles must engage in just as much pleading and haranguing to have us walk the straight and narrow path against the stiff wind of temptation. Our development task takes on dual roles in this struggle. Building character requires clearing away the impediments to self-discipline and social righteousness. We must fight mental distractions, motivational lusts, prejudices, false ideologies, the myriad lures of false appearance and materialist obsession. With these temptations somewhat in hand, we must shine brightly forth from our natural core, “polishing our mirrors” so that unfolding capacities rise to their full level of flourishing. This pro-active urging of our spontaneous development is natural as well. Faced with the prospect of such awesome self-realization we can not just sit idly by, watching it take its natural pace, but instead offer a boost.
In ancient philosophies, moral development was normally conceived “teleologically.” This means defining the inherent reality or essence of a moral phenomenon by the valuable function or purpose it ultimately serves. Teleology is a strong version of functionalism—x is what x does (well).
Confucian traditions attributed “four beginnings” to human personality, which naturally unfolded into defining human virtues. These were reason (which becomes moral understanding) affiliation or fellow-feeling (which transmutes into compassion), resentment (which yields a sense of justice) and feelings of guilt and shame (which become moral regret at having done wrong). Moving from initial inner drives to polished virtues in such a direct way stretches plausibility. It leaves mysterious how such socially subtle and adept abilities spring forth from such psychologically isolated and internal roots, despite all the other influences apparently at play. This contrasts with the Confucian view of how ritual institutions in society guide the careful crafting of artful behaviors.
Aristotle also focuses on habituation regarding ethical virtues. But strands of natural growth and moral evolution are embedded throughout his depiction of human flourishing. For him, ethical happiness or flourishing is the fulfillment of our natural human function. The “Aristotelean Principle” of cognitive motivation is one such strand, moving us to prefer more complex to less complex activities. This pulls us toward greater challenges and resulting cognitive growth in dealing with them over time. The development of the intellectual virtues is largely a process of natural growth toward natural function. And some of these (logos and sophrosune especially) play necessary roles in the proper expression of ethical virtues.
Aristotle’s approach was more plausible because its natural growth only provided tools and tendencies for able behavior. No assumption need be made that human nature is distinctly moral. With these general abilities and sensibilities in place, social experience could pick up the developing story, shaping norm-compliant traits along and behaviors. An apparent psychological principle toward moderation leaned this process norm-compliance farther toward moral norms since many distinctly moral virtues arise at the mean between and under- and overflow of non-moral motivation.
In general, the more indirect and morally non-distinctive the view, the more plausible it depicts moral development. Developmental views of morality themselves make such an advance on earlier innatist viewpoints that locate full-blown moral insight and virtue in our souls from birth. Such views cannot explain the anomaly of moral wisdom amidst the naiveté of all other childhood beliefs, nor the failure of this wisdom to actually show itself. Likewise, direct moral development views cannot explain evolution’s highly distinctive selection of such a complexly civilized and culturally mediated form of social reasoning and cooperation. Nor can they explain why peculiarly institutionalized social experience seems necessary to attain full natural edification and character.
In general, also, the logic of moral development history tells us more than its authorship, suggesting strategies for the philosophical progress on the concept. Our “inherent goodness” is best viewed as akin to genetic instructions for seeking social competence, and competence in a general sense. The basic instruction is to unpack and upgrade personality potencies as suits whichever environments will welcome their designs. Some parts of the social environment will welcome the combined expression of cognitive and social talents that enable cooperation. Some combination will be practically geared, some geared more to prudent reciprocity and mutual expectation in kind. Those that are mutually beneficial across these dimensions will progress, in a general sense of beneficial or valuable. Some will function to produce norms, and institutionalize them—norms of various sorts.
As social organization and practice moves toward beneficial divisions of labor, some norms will engender bind with traditions, other generate laws and legal systems, and some foster moral tenets of mutual fairness and respect, mutual reliance and aid. Again, each norm system endures primarily because of its respective benefits such as sense of social continuity, belonging, meaning, or worth. Our cognitive and social capacities will help shape these distinct practices and tailor their functions to them. Those that take moral shape thereby realize our inherent moral nature.
To the degree this process is unavoidable in the moral realm, and progresses in an unavoidable manner, it is natural. Yet its distinctive moral nature arises naturally, for the most part, as the fruition of its basically non-moral or morally undifferentiated path. On this indirect view, it is not that uprightness simply works in the world, as our limbs do. It is that general competencies differentiate and partner, adapting to and helping shape differentiated social environments, some of which take a moral shape and demand moral functions from them. This explains why moral tendencies would be attractive to biological selection and evolution—why our “survivalist” human psycho-biology would turn toward admirable sociality along a progressive, age-appropriate time line.
The perfectionist legacy found in writers as diverse as Augustine and Nietzche carried this indirect approach forward, more and less. Perfectionist principles urged us to develop a range of non-moral traits, serving certain individual needs and interpersonal problem-solving functions. When practiced, polished, and performed artfully together, within an artfully organized social system, these rise to the level of virtues and find their moral niche.
With the decline of teleological metaphysics and axiology, the “natural development” of morality assumed a more purely functionalist form. (Development was not pulled by a potential telos or end-point; rather it foreshadows that end-point by able handling the means to it.) Arguable, this requires that moral development be reconceived as a distributed property, crossing various domains. One might be a perfectionist ethic, a second, the functional psychology on which it rides, and, third, the adaptive needs each serves for the individual and society (Puka 1980). In such combination, moral development becomes a naturally motivated striving to fulfill those prescriptions that bid us nurture and express certain virtues. These are the virtues that, in turn, produce an effective personality and excellent overall character while fostering a thriving, progressive society.
To avoid circularity, such naturalistic views strained historically to distinguish between descriptively and normatively “natural” psychological processes—between normal and adaptive, that is. They strained further to distinguish “adaptive” from “morally apt or desirable.” And their perfectionist ethical component strained hardest to represent the transitions from minimal moral ability to high moral excellence as a smooth and homogeneous continuum. This is a stretch because excellence by its admirable nature seems extraordinary, not “natural;” it requires special efforts, not mere formative growth, to attain.
Where such straining fails, the logic of moral development falls into various fallacies, seeming to build moral norms into social and psychological ones by fiat, then trying to pass the attempt off as descriptive or factual. Efforts to avoid this outcome are worthwhile because of the valuable function moral development serves in ethics.
Any morality faces so-called strains of commitment. At base, these are strains on motivational rationality. The ultimate logical question, “Why be moral” has real-world versions: why act as I am told I should when it conflicts with what I want—with what motivates me? why struggle toward a life of integrity, when the childhood propensity to duck and weave promises an easier path to a fun-filled life? This question raises the prospect that being intellectually moral is motivationally unnatural or irrational, or even pathological. What suits our reason likely doesn’t suit our full range of motivations (some stronger than reason) that reason, to be reasonable, should take into account. As noted, the most powerful psychological answer is this. “Because doing right is what is in fact most fulfilling overall: w are spontaneously drawn to it at all levels of need, desire and interest, the more so as we grow. Moral integrity produces greater self-esteem and personal satisfaction than material acquisition and social status. Thus morally we need follow our ever-increasing propensities to do what we should, exerting that little extra to bolster and stretch those propensities. The extra effort pays tenfold in making us more of what we are at our best.”
In these respects, moral development is to ethical perfectionism what psychological egoism is to ethical egoism. It renders excellent character and virtue natural, relatively easy to achieve, fulfilling, and therefore motivationally rational. Immorality does not seem so naturally desirable to us here that it must be forbidden. Instead, it presents merely tepid attraction, notable debilitation, and therefore, an undesirable cast overall. Natural development in morality, however, can serve any type of ethic, perfectionist or otherwise, providing the needed psychological resources for fulfilling whatever obligations and pursuits it recommends. Unfortunately, neither ancient teleological views of moral development nor their functionalist successors detailed the presumed processes of psycho-moral evolution. Nor did they clarify the relation of nature to nurture involved. This pointed to the need for copious empirical investigation.
Recent philosophical history gave a rare nod to moral development through Rawls’s (1972) A Theory of Justice. Like Kant before him, Rawls paid homage to Rousseau’s vision of moral cooperation. Such cooperation is nature’s way of humanizing and civilizing the human race, not merely of institutionalizing humanity’s civilizing intent to stabilize and protect it. But we see in Rawls’s hands the degree to which supporting ethical prescriptions with psychological proclivities has retreated under threats from the naturalistic fallacy, and other category mistakes. Rawls recognizes only the logical requirement that just social institutions remain compatible with the facts of human psychology and its development so that socializing each successive generation in justice institutions will be a feasible enterprise, assuring compliance. He does not turn to moral development for moral support, grounding value prescriptions on its facts.
Rawls relied on a pre-scientific account of moral development (Rousseau’s Emile), when an entire field of social science provided an empirically-based alternative. (This field was centered just a short stroll from Rawls’s Harvard office). We see here philosophy’s reluctance to rest enduring theory on the current state of empirical research programs. (Quine paid the price of resting the epistemology of Word and Object too heavily on the Skinnerian psychology of operant conditioning.) But we also see the skepticism and controversy that marks the research field of moral development and its guiding light, Lawrence Kohlberg. Philosophy gratefully accepted the flattering role of guide in the design of Kohlberg’s research design and the interpretation of data. But Kohlberg’s presumptive preferences for one rival philosophy over all others smacked of ideological partisanship. It raised philosophical hackles as well when Kantianism was provided empirical validation, while Utilitarianism, intuitionist virtue theory and the like were disconfirmed. Had evolution really selected Kant’s categorical imperative as our racial destiny? The title of Kohlberg’s first ethics monograph did nothing to mollify philosophical ire: “From Is to Ought: How To Commit the Naturalistic Fallacy in the Study of Moral Development and Get Away With It.”
In contemporary terms, “moral development” is a research specialty of cognitive and developmental psychology, with associated research in anthropology, cognitive science, social and political psychology, law and education. A strong research partnership with moral theorists has marked this field’s development from the outset. Researchers trace evolving systems of competence in interpreting, judging, and reasoning out moral problems. These cognitive systems incorporate empathic and social role-taking abilities that promote interpersonal negotiation, relation, and community (Selman vol. 2, Hoffman vol. 5, 7) [(References with volume numbers in the text refer to the series Moral Development: A Compendium)].
But they do not cover as much of personality, sociality, or character as the original teleological notions of human nature. Attempts to find anything like natural development in such breadth of human psychology and personality were empirically unsuccessful.
Empirical research that relies so heavily on leading philosophical conceptions, distinctions and methods of analysis cannot help but interest philosophers. Its results are highly relevant to philosophical debates, suggesting important roles for philosophy in scientific practice. The Piagetian definition of moral development’s domain distinguishes fruitfully between morality, morals, ethics (as in professional codes), cultural ethos, and Ethics (as “worthy living.”). Normative reasoning and reflective meta-cognition is also carefully distinguished within commonsense cognition itself. Research focuses on phenomena that have enough internal stability and cohesiveness to be said to develop–to undergo change while retaining identity and to evolve inherent, of their own accord. (This contrasts with being shaped externally, in ways that supplant an earlier version with a somewhat similar successor over time.) Great care is taken as well to demonstrate that the moral quality of observed phenomena are improving, not simply the functional sophistication of the psychological structure in which it is embedded (Kohlberg 1981).
Normative moral theory helps design the main research tools in moral development (the posing of research dilemmas and interpretation of findings). Moral-philosophical concepts are used to define empirical coding (identification) and scoring (rating) categories by issue, judgment, rationale or principle. The success of these categories suggests that the structural adequacy of moral theory derives in part from the functionality of its logic in common sense and practice. This renders those theoretical accounts of ethics that rise from “considered moral judgments” more than armchair credibility. It suggests, moreover, that difficulties faced in applying moral principles to socio-moral issues are worth the effort, and should turn out surmountable with effort. Paths have been chartered from moral judgment to theory that should be traversable in reverse direction.
Obviously, general moral principles and their logical prescriptivity indicate little in themselves about the feasibility of an ethic. Thus the philosopher must welcome any empirical account that renders reasoning a motivating and practically effective force. Moral developmentalists detail a variety of ways that conceptual competence itself motivates principled choice and action, while also partnering with moral emotions. Uncovering empirical evidence of a distinct competence-motivation principle is a great boon to theories of practical reason and intention generally, given how central conceptualization is to human competence and adaptivity. Showing a close affiliation between reasons and emotions, competence motivation and interest principles (the pleasure principle, law of effect or reinforcement) further bolsters the case.
But the philosophical bounty from moral development goes farther. A zeal for distinguishing facts from value judgments had driven modern psychology to explain morality away. Taking crudely reductionist stands, behaviorists portrayed morality as outward conformity to the prevailing ethos of one’s social environment. Freudians, in turn, depicted morality as a combination of irrational forces born of biological drives, coupled with ego-defensive coping in the face of social threats and presses. These portrayals not only create a disjunct between moral philosophy and the psychology its views must ride on in practice, but between moral theory and social science generally.
Cognitive developmentalism restored the role of reason and discriminating emotion in moral choice. It provided a central role for self-determination and distinctly moral autonomy to boot. Cognitive research traces the detailed psychological processes by which children unconsciously, yet self-constructively recreate their own systems of thought and self. In so doing they resist the coercion of inherited and socialized influences enough to gain control over their thinking—to in fact use these forces as raw materials for structuring their thought. Tracing these processes provides empirical evidence of the deep, two-level sort of self-determination on which even the most rationalist and autonomy-focused philosophical ethics of Kantianism can stand. Psychology’s more realistic and blended notion of “cognition” also suggests ways to overcome philosophy’s own pre-empirical divide between rationalism and emotivism or related voluntarism and determinism.
Further research on meta-cognition indicates that even common sense reasoning distinguishes between interested values, moral conventions, and autonomous morality. It depicts the former as merely interested and conventional, as morally arbitrary and relative, akin to tastes and fads. The latter, by contrast, it requires to invoke reasoned support and validating evidence (Turiel vol. 2, 4). Commonsense reasoning goes further in attributing distinctly moral responsibility to people for the self-determined choices and autonomous self-expressions they make (Blasi 2004 ).
While ancient philosophical views placed our psyches in the driver’s seat of “natural development,” they also provided the environment a guiding role. On this adaptation model social environment not only “watered” our inner growth, but provided the channels through which it unfolded properly. Unless society and nature stayed within the “normal,” “civil,” or even welcoming range, our personal growth and character would become stunted. With a modern psychology divided into environmentalists or geneticists on development, a cognitivist revival of the social-interactionist, moral adaptivity perspective was a crucial innovation.
Jean Piaget (vol. 1) recognized the virtues of trying to reduce development either to nature or nurture. This is a tried and true theoretical research strategy in science and philosophy, reflecting the virtues of explanatory parsimony. Piagetians credited the role of socialization in developing moral ideologies and emotions. They saw the importance of guilt, shame and pride in reinforcing prevailing norms of right and wrong, also in developing ego-ideals and an aversive conscience-system to avoid censure from social authorities. But they recognized that even the most optimistic projections of such behaviorist and Freudian potential falls far short of capturing sophisticated moral deliberation and problem solving, not to mention interpersonal negotiation and relationship
Piaget introduced a third factor, the cognitive schema or system, that mediated the interplay of bio-psychology and socialization. He asked children to describe their intention and behavior, their goals and aspirations, and how they made sense of them. In this way, Piagetians have produced decades of evidence that children co-construct their moral reality much as they construct their physical reality and epistemology—organizing concepts as practical tools for interacting effectively with the world. The “tool” metaphor had special appeal when observing the continuity between using our limbs and coordinating our bodily movements in infancy, then using our conceptual categorizations of reality and coordinating their use through “logical” operations. Piagetians also demonstrated that continual enhancements to these operating systems could be depicted structurally, using the laws of propositional logic. This greatly improved the practical outlook for what seemed abstracted and overly general theory.
While tracing sequences of stages in the development of logical and scientific reasoning, however, Piaget only uncovered two somewhat cohesive systems of naturally-developing moral thought. The childhood “heteronomous” phase conditioned right and responsibility on concrete interests. It focused on conformity to approved social conventions as means of fulfilling them. The adult “autonomous phase” showed greater concern with doing the right thing per se within the framework of mutual purposes. This phase arose as children became critical and self-critical about their conventional moral beliefs and the social institutions supporting them, also as they began comparing different possible moral policies and practices with each other, intuiting the sorts of social purposes they needed to serve. The ability to intuit these purposes, even in the face of sparse and misleading information, is one of our great naturally-developing achievements. It provides intriguing support for those moral-political theorists who believe that the social contract model of ethics and just government is anything but the intellectual fiction that classical authors considered it. Still, with Piaget, it is unclear that the ancient philosophy of moral development and its inclusion within natural development of human personality had been reclaimed.
Lawrence Kohlberg determined to investigate whether there was much more detail and sophistication to the natural development of moral reasoning. And he doggedly pursued this singular investigation until his death, some thirty-five years later. In drawing hundreds of colleagues into his empirical and educational mission, across the globe, he virtually established moral development as a field. Kohlberg’s approach centers the field to this day, with no comparable rival but skepticism. However, much research is performed using a simpler device (DIT) developed by Rest and colleagues (2000) that also yields findings on more components of moral judgment than Kohlberg’s MJI. The continuing program of Kohlbergians and neo-Kohlbergians is best known for a moral judgment interview technique that led to a particular six-stage theory of moral judgment,also for educational programs designed to edify at-risk urban students and prison inmates, and notably, for “being controversial.” Philosophers have participated actively in the moral development debate, making Kohlberg’s work both well-known and infamous in ethics. Perhaps it should be best known for being poorly understood and critiqued.
The range of philosophical critiques that some believe discredit Kohlberg suffer from two basic flaws. They do not consider the likelihood that Kohlberg’s key interpretive models and claims are dispensable in his developmental theory. Nor do they try out the alternative position they favor (the position Kohlberg’s view is allegedly biased against) to see if this makes an appreciable difference for the findings involved. This violates normal philosophical policy on apt analysis. These shortfalls suggest a dismissive prejudgment of Kohlberg theory, based perhaps on prevailing intellectual ideologies. Contemporary thinking is averse to the apparent pigeon-holing of complex systems or inflexible (hierarchically) ordering of complex processes. Kohlberg’s frustratingly casual use of philosophical methods and overblown use of philosophical notions support such pre-judgment.
Even cursory observation suggests that Kohlberg’s philosophical self-depictions are dispensable indeed, leaving the empirically-based core of his theory in tact, and that his assessment of findings can be performed using a range of explanatory and meta-ethical standards (Puka vol. 4, Colby, Kohlberg. et. al. 1987). Kohlberg need not claim that observed development occurs in unified stages that are hierarchically integrated and arise in invariant sequence, that they culminate in a highest stage of a particular sort, or that stage development and the morality it captures is “natural” or “universal” in any cross-cultural sense. The leading theories of cognitive, ego, and social development do not make claims of this extreme sort, and yet are held adequate and valuable without them. Philosophers should be able to distinguish a developmental theory derived from data from further claims, derived theoretically, regarding the ethical significance of certain findings.
Kohlberg’s strongest and most criticized philosophical claim–that justice and rights are the central concepts of morality–is the most obviously dispensable. Kohlberg’s perennial stage descriptions center on different moral concept or theme in every stage such as prudence, benevolence, or advancing social welfare. They are even titled in this way. It was not until the fifteenth year of advancing the well-known stage theory that Kohlberg even seriously tried to find “justice operations” working in each of the stages (Colby and Kohlberg 1987).
Kohlberg’s even more fundamental claim that moral development can only be chartered where morality is non-relative seems dispensable. Moral judgment can become relatively developed, as aesthetic and culinary judgment does. There are clearly more and less developed palates and tastes, which would hold for morality were it mainly a matter of taste. Perhaps the most valuable service performed by Rest and colleagues (2000) in summarizing their twenty-years of neo-Kohlbergian research is to present the data without Kohlberg’s bold claims, showing that the stage sequence remains.
Drawing from the literature of moral philosophy, Kohlberg hypothesized that justice-as-fairness was the central moral concept, also that conflict resolution and fostering mutual cooperation were its chief aims and marks of adequacy. Kohlberg thus presented experimental subjects with moral conflicts and cooperation scenarios, recording their strategies for resolving the dilemmas involved. ( In the original longitudinal study, 52 subjects from a private Chicago boy’s school were interviewed every 3-4 years for 35 years (Colby and Kohlberg 1987)). Interview probe questions also challenged these strategies to uncover the subject’s highest level of ability versus present performance. Additional interview questions asked subjects to address issues of fairness, right, rights, responsibility, equality, guilt, law versus morality, values and ideals, promise-keeping and loyalty, benevolence and love in family relations and friendships (Kohlberg 1984). These dilemmas and questions provided respondents the opportunity to couch their responses at different social perspectives and within different social units, from primary and intimate relations to social-institutional and international perspectives.
After coding recorded interview responses (in logical, social, moral categories) Kohlberg and colleagues looked for patterns. They were particularly interested in whether the template of Piagetian stages could be put over the logical, social-perspectival, and moral aspects of responding. The results showed a six-stage sequence of such stages ranging from (a) a pre-conventional level in which children think egoistically or instrumentally, using each other to get what they want, through (b) a conventional level in which conformity to the institutional practices of one’s peer group and society are key toward maintaining group solidarity and stability, to (c) a post-conventional level at which morality is seen as a mutually created institution serving certain shared and elevated purposes—some achieved, some still being pursued. The post-conventional level shows commonsense rationales resembling those of reciprocal respect-for-persons, rule- utilitarianism, and libertarian rights.
Kohlberg’s non-empirical theorizing offended philosophical sensibilities by claiming that these findings on post-conventional morality especially support the adequacy of leading moral theories. To philosophers it seemed unlikely enough that natural selection equipped us to reproduce Kant, Mill and Locke when trying to deal with each other. Alternatively, it seemed unlikely that only these three individuals discovered and portrayed our universal moral inheritance. Claiming that the naturalistic fallacy had been overcome in this way–through a few dozens clinical interviews with Chicago school kids–also seemed a bit bold. Overlooked here is the obvious. Outside the internal debates of moral philosophers, the advisability of building general explanatory theories in a practical field like ethics is not clear. Neither is it clear that such theories can provide useful guides for choice and action. Thus hard evidence that theories further refine and elaborate thinking that works effectively on real-world moral problems should be welcome news.
Less known to philosophers are Kohlbergian observations on developmental process and its uncanny resemblance to intellectual theory building. These same observations may offer mutual support for the common sense and intellectual search for “unified theories” or understandings. The developmental process, left out of traditional accounts, starts with trial and error inquiry and experimental observation, then the differentiation of elements and observed relations among them in one’s observational field. Next these elements and relations are integrated via overarching rationales or principles designed to unify them and achieve a close correspondence between cognitive and environmental structure. The correspondence achieved is gauged functionally, by testing cognition’s predictive validity in practice. Such testing is part of general processing or assimilation of information to the stage structure achieved. This expresses ongoing competence levels until discrepant information is noticed (differentiated). Such information is then assimilated reductionistically to the structure until the discrepancies become too great and numerous. Then the structure is partially loosened or disassembled (disequilibrated) so that existing rationales can work in more ad hoc fashion, piecing together novel responses where needed. Additional ad hoc operating principles are added as well until a new more unified and coherent operating structure can be formed. When it does, we have completed stage-transition. Then the process of differentiation, accommodation, integration, and assimilative equilibrium begins once more.
While all these processes are self-constructional, they all occur quite unconsciously. This says something remarkable about our pre-intellectual capacities and routines, making the trained philosophical intellect appear less effete.
Armed with these observations on developmental stages and processes, Kohlberg derived a range of overarching. They regarded their invariant moral and psychological progression, their spontaneous (untutored) and self-constructive quality, and their universality. In addition to launching a program of cross-cultural research, Kohlberg again consulted the philosophical literature for standards of logical, normative and meta-ethical adequacy. Gauging century-old debates, Kohlberg concluded that formal Kantian criteria as less problematic than alternatives. And he installed them as measures of moral progress in development, sketching how each stage more closely fulfilled them (Kohlberg 1981).
A host of commentators later charged Kohlberg’s methodology with formalist, Kantian, and liberal-egalitarian bias. Such charges have a point. Kohlberg, after all, had not experimented with using other meta-criteria for gauging moral progress. He did not show the caution of other social scientists who imported preferred theories from other disciplines, utilizing them more hypothetically and tentatively. Still, such criticism ignores the more powerful and generalizable assessment Kohlberg offered: the stage-by-stage-comparisons in which increasing completeness and inclusivity marked moral adequacy. Here each new stage of reasoning, each operating system, was shown to add a major type of principled operation that performed a vital problem-solving function. At the same time, each retained the least problematic structures and operations of all previous stages. A largely bottom-up assessment is involved here, gauging progress away from basic inadequacy and incompleteness in both psychological and moral processing. Examples would include not considering the social or interpersonal dimension of a problem, not considering the role of key values, virtues, or responsibilities that any conceptual analysis would consider relevant.
Applied to later-stage reasoning, such assessments invoke very basic and shared adequacy criteria among competing ethical outlooks. As such they match Piaget’s approach to measuring mature logical reasoning. Such “formal-operational” thought shows the competence to consider all relevant causal possibilities, from the most relevant perspectives required, to address a wide range of scientific problems.
It is worth noting that Kohlberg’s stage sequence likely measures up on rival meta-ethical measures, e.g., on rule-utilitarian criteria of a quasi-teleological, quasi-intuitionist form. This is true, at least, so long as the weighted utilities or rules involved stress justice and rights, as in Mill, or in Bentham’s “each is to count for one” proviso. There is good reason for preferring such a utilitarian lean as well; the perennial list of criticisms lodged against utilitarianism call for it. Utilitarianism is unable to assure minimal fairness and equality, to view such considerations and others as morally inherent and untradable, to create moral disjuncts that set upper limits on obligation and lower limits on decency, to accord proper place and protection for individual autonomy, and the like. While Kohlberg never attempted such an analysis, those criticizing the lack of one never even suggested why it would be difficult to perform.
While Kohlberg originally claimed a sixth and highest stage of moral development that put Kantian respect and individual rights first. But his research program eventually recanted this finding. Ongoing worldwide research, combined with the statistical reanalyzes of existing data, de-legitimated the significance of many Stage 6 observations, leaving too little reliable data for Stage 6 claims. This locates the highest empirical stage in Kohlberg’s theory in the same place that mainstream moral philosophy finds itself after two centuries of debate—with two main competing sets of principles, one fostering the advancement of social welfare and benevolent virtues, the other a mutual respect for individual liberty. These are accompanied by several intuitive rationales concerning goods of community, interpersonal responsibility and loyalty, equal economic opportunity and toleration, and various virtues of friendship. This state of ethical affairs approaches quasi-intuitionist rule-utilitarian criteria at least as well as it approaches Kantian, deontological ones.
The presence of interpersonal and virtue rationales in later moral development is often overlooked. Indeed, Kohlberg’s own stage descriptions downplay them by focusing on what is new and distinctive in each later stage of development, not on what is inclusively preserved from earlier stages. General ethical principles are the innovation in later stages because they reflect a broadened social perspective. This misleading emphasis in stage depictions was deemed necessary by the history of stage scoring system in research, Scorers constantly confounded similar moral rationales, expressed in adjacent stage terms. Thus distinctive stage-qualities had to be emphasized at each stage. Philosophical critics who do not immerse themselves within the empirical research project and its requirements miss matters of this sort completely, failing to credit ways in which an empirically-based theory can not be altered simply to serve conceptual goals such as neutrality or elegance.
Critics rightly fault the over-interpreted nature of Kohlberg’s initial research as well as the inflated nature of his claims relative to reliable data. Qualitative research generally offers poor safeguards against an author’s peculiar interpretive preferences, helping to shape the very content of observational “data.” Recognizing this, Kohlberg invited heretics and critics of his view into his central research group over time. His conceptual interpretations were radically reanalyzed in the 1980s seeking consensus among a dozen ideologically conflicting coders and scorers, working contentiously together.
Initially, Kohlberg was not careful to control either his qualitative research method or his theory-building process for biases. Ideological (liberal) and gender (male) biases proved hardest to tame. The Kohlberg program cannot legitimately be faulted simply for having a particular focus: it need not address the full diversity of relevant topics in moral psychology. But it has clearly fallen short in considering phenomena that strongly interact with those investigated, changing their nature. Certain moral emotions should have been researched that help set cognitive orientation, gather crucial information (Blum 1980), or facilitate moral self-expression and relation (Gilligan vol. 6). Empathy and compassion should have been investigated alongside cognitive role-taking and perspective-taking since, as moral competences, they are unlikely to function separately (Hoffman vol. 7). The same can be said for the relation of moral cognitive and meta-cognition at higher levels of development (Gibbs vol.4, 5). Kohlberg followed Piaget in conceiving moral development personally and psychologically, not seriously researching the phenomenon as an interpersonal or relational process above all, or one pertaining primarily to small communities. Such apparent shortfalls top a virtual catalogue of charged deficiencies, some holding particular philosophical interest.
Methodological: (1) Empirical researchers should seek their subjects’ own opinions on what morality encompasses and when it progresses or sinks low. Moral relevance and adequacy should not be pre-defined by “expert” theorists on theoretical grounds exclusively, intellectually limiting the scope and determining the emphasis of research. (2) At least one survey (Gilligan and Murphy vol. 4) indicates that subjects spontaneously conceive morality as setting value priorities or aspiring toward ideals when conceiving morality, as well as defining the kind of person one is. Testing subjects’ abilities to resolve conflicts of interest doesn’t get at these (teleological) moral sensibilities. (3) The use of an all-male sample in Kohlberg’s original, central, and ongoing study of moral development is not only unacceptable by present-day research standards. Instead, given the accumulated data on gender differences, the results should be radically reinterpreted as tracing male moral development primarily, not natural or human development. (4) The stage-system model of moral development does violence to data that shows a majority of subjects scoring at two and sometimes even three adjacent “stages” (out of five). This suggests that people remain distributed across the range of their development for most of their lives in a loose confederation of rationales and beliefs. (5) Asking research subjects to first resolve a moral dilemma then give reasons for their choice does not focus on moral reasoning or problem-solving competence, but on the ability to explain or justify judgments. Such an approach can not even distinguish justification from self-deceptive rationalization.
Conceptual: (1) Due to the many cultural and epochal influences on cognition, conceptual safeguards should have been in place to assure that American research on moral development did not unduly reflect western ideology. This includes the “social contract” or “natural rights” heritage of Anglo-American ideology (Sullivan vol. 4). (2) Defining adequate moral judgments as the decisive resolution of conflicting interests or duties fails to inquire into non-decisive, non-contending moral competences and their adequacy. These might include trying to avoid or skirt moral dilemmas due to harm done some parties by resolving them, or trying to pre-empt moral dilemmas through dialogue and negotiation aimed at altering the prior interests of involved parties (Gilligan and Murphy vol. 6). (3) Interpreting moral responses in exclusively structural or systemic terms, organized by general principles, ignores intuitionist and pluralist ethical considerations. It also ignores emotional sensibilities and intelligences, thus grossly distorting the moral-development profile. (4) Focusing moral development research on reasoning, not on traits producing expressive behavior, misses what is adequacy about moral development. The observed judgment-action gap allows a highest stage reasoner to be a high-level hypocrite, self-deceiver, and cad (Straughan vol. 4). (5) A great intermixing of moral and political perspectives, as well as similar moral and political concepts seems to occur in later developmental stages, as in some philosophical theories. Do we interpret this as a natural developing competence or incompetence? It fails in cognitive differentiation, yet seemingly shares a tendency found in expert ethical theories.
Kohlbergians have often tested and accommodated the panoply of criticisms leveled at them. Thus they have come to see the dialectic of debate as the central natural developmental course of their research program. Their absorption of many critics into their research team adds credibility to this portrayal. Some critiques have not yet been addressed however, and should be. As philosophers seem unaware, however, later phases of the Kohlberg research program arguably have evolved the most psychometrically sophisticated coding and scoring system known to qualitative research (Colby and Kohlberg 1987). This system offers the most sophisticated integration available of conceptual and empirical assessments for interpreting data and drawing conclusions from it, and arguably has generated the most impressive results in of any research program in cognitive development or moral psychology by far–winning over major opponents (Kurtines and Grief vol. 4).
In addition, Kohlberg’s original thirty-year study, begun with the least sophisticated methodology and fewest bias controls recently received a thorough empirical reanalysis by Edelstein and Keller (vol. 5) which surprisingly confirmed most original Kohlberg findings. As noted, twenty-years of parallel studies using a completely different research measure than Kohlberg’s also confirmed main findings (Rest, Narvaez et al 2000). Proponents of this neo-Kohlbrgian approach have detailed the role of moral structure in perceiving and interpreting moral issues, also the function of intermediate sized moral concepts and rationales that bring stage logic closer to real-life cases than universal principles do (Rest, Narvaez, Bebeau and Thoma 2000). Each year several large-scale cross-cultural studies are reported testing both Kohlbergian claims and the bias charges against them. The basic moral development sequence is verified in each (see New Research in Moral Development).
In light of such findings, philosophical critics must address a question too long delayed. If Kohlbergian stage theory is misguided and misconceived on major points, how do we explain the massive data accumulated over a half-decade that continuingly and surprisingly confirm its claims? After decades of methodological and conceptual criticism, why hasn’t the depiction of moral development come close to being disconfirmed?
Critical theory can be tapped for an answer, viewing Kohlberg research as parroting the socialized ideologies of western (individualistic, male-dominated, industrialized-capitalist) societies, found in his socially brain-washed subjects. But this speaks to conceptual possibility. No competing account is offered. More, it suffers from far more of the empirical shortfalls and conceptual leaps attributed to Kohlberg by critics, condemning it by its own standards. Still, Kohlberg often warned followers not to take “those stages” too seriously. As a scientist he assumed that future research would change current findings. The depiction of moral development would be altered further when each domain of natural cognitive development was eventually integrated into a general theory of cognitive ego-development.
Of the more specific critiques coming from critical and cultural theory, one feminist-friendly version garnered most notice, especially outside research psychology. More noteworthy is the rare and rich alternative perspective on moral development that accompanied it: caring versus justice. Indeed, the caring theme offers an especially promising portrait of what benevolence ethics looks like on the practical level, in everyday life. As such it poses a far superior champion for the benevolence tradition than outsized views such as utilitarianism, or dated, intuitionist virtue theories. Feminism looks to virtue theory at its peril since, among other things, traditional trait theory has garnered very poor empirical backing. And the conceptualization of traditional virtues pre-dates both research psychology and the careful introspective or depth psychology that preceded it. The caring theme is researched as a set of interpretive skills and sensibilities, proclivities and habits, easily observed and verified. Further, caring is not only more realistic than its main virtue alternative, agape, but shows up such unconditional love as a kind of kindness-machismo.
Carol Gilligan (1982) argued that Kohlberg research, like Piagetian and Freudian research, reflected a male outlook on development. While occurring at the theoretical level, it also greatly infected Kohlbergian research methodology, making qualitative observations the fulfillment of prior ideological prophecy. The view of moral thinking and development that resulted—the “justice-and-rights orientation”–is over-abstracted, overly general and essentialistic. It focuses on foundational moral concepts only and on universal laws, not on a morality of social practice and interaction that its research claims to measure.. The moral orientation portrayed in Kohlbergian stages is rigid, formulaic or calculative, and legalistic. In personal life it is cold, aloof, and impersonal, if not manipulative and punitive. Its individualism urges contentiousness with vague threat of violence. These untoward qualities show in personal judgmentalism and blaming, in both social censure and legal punishment. But they also show in the demand-quality of rights-in-conflict, and in our restive resistance toward burdensome duties. Here, obligations are straightforwardly posed as moral burdens to be born, just as rights are cast as demands and “claims against” comrades. Responsibility is seen as diminishing free self expression when in care it is an opportunity for artful relation and fulfilling mutuality.
These observations on the coercive aspects of justice must strike a chord for ethicists, especially with Kantians who hold high the liberation of self-imposed moral laws. Vigilance against moralism within morality’s midst is a constant for non-partisan ethics. Critical-feminist ethicists can only welcome the picture of rights and duties as clubs and shields in a battle of conflicting interests. What better fits the military model of human relations glimpsed in the masculinist “state of nature” and social contract myth underlying western ideology? Need ethics be designed for remote cooperation against mutually mistrustful and threatening strangers? Must it form an artificial bridge of relation where natural relational bonds are weak, and relational know how deficient? Or can it equally serve the needs of enhancing primary relations and spreading their scope as the expression of a natural “will-to-care?” (Noddings 1985).
Gilligan (and Noddings) argued for an unrecognized sub-theme in male moral development and a preferred and comparably valid theme among women, left out of Kohlberg’s original research sample. This “care” theme focuses morality on skills of relationship—on supporting, nurturing, and being helpful, not on demanding, defending, requiring and compelling. Mature caring shows great competence in attending to others, in listening and responding sensitively to others through dialogue aimed at consensus. The inherent powers of relationship are rallied to address moral difficulties, not powers of individual ingenuity in problem solving or deliberative argumentation. As a goodness ethic, caring also emphasizes the sharing of aspirations, joys, accomplishments, and each other.
Relative to the unique longevity of the Kohlbergian program, care research remains in its infancy, as does its research methodology (Lyons, Brown, Argyris et. al. vol. 6). But even as a conceptual posit (a different voice hypothesis) care has proven extremely influential in hosts of fields spanning literature, domestic violence, leadership counseling and legal theory. It has garnered an array of serious critics in research psychology and theory (Walker, Maccoby & Greeno, Luria, Braebeck & Nunner-Winkler, Nichols, Tronto, Puka vol. 6), along with loyal devotees and defenders (Baumrind, Brown, Lyons Attanucci vol. 6). Care’s very relevance to moral development remains unclear since almost no significant longitudinal research under-wrote the view originally, nor has much been added since. The three developmental levels depicted exactly parallel what Gilligan herself portrays as coping strategies—particular strategic responses to particular kinds of personal crises (Gilligan 1982, ch 4). Such phenomena differ great from general competence systems evolved for, and able at handling moral issues generally. Gilligan also depicts care levels in the format of Perryan meta-cognition, bearing more similarities to ethical and interpersonal meta-cognition than Piagetian first-order moral judgment. (Research does not show natural meta-cognitive development, apparently, in any domain, e.g., epistemological, ontological, scientific judgment, social, self-concept.). Gilligan also refers to care levels as cognitive orientations, not competence systems, which research also shows to be quite different cognitive phenomena (Perry 1968).
Indeed, care “levels” have been defended as wholly different phenomena from Kohlbergian levels or stages, despite being depicted for two decades as constituting a comparable and parallel developmental path (Brown and Tappan vol. 6). Gilligan seemingly favors the “different realities” portrayal from the outset, noting that care orientations are likely some undetermined mixture of biology, socialization, experience, reflection and cognitive construction. Indeed, they are an admitted function of masculinist, sexist socialization in part (Gilligan 1982, Intro, chs. 1 and 3). After their initial depiction, moreover, the developmental levels of caring have rarely received mention in the care literature.
To philosophers, however, placing the depictions of caring cognition alongside Kohlbergian stages points to a progressive sequence that such a benevolence ethic might take, naturally developing or not. As such, it suggests an educational curriculum that would foster current communitarian interest and cross-disciplinary feminism. The care ethic is of exceptional utility in the classroom, proving much more applicable for addressing real-world moral issues than any so-called applied ethic derived from moral philosophy or stage structure. Certainly mature care can be applied to moral issues more easily than Kohlberg’s depiction of post-conventional moral reasoning. Students are struck by care’s preference for suspending judgment or making tentative and shaded judgments on moral difficulties that call out for interpersonal struggle and negotiation over time. For many, ethics seems too murky, and ethical problems too sparse on information to allow decisive, disjunctive solutions of a right-wrong, just-unjust variety.
Any developmental approach to education starts with this recognition: teachers are presenting ways to think to students who already have their own very competent ways to think. And students will use these ways of thinking to process the teacher’s input. Moreover, many of the views being presented are intellectually refined versions of viewpoints the student has developed herself in more rudimentary forms. Thus classroom presentations must partner with a students’ current cognitive competence system. Their design must appeal to student views even when attempting to enhance and challenge those views, not aiming fill up empty space or reorganize badly filled space with something new or better.
Teachers who serve up material that is not geared to each student’s acquired level of competence are “banging their head against a wall” to some extent. Worse, their lessons are “bouncing off”—being rejected as either incomprehensible or radically discordant with good sense. Or they are being distorted and misconceived to fit the student’s operating system. Enhancing the student’s ability to understand must work the opposite effect, urging the student’s terms of understanding to accommodate to the material’s structure, broadening its categories, adding distinct categories and interrelating them. For cognitive-moral developmentalists, this means presenting material that will unsettle current terms of understanding, urging students to construct new ones. Here the teacher can only get students to teach themselves and develop their own skills, as both psychology and ethics prescribe.
The stage or unified-system notion shows its power and utility most in this context. When philosophers present the range of post-conventional ethical or political theories in class, many students are processing them at a conventional level, thus systematically distorting them. They are not misunderstanding these views in a “factual” sense, but understanding them in different terms. This distortion is even greater when a less educated portion of the American public encounters teachings such as democratic toleration, equality before the law, separation of church and state and other constitutional principles.
Because stage structures are tightly integrated and encompassing–representing the basic meaning system of each student–class discussion also will have many students talking past each other in the same systematic sense. Arguments won by one party, or consensus achieved by two, may not at all be what it seems. Mutual miscommunication may be the rule here, not shared understanding. The same applies to citizens or voters in public discussion. Those parts of a discussion that end in greatest confusion, disagreement, and mutual dissatisfaction may be most educationally productive. And this is not simply because they provide food for reflective thought. Rather, at a deeper level, they may help initiate or exacerbate existing cognitive disequilibrium. And this will move a student toward the “accommodative reintegration” of her ideas in a higher level of understanding.
Likewise, a student whose paper is “a mess” of near-contradictory lines of thought, ad hoc rationales, and the like, may be showing a much greater degree of learning than one who presents a smooth and consistent rendering of ideas. The former student will confess, anxiously, that s/he got her or himself all mixed up, tied in knots, going this way and that. “I’m to the point where I understood the material far better when I first started.” Most likely, s/he is quite wrong. If teachers are not somehow urging and testing for such confusion and anxiety—for disequilibrated rather than equilibrated writing—they are likely falling short in enhancing fundamental student understanding. The same is true if they are not demanding the reconstruction of each student’s original and ongoing ideas in the face of challenges to them.
Many instructors likely will recognize the above phenomena in their teaching, finding this picture of them part-illuminating, part-affirming. Most ethics instructors are struck by their ability to uncover commonsense Aristotles, John Stuart Mills, Kants, Humes and Lockes in their classroom, merely by posing moral questions. Moral development findings provide a deep and systematic partial explanation of this phenomenon. Many instructors recognize that some students who “get views correct” don’t have a very reflective grasp of them. Other who seem to get things wrong often are actually grappling at a much deeper level with the views. And most instructors can tell when some lectures or class discussions have no hope of getting anywhere. “The students’ minds just don’t seem open to this way of thinking.” Yes, this is precisely what developmental theory and stage unity would predict.
William Perry (1968) offers a quasi-developmental account of meta-cognitive thinking in the college years, including ethical reflection. Faculty find it useful for understanding special problems that students face when confronted with opposing conceptions of fact and value across the curriculum. For the philosopher, such confrontations occur frequently within each course. Perry’s approach explicates the particular intellectual strategies students use when coping with conflicting fundamental theories. But it also indicates major shifts in student epistemic perspectives ranging from initial absolutism through a kind of relativistic functionalism. Because the account is as clinical as it is empirical in a research sense, it offers a insightful speculations on the emotions, motivations, and anxieties students experience in doing commonsense philosophy and ethics on their educational experience.
Nel Noddings (1995) poses mature caring as a model for reorganizing public schools. Students can be taught to care across the board—from the growing of plants in the classroom, through a kind of dialogue and coming to consensus with mathematical concepts, to the nurturing of friendships in class. But more, students can learn these lessons by being truly cared for by school personnel, not just respected or graded fairly. As a hospital aims to be a care-taking institution, so a school can conceive its overall mission that way, not simply transmitting education or developing student skills and the like, but supporting, nurturing, and partnering with students in every aspect of school life. That many school personnel mistakenly believe they are already doing this indicates how crucial it is to conceive care at higher developmental levels, with many differentiations and integrations, shadings and textures of adult caring given prominence. Conventional and post-conventional caring are quite different matters. Imagine what caring of this overall sort would look like in the usually anonymous setting of a college ethics course.
The Kohlbergian approach to moral development has yielded hosts of cross-cultural studies bringing in the more developed cultural research methods of social anthropologists and creating some controversies regarding the issue of cultural relativism and universality (Sweder vol. 4, 7, Colby and Kohlberg 1987). Research on moral education, using Kohlberg research and theory, has taken several forms. Some measures the effects of discussing pointed moral dilemmas with students in the classroom, some measures the effect of creating “just communities” in which students can restructure their environment, making it more welcoming to morally sensitive reasoning.
The Kohlbergian approach also has spun of heretical research programs focused on the apparent development of moral conventions and traditions, independent of post-conventional reasoning development (Turiel vol. 2, 5), moral reflectivity, that occurs within seeming first-order moral judgment, not moving to the meta-cognitive level (Gibbs vol. 2), moral and political ideology, that often mires and masks moral reasoning within attitude schemes that bias its workings (Emler 1983), faith development that surprisingly mirrors moral cognition in its conceptualization of divinity and religious devotion (Fowler 1981, Oser 1980), and moral perception, one of several skills that enable the onset of moral deliberation, negotiation and reasoning (Rest, Narvaez, Bebeau & Thoma, 2000).
The Rest group offers a “four-component” model of ethical judgment that investigates many key components in true moral reasoning or problem solving, not clearly distinguished or investigated in Kohlbergian moral judgment. Narvaez has carried the moral perception component of this research to the classroom, assessing strategies for making students more sensitive to when morally-charged issues arise in daily life. She also has led attempts to integrate moral-development research with related cognitive science research on problem solving. Important new emphasis is being placed on non-deliberative aspects of moral judgment and “reasoning,” that show an immediate or automatic “rush to judgment.” These processes mark the typical, habitual way we handle routine moral decisions in daily life (Narvaez and Lapsley 2004 ).
Much research attention has been paid to the age-old problem of akrasia or weakness of will, termed the judgment-action gap by cognitive psychologists. The most progress in this area has been made by ego-developmentalists (Blasi 2004, Youniss & Damon vols. 2, 5). They suspect that our self-definitions—whether we view our sense of responsibility and character as central to who we are—most determine whether we practice what we moral preach. But many other factors seem involved, likely centered in moral emotions and attitudes, and the automaticity phenomena just noted. The important areas of moral motivation and emotion have proven the most difficult to get at empirically.
While not part of developmental research or theory, other specialties in psychology and philosophy frame moral-developmental concerns. Care research and feminist analysis can be seen in this way, as can Perry’s meta-cognitive research above. Psychoanalysts have performed many interesting clinical studies on moral emotions and their motivational effects, focusing on superego functions (guilt, fear, shame, regret) and the ego-ideal (pride, emulation, aspiration, internalization). Enright (vol. 7) has conducted a remarkably enduring and progressive research program on forgiveness and its effects. Hoffman, as noted, has researched empathy most extensively.
For decades, social psychologists such as Adorno and Sherif have looked at issues of cooperation and competition, authoritarianism and democracy in various types of organizations and groups. They have developed an entire area of research, Pro-Social Development, which takes a basically amoral or non-moral look at all forms of socially conforming and contributing behavior. A formative, but largely abandoned research movement in this area investigated the conditions under which onlookers will help or fail to help strangers, accepting different costs or levels of risks for doing so (Bickman vol. 7). An industrial branch of social psychology looks at fairness issues in the workplace and the effects of greater and lesser employee control there. Damon has conducted myriad studies of fairness judgments in early childhood that point to many factors not taken covered by cognitive competence systems of their development. Related areas of personality psychology look into the motivations behind forms of moral altruism especially, trying to understand the concept of self-sacrifice and doing good for its own sake (Staub vol. 7). A very interesting program of altruism research rises directly from philosophical accounts of egoism, both psychological and ethical (Batson vol. 7).
Some of the most inspiring research in moral development charts the development and reflective motivations of everyday moral exemplars and heroes. Lawrence Blum (1988) offered important distinctions among types of extraordinarily moral individuals, which were incorporated into interview research and theory by Colby and Damon in Some Do Care. Lawrence Walker has begun a long-term research program in this area as well, which likely will help tie cognitive-moral development in education to the prominent character-education and moral-literacy movement. Character education focuses intently on the nurturing of admirable traits, attitudes, outlooks and value commitments. Without more extensive psychological research to support its traditionalist emphases on core American values, traditional virtues, and the upholding of codes and creeds, this approach flirts with the discredited approaches of early Anglo-American public school education, rife with moralistic strictures and nationalistic indoctrination.
The empirical research references above can be found in the seven volume series:
Rensselaer Polytechnic Institute
U. S. A.
Last updated: June 27, 2005 | Originally published: