Moral Luck

A case of moral luck occurs whenever luck makes a moral difference. The problem of moral luck arises from a clash between the apparently widely held intuition that cases of moral luck should not occur with the fact that it is arguably impossible to prevent such cases from arising.

The literature on moral luck began in earnest in the wake of papers by Thomas Nagel and Bernard Williams. The problem of moral luck had been discussed before Nagel’s and Williams’ articles, although not under the heading of “moral luck.” Though Nagel’s paper was written as a commentary on Williams’, they have quite different emphases. Still, the same question lies at the heart of both papers and, indeed, at the heart of the literature on moral luck: can luck ever make a moral difference? This idea of a moral difference is a wide one. Various sorts of difference have been considered. The most obvious is, perhaps, a difference in what a person is morally responsible for, but it has also been suggested both that luck affects the moral justification of our actions and that it affects a person’s moral status in general (that is, that it affects how morally good or bad a person is). We shall pay more attention to these varied differences in time, but the important point for now is that both Williams and Nagel argue that luck can make a moral difference.

So what is the problem if luck makes a moral difference? The problem is that the idea of luck making a moral difference is deeply counterintuitive. We know that luck enters into our lives in countless ways. It affects our success and our happiness. We might well think, however, that morality is the one arena in which luck has no power. Consider what we might call a person’s “moral standing”—an expression we can use to stand for all the sorts of moral difference luck might be thought to make. Luck, we might think, cannot alter one’s moral standing one bit. This seems a reasonable position, but it is a position both Nagel and Williams cast into doubt. We will first consider Williams’ argument, primarily because it is the least successful. We shall see that Williams’ argument seem to fail and that what is interesting in his argument is captured much better by Nagel.

Table of Contents

  1. Williams on Moral Luck
    1. The Argument
    2. Criticisms
  2. Nagel on Moral Luck
    1. Introduction to the Problem
    2. Four Types of Luck
    3. The Problem Summarized
  3. Responses to the Problem
  4. References and Further Reading

1. Williams on Moral Luck

a. The Argument

Williams’ aim in “Moral Luck” and much of his other work is to discredit the Kantian view of morality and to suggest that it would be best to abandon the notion of morality altogether (replacing it with the wider notion he calls the “ethical”). (See Williams, 1985, for the distinction.) In doing so, Williams takes himself to be challenging not just Kantian thinking about morality, but also commonplace ideas about it. He claims the idea that morality is immune to luck is “basic to our ideas of morality” (1993a, p. 36).

Why should this be so? Because, Williams suggests, if moral value does depend on luck, it cannot be the sort of thing we think it is. We have already noted the extent to which luck permeates our lives. Some are born healthy; others with various sorts of handicaps. Some stumble into great wealth; others work hard, but always remain poor. To those on the losing end of these matters, this often seems unfair. Success of whatever kind we might seek is not equally available to all. Luck gives some head starts and holds others back. Nonetheless, we might think there is at least one sort of value which is equally available to all: moral value. Bill Gates may be richer than Jane Doe, but that does not mean he is a better person. Donovan Bailey may be faster than Jane Doe, but that does not make him her moral superior. Of course, both these men may be her moral superiors, but, if they are, luck is supposed to have nothing to do with it. Morality thus provides us with a sort of comfort. In Williams’ words, it offers “solace to a sense of the world’s unfairness” (1993a, p. 36). As Williams points out, however, this will be cold comfort if morality doesn’t matter much. Thus, just as it is essential to the notion of moral value that it is immune to luck, so, he claims, it is essential that moral value is the supreme sort of value. Williams claims that moral value can give us the solace he describes only if it really does possess these two characteristics (being immune to luck and being the supreme sort of value). Luck may bring us all sorts of hardship, but when it comes to the single most important sort of value, we are immune to luck. It is against this picture of morality that Williams’ argument must be understood. He presents us with a dilemma: either (a) moral value is (sometimes) a matter of luck or else (b) it is not the supreme sort of value. In either case, we have to give up something very important to the notion of moral value; hence, Williams thinks we should give up morality in favour of the ethical.

Williams begins the drive towards this dilemma by focusing on rational justification rather than moral justification. The cornerstone of his argument is the claim that rational justification is a matter of luck to some extent. He uses a thought experiment to make this point. Williams presents us with a story based loosely on the life of the painter Paul Gauguin. Williams’ Gauguin feels some responsibility towards his family and is reasonably happy living with them, but nonetheless abandons them, leaving them in dire straits. He does so in an attempt to become a great painter. He goes to live on a South Sea Island, believing that living in a more primitive environment will allow him to develop his gifts as a painter more fully. How can we tell whether Gauguin’s decision to do this is rationally justified? We should ask first of all, what exactly Williams means by “rational justification.” He never says, but he seems interested in the question of whether Gauguin was epistemically justified in thinking that acting as he did would increase his chances of becoming a great painter. That is, the question is whether it was rational (given Gauguin’s interests) for him to do as he did.

Williams rightly observes that it is effectively impossible to foresee whether Gauguin will succeed in his attempt to become a great painter. Even if, prior to making his decision, Gauguin had good reason to think he had considerable artistic talent, he could not be sure what would come of that talent, nor whether the decision to leave his family would help or hinder the development of that talent. In the end, says Williams, “the only thing that will justify his choice will be success itself” (1993a, p. 38). Similarly, Williams claims the only thing that could show Gauguin to be rationally unjustified is failure. Since success depends, to some extent anyway, on luck, Williams’ claim entails that rational justification depends, at least in some cases, on luck.

Not every success, however, confers justification, nor does every failure signal lack of justification. It depends on what sort of luck, if any, was involved in the success or failure. Williams distinguishes between extrinsic and intrinsic luck, claiming that only the operation of intrinsic luck is compatible with the result of a decision determining the rational justification of that decision. Roughly, intrinsic luck is luck that arises from the elements of the project or action under consideration, while extrinsic luck is luck arising from “outside” the project. In the case of Gauguin, intrinsic luck is luck arising from Gauguin himself, since he is the only one involved in his project. If Gauguin fails because it turns out that living on a South Sea Island distracts him to such an extent that he becomes a worse painter, this will be a case of bad intrinsic luck and so he will be unjustified. On the other hand, if, at the start of his project, a freak accident causes him to sustain an injury which prevents him from ever painting again, he will be neither justified nor unjustified since his project is never really carried out. His project will have failed but, as regards justification, a verdict will not be returned due to the interference of extrinsic bad luck. What matters then with regard to rational justification is intrinsic luck. If Gauguin is lucky enough to possess sufficient talent and to find circumstances in which that talent can flourish, his project will succeed. He will be justified and this will, in part, be due to (intrinsic) luck.

(Although Williams never mentions it, presumably if Gauguin were to succeed due to good extrinsic luck, he would also be neither justified nor unjustified. If an eccentric art critic were to find a way to make Gauguin’s mediocre work speak, it might be impossible to tell whether Gauguin was justified or not.)

What, if anything, does this have to do with morality? Williams hopes to inflict fatal damage on the notion of the moral by setting up a collision between rational and moral justification. Rational justification, Williams has suggested, is, at least partly, a matter of luck. Moral justification, as we have noted, is not supposed to be a matter of luck at all. This clearly leaves room for clashes between the two sorts of justification, cases in which an action is morally unjustified, but rationally justified (or vice versa). Indeed, the example of Gauguin is supposed to provide us with just such a case. Suppose that Gauguin’s decision to leave his family is morally unjustified. Since luck has nothing to do with the moral value of this decision, we can say that Gauguin’s decision is a morally bad one when he makes it and that it stays that way, regardless of how his project turns out. According to Williams, however, whether Gauguin’s decision is rationally justified is not settled when he makes it. We have to wait and see how the project turns out. Suppose, as Williams clearly means us to, that his Gauguin, like the real one, becomes a great artist (and that this does not happen as the result of extrinsic luck). Once this is the case, Gauguin’s decision is rationally justified though still morally unjustified.

This might be thought enough to generate a problem for the type of morality Williams opposes. As Judith Andre puts it:

Since rational justification is partly a matter of luck… our notion of rational justification is not synonymous with that of moral justification, and morality is not the unique source of value (1993, p. 123)

This doesn’t, however, quite get Williams’ point right. His claim was not that morality is the only source of value, but that it is the supreme source of value. On this picture, the mere fact that morality and rationality collide does not necessarily pose a problem. It would pose a problem for the Kantian, since, for Kant, to act morally is to act rationally. But remember that Williams takes as his enemy both Kantian and everyday thinking about morality. And it is not at all clear that our everyday thinking about morality requires us to endorse such a tight link between rationality and morality. So the possibility that rationality and morality may be distinct sources of value is no more troubling than the fact that morality and pleasure are distinct sources of value. There can be more than one source of value so long as moral value trumps these others sorts of value. Problems only arise when we come to consider “where we place our gratitude” that Gauguin left his family and became a painter (Williams, 1993b, p. 255). Suppose that we are genuinely grateful that Gauguin did what he did and, as a result, became a great artist. We might say this shows that, on occasion, we have reason to be glad that the morally correct thing did not happen. But to say something like this is to call into question part of the point of morality (or so Williams says). Remember Williams claims that morality “has an ultimate form of justice at its heart, and that that is its allure. …it offers… solace to a sense of the world’s unfairness” (1993a, p. 36). He adds that it can offer that solace only if moral value possesses “some special, indeed supreme, kind of dignity or importance” (1993a, p. 36).

Thus, the problem posed by the Gauguin case is not simply, as Andre suggests, that there might be other sources of value than morality floating around. The problem is that the example of Gauguin suggests morality is not the supreme source of value after all. We are supposedly stuck between two unpalatable options:

(1) If the picture is as Williams describes it, we are in a situation in which moral value and another value (rationality) clash and the other value is the winner. So much the worse for morality, it loses its position as the supreme sort of value to a sort of value which is affected by luck. In doing so, however, we are faced with an unpalatable option: morality’s ability to provide us with “solace to a sense of the world’s unfairness” is destroyed.

(It is, however, possible to concede that morality is not the supreme source of value, but not give up the claim that our lives are, in some important respect, free of luck. Susan Mendus argues that, while the case of Gauguin shows that morality is not the supreme source of value, the only values which compete with morality for supremacy are themselves free from luck. In Gauguin’s case, she claims that the value which competes with morality for supremacy is that of art and that even if Gauguin fails, “he has reason to think it worthwhile to have tried” (1988, p. 339).)

(2) This can be avoided by claiming that morality and rationality do not collide in this case. That is, we could declare that morality is dependent on luck in the same way that rationality is. This sort of move will eliminate the threat that rationality poses to morality’s supremacy, but this occurs at the expense of one of our deep commitments about morality, namely its invulnerability to luck. We are then faced with a different unpalatable option.

Either way, the notion of morality fails to escape intact. This, anyway, is what Williams would have us believe.

b. Criticisms

Despite all the attention that Williams’ article has generated, his argument is actually fairly unimpressive. It is not clear, for instance, that moral value has to be the supreme sort of value. Why can’t it just be an important sort of value (and, according to what value are the various sorts of value to be ranked anyway)? Moreover, what is there to stop us from saying that our gratitude (if we have any) that Gauguin did what he did is just misguided and so that this is not a case in which it is better that the rational thing rather than the moral thing happened? It may be that our gratitude is no indicator of whether or not it is better that Gauguin did as he did.

These large problems aside, there is an even more basic problem with Williams’ argument. It rests on a claim about rational justification that can quite easily be made to look doubtful. At the heart of Williams’ argument is the claim that a rational justification for a particular decision can only be given after the fact. This is what allows luck to enter into rational justification. If we do not accept this claim, Williams has given us no reason to think that either rational or moral justification is a matter of luck, and so we cease to have a reason to imagine a conflict between rationality and morality (on these grounds anyway). What’s more, there is good reason to doubt the claim that rational justification must sometimes be retrospective. The usual intuition about justification is that if we want to know whether Gauguin’s decision to leave his family and become a painter was a rational one, what we need to consider is the information Gauguin had available to him when he made that decision. What did he have reason to believe would be the fate of his family? What indication did he have that he had the potential to become a great painter? Did he have good reason to think his family would hinder his quest after greatness? Did he have reason to believe a move to the South Seas would help him achieve his goal? And so on. Our standard picture of justification tells us that, regardless of how things turned out, the answer to the question about Gauguin’s justification is to be found in the answers to the above questions. Luck is thought to have nothing to do with his justification. Indeed, if Gauguin is found to have been somehow relying on luck—if, for example, he had never painted anything, but just somehow felt he had greatness in him—this would weigh substantially against the rationality of his decision. The same could be said of the moral status of his decision: what counts is the information he had at the time, not how things turned out.

(Luck clearly can enter into rational justification in ways other than the one Williams has in mind. It can be a matter of luck that you are smart enough to see that the evidence you possess justifies you in holding a certain belief, or it can be a matter of luck that you possess the evidence you do. Presumably luck can enter into moral justification in the same ways, but, with good reason, no one has ever suggested there is anything troubling about this.)

The “standard picture” of justification here is admittedly an internalist one (see Internalism and Externalism in Epistemology). Such a picture is somewhat unpopular amongst philosophers these days, although it is arguably still our intuitive picture. Regardless, those favouring adding external considerations to an account of justification are no more inclined to factor in how things turn out than internalists (see, for instance, Goldman, 1989). What matters to externalists is typically not how things do turn out, but how they are likely to turn out.

Williams does have an argument against this picture of justification, which appeals to the notion of agent regret. Agent regret is a species of regret a person can feel only towards his or her own actions. It involves a “taking on” of the responsibility for some action and the desire to make amends for it. Williams’ example is of a lorry driver who “through no fault of his” runs over a small child (Williams, 1993a, p. 43). He rightly says that the driver will feel a sort of regret at the death of this child that no one else will feel. The driver, after all, caused the child’s death. Furthermore, we expect agent regret to be felt even in cases in which we do not think the agent was at fault. If we are satisfied that the driver could have done nothing else to prevent the child’s death, we will try to console him by telling him this. But, as Williams observes, we would think much less of the driver if he showed no regret at all, saying only “It’s a terrible thing that has happened, but I did everything I could to avoid it.” Williams suggests that a conception of rationality that does not involve retrospective justification has no room for agent regret and so is “an insane concept of rationality” (1993a, p. 44). His worry is that if rationality is all a matter of what is the case when we make our decisions and leaves no room for the luck that finds its way into consequences, then the lorry driver ought not to experience agent regret, but instead should simply remind himself that he did all he could.

This, however, just does not follow. The problem is that, in any plausible case of this sort, it will not be rational for the driver to believe that he could not have driven more safely. Driving just isn’t like that. Indeed, what it is rational for the driver to do is to suspect there was something else he could have done which might have saved the life of the child. If he had just been a little more alert or driving a little closer to the centre of the road. If he had been driving a little more slowly. If he had seen the child playing near the street. If his brakes had been checked more recently and so on and so on. It will be rational for him to wonder whether he could have done more to avoid this tragedy and so rational for him feel a special sort of regret at the death of the child. (See Rosebury, 1995, pp. 514-515 for this point.) Agent regret exists because we can almost never be sure we did “everything we could.” Thus, it provides us with no reason to believe there is a retrospective component to rational justification (and so no reason to conclude that luck plays the role in justification that Williams suggests).

None of this is to deny that the way things turn out may figure in the justifications people give for their past actions. It is just that, despite this, the way things turn out has nothing to do with whether or not those past actions really were justified. Sometimes the way things turn out may be all we have to go on, but this tells us nothing about the actual justification or lack thereof of our actions, not unless we confuse the state of an action being justified with the activity of justifying that action after the fact.

Why then have Williams’ claims about moral luck been taken so seriously? Because despite the shakiness of the argument he in fact gives, he has pointed the way towards a much more interesting and troubling argument about moral luck. This argument, glimpses of which can be found in Williams’ paper, is explicitly made in Thomas Nagel’s response to Williams.

2. Nagel on Moral Luck

a. Introduction to the Problem

Nagel identifies the problem of moral luck as arising from a conflict between our practice and an intuition most of us share about morality. He states the intuition as follows:

Prior to reflection it is intuitively plausible that people cannot be morally assessed for what is not their fault, or for what is due to factors beyond their control. (Nagel, 1993, p. 58)

He then gives us a rough definition of the phenomenon of moral luck:

Where a significant aspect of what someone does depends on factors beyond his control, yet we continue to treat him in that respect as an object of moral judgment, it can be called moral luck. (Nagel, 1993, p. 59)

Clearly cases of moral luck fly in the face of the above stated intuition about morality. Yet, Nagel claims that, despite our having this intuition, we frequently do make moral judgments about people based on factors that are not within their control. We might, for instance, judge a drunk driver who kills a child (call him the “unfortunate driver”) more harshly than one who does not (call him the “fortunate driver”), even if the only significant difference between the two cases is that a child happened to be playing on the road at the wrong point on the unfortunate driver’s route home. This, for Nagel, is the problem of moral luck: the tension between the intuition that a person’s moral standing cannot be affected by luck and the possibility that luck plays an important (perhaps even essential) role in determining a person’s moral standing. Nagel suggests that the intuition is correct and lies at the heart of the notion of morality, but he also endorses the view that luck will inevitably influence a person’s moral standing. This leads him to suspect there is a real paradox in the notion of morality.

We might wonder whether the problem Nagel presents is best thought of as a problem about luck or if it is really about control. That is, is Nagel’s worry that luck seems to play a role in determining a person’s moral standing or that things which are beyond that person’s control seem to affect her moral standing? The answer is both. Nagel thinks that luck should be understood as operating where control is lacking, so for him the problem about control and the problem about luck are one and the same. The important point, however, is that Nagel seems to think that, quite aside from how luck is analyzed, there is a real problem if luck ever makes a moral difference.

This is important because there is reason to think the identification of luck with lack of control is mistaken. An event can be out of one’s control or, for that matter, anyone else’s, yet still not such that we would say one is lucky that it occurred. An event such as the rising of the sun this morning was entirely out of one’s control, yet it is not at all clear that one is lucky the sun rose this morning, although it is surely a good thing that it did. Why? Perhaps because, regardless of whether one had any control over the occurrence of that event, the chance of that event occurring was very good indeed. (A successful account of luck must weave together these ideas about chance and control. Questions about the nature of luck have been dealt with remarkably little in the literature on moral luck. See Rescher, 1995, for the beginnings of an account of luck.) But even if an event’s being lucky (or unlucky) for a given person is identical with that event being out of that person’s control, we are left with a problem of moral luck. For this reason, it is in terms of luck rather than lack of control that we shall hereafter frame the problem.

The problem of moral luck lies in the thought that luck sometimes makes a moral difference. But, as we have noted, there is more than one way in which luck might make a moral difference. Two sorts of difference are discussed in the literature on moral luck, although these are not always clearly distinguished. These two sorts of difference are represented by two different thoughts: (a) the thought that the unfortunate driver is no worse a person than the fortunate driver, and (b) the thought that since we cannot plausibly hold the fortunate driver responsible for the death of a child (as no death occurred in his case), neither can we hold the unfortunate driver morally responsible for that death. The second thought has to do with the assigning of individual events to a person. The first involves a more direct assessment of a person. It involves an assessment of how much credit or discredit attaches directly to a person. We can use the term “moral worth” to capture both credit and discredit.

We have two sorts of question to consider:

  1. Can luck make a difference in a person’s moral worth?
  2. Can luck make a difference in what a person is morally responsible for?

Which of these questions is Nagel’s? It is difficult to tell. Nagel does briefly refer to the problem of moral luck as a “fundamental problem about moral responsibility,” but most of the time his worries are about blame, a notion with overtones of both sorts of moral difference (Nagel, 1993, p. 58). Is he concerned that the driver will be blamed for the event of the child’s death or that the unlucky driver himself will be rated morally worse than the lucky driver (that is, blamed more)? Nagel seems to entertain both possibilities, asking both whether the unfortunate driver is to blame for more and whether he is a worse person than the unfortunate driver. Indeed, it may be the case that Nagel thinks the two questions are inseparable, that we cannot make sense of the idea of holding a person morally to blame for some event without this, at the same time, being counted as a reason to lower that person’s moral credit rating.

Nothing Nagel says clearly reveals his position on this point. For now, it is enough simply to bear both sorts of moral difference in mind. The important point is that, in either case, there is something troubling about the idea that luck might make a moral difference. Yet, it seems we allow luck into our moral judgments all the time. We do think less of the unfortunate driver. We do hold him responsible for the death of the child. On the face of it, this might not seem particularly troubling. We might admit that, on occasion, we judge people for things that happen as a result of luck, but simply claim that in any such case a mistake has been made. The mere fact that we do sometimes judge people for things that happen due to luck does not indicate that we should judge people for things that happen due to luck nor that we intend to. The problem Nagel points out, however, is that when we consider the sorts of things that influence us “Ultimately, nothing or almost nothing about what a person does seems to be under his control” (Nagel, 1993, p. 59) That is, everything we do seems at some level to involve luck. Nagel makes a helpful comparison to the problem of epistemological skepticism. Just as the problem of skepticism emerges from the clash of our intuition that knowledge should be certain and non-accidental with the fact that few, if any, of our true beliefs are entirely certain or free from accident, so:

The erosion of moral judgment emerges not as the absurd consequence of an over-simple theory, but as a natural consequence of the ordinary idea of moral assessment, when it is applied in view of a more complete and precise account of the facts. (Nagel, 1993, 59)

b. Four Types of Luck

What are these facts? Nagel identifies four ways in which luck plays into our moral assessments:

  1. Resultant Luck: “luck in the way one’s actions and projects turn out.”
  2. Circumstantial Luck: the luck involved in “the kind of problems and situations one faces”
  3. Causal Luck: “luck in how one is determined by antecedent circumstances.”
  4. Constitutive Luck: the luck involved in one’s having the “inclinations, capacities and temperament” that one does. (Nagel, 1993, 60)10

Nagel identifies, but does not give names to all four types of luck. He does write of “constitutive luck,” an expression he probably gets from Williams. Williams, however, intends constitutive luck to have a wider scope than Nagel does. Williams appears to want constitutive luck to encompass what we have called “circumstantial” and “causal” luck (Williams, 1993a, p. 36). The names “circumstantial” and “causal” luck here are from Daniel Statman (1993, p. 11). The term “resultant luck” comes from Michael Zimmerman (1993, p. 219) Other names have been given to resultant, circumstantial, and causal luck. Resultant luck has been called “consequential luck” (Mendus, 1988, p. 334), circumstantial luck has been called “situational luck” (Walker, 1993, p. 235), and causal luck has been called “determining luck” (Mendus, 1988, p. 334).

Each of these four types of luck is worth considering so that we might be clear on the differences between the different types. We should bear in mind, however, that we may ultimately disagree about whether these constitute cases of moral luck—something we will say more about shortly.

i. Resultant Luck

Nagel gives us several examples of resultant luck. One we have already seen is the case of the fortunate and unfortunate drunk drivers. Nagel also makes much of decisions, particularly political ones, made under uncertainty. He gives the example of someone who must decide whether to instigate a revolution against a brutal regime. She knows that the revolution will be bloody and that, if it fails, those involved will be slaughtered and the regime will become even more brutal. She also knows that if no revolution occurs, the regime will become no less brutal than it currently is. If she succeeds she will be a hero, if she fails she will bear “some responsibility” for the terrible consequences of that failure (Nagel, 1993, pp. 61-62). Thus, how the revolution turns out, something which might be almost entirely a matter of resultant luck, seems to have a great deal to do with the moral credit or blame she will receive. Again, Nagel means to suggest that luck will affect not just what praise or blame she actually receives, but also what praise or blame she deserves, regardless of how she is actually treated.

ii. Circumstantial Luck

Just as luck may interfere in the course of our actions to produce results that have a profound influence on the way we are morally judged, so our luck in being in the right or wrong place at the right or wrong time can have a profound effect on the way we are morally assessed. Nagel’s example is of a person who lives in Germany during the Second World War and “behaves badly” (Nagel, 1993, p. 65). We are surely inclined to blame such a person, to hold him or her responsible for what he or she did. But Nagel asks us to contrast this person with a German who moves to Argentina shortly before the War for business reasons. Suppose that the expatriate would have behaved just as badly as the German if he had remained in Germany. Are we willing to say the expatriate should be judged as harshly as the German? If not, circumstantial luck has made a moral difference.

We can make this sort of case more troubling if we vary the way in which the person has “behaved badly.” If the bad behaviour is gleefully shooting hundreds of people as the guard of a concentration camp, then we may be inclined to think of the expatriate—who would have behaved the same way given the chance—as an undiscovered monster who rightly should be judged as harshly as the German. In such an extreme case, it is easy enough to claim that luck does not make a moral difference even if it makes a difference in whether we discover that the expatriate is so morally repellent. But, if the bad behaviour is something less drastic, say, in refusing to give refuge to a Jewish family being pursued by the Nazis, we can be much less confident that we would not have failed in the same way. Are we willing to say that those of us who would have failed had we been in such circumstances should be assessed in the same way as the German who actually failed? It is not at all clear that we are.

iii. Causal Luck

Nagel says very little about causal luck and the same is true of those who have written about moral luck after him. The worry about causal luck should be clear enough since it is precisely the sort of worry found in the debate on free will and determinism. It also seems to be a redundant sort of luck, included by Nagel only to indicate the connection between the problem of moral luck and the debate about free will and determinism. It is redundant because circumstantial and constitutive luck seem to cover the same territory. Constitutive luck covers what we are, while circumstantial luck covers what happens to us. Nothing else seems to remain that can play a role in determining what we do.

This relationship between the controversy about free will versus determinism and worries about causal luck might, as has sometimes been suggested, be applied to the whole problem of moral luck. In other words, is the entire problem of moral luck nothing but the problem of free will and determinism in different clothing? It certainly does cover some of the same territory. Like worries about the compatibility of free will and determinism, worries about moral luck get their start when we notice how much of what is supposed to be morally significant about us is simply thrust upon us whether we like it or not. But while they cover some of the same territory, the notions upon which the problems turn are quite different. In particular, neither of the notions frequently discussed in the free will debate (free will or determinism) is of central concern when we think about moral luck. Take the latter notion (determinism) first. Suppose that determinism is true (and we were aware of this), such that it would have been possible in, say, 1897 to correctly predict that Jane would win the lottery this weekend. We would be no less inclined to say that Jane was lucky to win the lottery. So luck can still exist whether or not the world is deterministic. Now consider the former notion (free will). Suppose that Jane wins the lottery, but everyone, including Jane, lacks the kind of control over their actions that freedom of the will requires. It would arguably still be appropraite to say that it was a matter of luck that Jane won the lottery. Like determinism, then, it seems that we needn’t worry about whether people possess free will when discussing moral luck. Thus, it is reasonable to think of the problem of moral luck as related to, but distinct from, the problem of free will and determinism.

iv. Constitutive Luck

A natural reaction to worries about resultant and circumstantial luck is to suggest that what matters is not how a person’s actions turn out or what circumstances they chance to encounter, but what is in that person’s “heart” so to speak. As Nagel says, we “pare each act down to its morally essential core, an inner act of pure will assessed by motive and intention” (1993, p. 63). To do so, however, is to open oneself up to worries about constitutive moral luck. If we focus on a person’s character, then what of the luck involved in determining what that person’s character is? It may be that, in a given situation, Jane did not act with good intentions, but perhaps this was because Jane was unlucky enough to be born a bitter or spiteful person. Why then should her bad intentions figure in her blameworthiness? Nagel suggests they should not. He claims that we should not praise or condemn people for qualities that are not under the control of the will (and so not under their control). But as reasonable as this may sound, Nagel also claims we cannot refrain from making judgments about a person’s moral status based upon just this sort of uncontrollable feature. If we did so refrain, it is not clear we would be able to make any judgments at all. In the end, people are assessed for what they are like, not for how they ended up that way.

c. The Problem Summarized

The notion of constitutive luck illustrates the difficulty of the problem of moral luck. Our temptation is to avoid the other sorts of luck by focusing on what the person really is. In this way, we try to discount worries about the luck that affects the way our actions turn out or the luck that places us in situations in which we make unfortunate decisions. We focus on the core of the person, on his or her character. But on reaching that core, we are disappointed to find that luck has been at work there too. The trouble is that there is nowhere further to retreat when we are at the level of moral character. If we retreat further, there is no person left to morally assess. Nagel concludes that “in a sense the problem has no solution” (1993, p. 68). The cost of not admitting the existence of moral luck is giving up the idea of agency. We seem driven to the conclusion that no one is blameworthy for anything. But the alternative is to preserve our notions of agency and responsibility by concluding that moral value is subject to luck.

So the problem of moral luck, as Nagel conceives of it, traps us between an intuition and a fact:

  1. the intuition is that luck must not make moral differences (for example, that luck must not affect a person’s moral worth, that luck must not affect what a person is morally responsible for).
  2. the fact is that luck does seem to make moral differences (for example, we blame the unfortunate driver more than the fortunate driver).

(The problem could equally well be presented as a conflict between intuitions. The fact that luck does seem to make moral differences would not be so troubling if we did not have the intuition that it is sometimes right that luck does this. We will follow Nagel in conceiving of the conflict as one between intuition and fact. This seems the natural way to introduce it. We discover the problem when we notice how practices that, at first glance, seem right conflict with our intuition that luck should not make moral differences.)

3. Responses to the Problem

Responses to the problem have been of two broad sorts:

  1. The intuition is mistaken: there is nothing wrong with luck making a moral difference.
  2. The so-called “fact” is not a fact at all: luck never does make a moral difference.

The first sort of response has been the least popular. When it has been made, the approach has usually been to suggest that, if cases of moral luck are troubling, this is only because we have a mistaken view of morality. Brynmor Browne (1992), for instance, has argued that moral luck is only troubling because we mistakenly tend to think of moral assessment as bound up with punishment. He argues that, once we correct our thinking, cases of moral luck cease to be troubling. In an argument reminiscent of Williams, Margaret Urban Walker (1993) claims that cases of moral luck are only troubling if we adopt the mistaken view of agency she calls “pure agency.” She argues that this view has repugnant implications and so should be rejected in favour a view of agency on which moral luck ceases to be troubling (namely “impure agency”). Judith Andre (1993) claims that we find cases of moral luck troubling because some of our thinking about morality is influenced by Kant. She adds, however, that the core of our thinking about morality is Aristotelian and that Aristotelians need not be troubled by cases of moral luck. The claims of all these authors are controversial.

(Martha Nussbaum’s The Fragility of Goodness (1986) is an important work in which she considers Greek views towards luck and ethics. In particular, she presents Plato and Aristotle as disagreeing about whether a good life must be invulnerable to luck, arguing that for Plato it must, but for Aristotle it need not. Her views on these matters are controversial. She has been accused of reading too much Bernard Williams into Aristotle. See Farwell (1994), Irwin (1988) and Woodruff (1989) for helpful discussions of Nussbaum’s book.)

The most popular response to the problem of moral luck has been of the second sort: to deny that cases of moral luck ever occur. This is usually done by suggesting that cases in which luck appears to make a moral difference are really cases in which luck makes an epistemic difference—that is, in which luck puts us in a better or worse position to assess a person’s moral standing (without actually changing that standing). Consider the case of the fortunate and unfortunate drivers. On this line of argument, it is claimed that there is no moral difference between them, it is just that in the case of the unfortunate driver we have a clear indication of his deficient moral standing. The fortunate driver is lucky in the sense that his moral failings may escape detection, but not in actually having a moral standing any different from that of the unfortunate driver. Along these lines, we find passages like the following:

…the luck involved relates not to our moral condition but only to our image: it relates not to what we are but to how people (ourselves included) will regard us. (Rescher, 1993, 154-5)

A culprit may thus be lucky or unlucky in how clear his deserts are. (Richards, 1993, 169)

…if actual harm occurs, the agent and others considering his act will have a painful awareness of this harm. (Jensen, 1993, 136)

…the actual harm serves only to make vivid how wicked the behaviour was because of the danger it created. (Bennett, 1995, 59-60)

While appealing, the difficulty with this response to the problem of moral luck is that it tends to work better for some sorts of luck than others. While it is plausible that resultant or circumstantial luck might make only epistemic differences, perhaps revealing or concealing a person’s character, it is not at all clear that constitutive luck can make only epistemic differences. If a person possesses a very dishonest character by luck, what feature of the person does luck reveal to us that (non-luckily) determines his moral status?

One response to this worry has been to deny that the notion of constitutive luck is coherent. (See, in particular, Rescher, 1995, pp. 155-158 and also Hurley, 1993, pp. 197-198.) This claim turns upon a substantive claim about the nature of luck, a topic that has been surprisingly absent from the literature on moral luck. So one might worry that it is only by investigating the nature of luck that we will be able to reach any sort of a final conclusion regarding the problem of moral luck. Furthermore, while it is not defended here, one might argue that such an investigation will lead to the view that cases of moral luck are both inescapable and troubling; the problem of moral luck is both real and deep.

4. References and Further Reading

The two main papers discussed in this article by Nagel and Williams, both entitled “Moral Luck,” were originally published in The Aristotelian Society Supplementary, Volume 1, 1976. Revised versions of both papers were published as chapters of Williams (1981) and Nagel (1979). The revised versions of these papers are also included in an excellent anthology edited by Daniel Statman (1993). Althought these two papers by Nagel and Williams started the discussion of the problem of moral luck using the phrase “moral luck,” the relevant problem has been discussed before. See, for instance, Joel Feinberg (1962).

  • Andre, J. (1993) “Nagel, Williams and Moral Luck.” Moral Luck. Daniel Statman (Ed.). State University of New York Press, Albany, New York, pp. 123-129.
  • Bennett, J. (1995) The Act Itself. Oxford University Press, New York.
  • Browne, B. (1992) “A Solution To The Problem of Moral Luck.” The Philosophical Quarterly. 42, pp. 345-356.
  • Farwell, P. (1994) “Aristotle, Success, and Moral Luck.” Journal of Philosophical Research. 19, pp. 37-50.
  • Feinberg, J. (1962) “Problematic Responsibility in Law and Morals.” The Philosophical Review. 71, pp. 340-351.
  • Goldman, A. (1989) “Précis and Update of Epistemology and Cognition.” Knowledge and Skepticism. Marjorie Clay and Keith Lehrer (Eds.). Westview Press, Boulder, Colorado, pp. 69-87.
  • Hurley, S. L. (1993) “Justice Without Constitutive Luck.” Ethics: Royal Institute of Philosophy Supplement. A. Phillips Griffiths (Ed.). 35, pp. 179-212.
  • Irwin, T. H. (1988) Review of The Fragility of Goodness. The Journal of Philosophy. 85, pp. 376-383.
  • Jensen, H. (1993) “Morality and Luck.” Moral Luck. Daniel Statman (Ed.). State University of New York Press, Albany, New York, pp. 131-140.
  • Kant, I. (1949) “On a Supposed Right To Lie From Altruistic Motives.” Critique of Practical Reason and Other Writings in Moral Philosophy. Lewis White Beck (Trans. & Ed.). University of Chicago Press, Chicago, pp. 346-50.
  • Mendus, S. (1988) “The Serpent and the Dove.” Philosophy. 63, pp. 331-343.
  • Nagel, T. (1979) Mortal Questions. Cambridge University Press, New York.
  • Nagel, T. (1993) “Moral Luck.” Moral Luck. Daniel Statman (Ed.). State University of New York Press, Albany, New York, pp. 57-71.
  • Nussbaum, M. (1986) The Fragility of Goodness: Luck and Ethics in Greek Tragedy and Philosophy. Cambridge University Press, New York.
  • Rescher, N. (1993) “Moral Luck.” Moral Luck. Daniel Statman (Ed.). State University of New York Press, Albany, New York, pp. 141-166.
  • Rescher, N. (1995) Luck: The Brilliant Randomness of Everyday Life. Farrar, Straus and Giroux. New York.
  • Richards, N. (1993) “Luck and Desert.” Moral Luck. Daniel Statman (Ed.). State University of New York Press, Albany, New York, pp. 167-180.
  • Rosebury, B. (1995) “Moral Responsibility and ‘Moral Luck’.” The Philosophical Review. 104, pp. 499-524.
  • Statman, D. (Ed.) (1993) Moral Luck. State University of New York Press, Albany, New York, pp. 1-25.
  • Walker, M. U. (1993) “Moral Luck and the Virtues of Impure Agency.” Moral Luck. Daniel Statman (Ed.). State University of New York Press, Albany, New York, pp. 235-250.
  • Williams, B. (1981) Moral Luck. Cambridge University Press, New York.
  • Williams, B. (1985) Ethics and the Limits of Philosophy. Harvard University Press, Cambridge, Massachusetts.
  • Williams, B. (1993a) “Moral Luck.” Moral Luck. Daniel Statman (Ed.). State University of New York Press, Albany, New York, pp. 35-55.
  • Williams, B. (1993b) “Postscript” Moral Luck. Daniel Statman (Ed.). State University of New York Press, Albany, New York, pp. 251-258.
  • Woodruff, P. (1989) “Review of Martha Nussbaum, The Fragility of Goodness.Philosophy and Phenomenological Research. 50, pp. 205-210.

Author Information

Andrew Latus
St. Francis Xavier University
U. S. A.

Categories: Ethics