Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Moral Realism

The moral realist contends that there are moral facts, so moral realism is a thesis in ontology, the study of what is. The ontological category “moral facts” includes both the descriptive moral judgment that is allegedly true of an individual, such as, “Sam is morally good,” and the descriptive moral judgment that is allegedly true for all individuals such as, “Lying for personal gain is wrong.” A signature of the latter type of moral fact is that it not only describes an enduring condition of the world but also proscribes what ought to be the case (or what ought not to be the case) in terms of an individual’s behavior.

The traditional areas of disagreement between the realist camp and the antirealist camp are cognitivism, descriptivism, moral truth, moral knowledge, and moral objectivity. The long and recalcitrant history of the realism/antirealism debate records that the focal point of the debate has been shaped and reshaped over centuries, with a third way, namely, Quasi-realism, attracting more recent attention. Quasi-realism debunks the positions of both realism and antirealism.

On the one hand, considering cognitivism, descriptivism, moral truth, moral knowledge, and moral objectivity as specifying the sufficient conditions for moral realism ignores the quasi-realist way. On the other hand, defining moral realism in a way that accommodates quasi-realism concedes too much: unlike the moral realist, the quasi-realist denies that moral facts are explanatory. Consequently, one can view quasi-realism as the contemporary heir of antirealism.

Table of Contents

  1. The Realism/Antirealism Debate
    1. Cognitivism
      1. Descriptivism
      2. Mackie’s Error Theory
      3. Waller’s Megaethical Level
    2. Truth in Moral Judgments
      1. An Analogy
      2. Skorupski’s Irrealist Cognitivism
      3. The Correspondence Theory Requires Realism, Not Vice Versa
    3. Literal Moral Truth?
    4. Moral Knowledge
    5. Moral Objectivity
  2. Quasi-Realism, Antirealism, and the EI thesis
    1. An Analogy: Quasi-Realism about Derogatory Judgments
    2. Quasi-Realism, Antirealism, and Explanationist Moral Realism
  3. Moral Realism after Quasi-Realism
  4. References and Further Reading

1. The Realism/Antirealism Debate

If there are moral facts, how can we know them? For a realist, moral facts are as certain as mathematical facts. Moral facts and mathematical facts are abstract entities, and as such, are different in kind from natural facts. One cannot literally display moral facts as one could display, say, a plant. One can display a token of the type, for example one can write “lying for personal gain is wrong” or one can write an equation; however, one cannot observe moral and mathematical facts in quite the same way as one can observe, with the aid of a microscope, clorophyll in a leaf. Such limitations of experience do not stop realists and antirealists from disagreeing on virtually every aspect of the moral practices that seem to presuppose the existence of moral facts. The list of contested areas includes moral language, moral truth, moral knowledge, moral objectivity, moral psychology, and so on. These areas are not discrete but intermingle.

The moral realist may argue for the view that there are moral facts as follows:

(1) Moral sentences are sometimes true.

(2) A sentence is true only if the truth-making relation holds between it and the thing that makes it true.

(3) Thus, true moral sentences are true only because there holds the truth-making relation between them and the things that make them true.


(4) The things that make some moral sentences true must exist.

It is a short inference from the existence of the things that make some moral sentences true to the existence of moral facts.

The moral antirealist can respond to the argument by denying any of the three premises. The antirealist could be a non-descriptivist in rejecting premise (1): no moral sentences are true for they do not describe how the world is; or, she may reject a version of the correspondence theory of truth by denying premise (2): she may argue that a sentence can be true even if there holds no truth-making relation between it and the thing that makes it true. For instance, she may be a proponent of the coherence theory of truth, which holds that a sentence can be true only when there is a truth making relation between it and other sentences relevant to it. Or, she may even reject as illegitimate the inference from “things that make some moral sentences true” to the “existence of moral facts.”

In the past, many antirealists were noncognitivists, holding that moral judgments are not cognitive states like ordinary beliefs: that is, antirealists hold that unlike beliefs, the essential function or aim of moral judgments is not to represent the world accurately. (A non-descriptivist claim is that cognitivism —more specifically descriptivism— is necessary, but not sufficient for moral realism, as will be shown presently.) Moral judgments are, according to the noncognitivist, mental states of some other kind: they are emotions, desires, or intentions of the sort that are expressed by commands or prescriptions.

If moral judgments are expressed by commands or prescriptions, then there cannot be literal moral truths. (Cf. Wright 1993. He argues that the focal discussion in the realist/antirealist debate should be about the acceptable theories of truth.) If there are no literal moral truths, then no moral judgments may be cited as evidence for knowing how the world is. Moral knowledge can no longer be considered as descriptive or propositional; or, no one is justified in believing certain things about the world in making moral judgments. This illustrates how the noncognitivist analysis of moral judgments can be escalated into the antirealist rejection of (those good names that we take for granted when we participate in moral practices such as) “moral truths” and “moral knowledge.” The antirealist’s noncognitivism threatens moral objectivity as well. Objectivity is to be found within the world. If moral judgments are not about accurately describing the world —for example, if moral judgments are about us —then moral objectivity will not be found within the world. If moral objectivity is to be found within us, then it is not the same objectivity with which we began, or, so had been the old antirealist’s way.

a. Cognitivism

If it is noncognitivism that provides the antirealist a way of rejecting moral truth, moral knowledge, and moral objectivity, the denial of noncognitivism (that is, cognitivism) must be necessary for the realist to properly claim them. Cognitivism is the view that moral judgments are cognitive states just like ordinary beliefs. It is part of their function to describe the world accurately. The realist argument that stems from cognitivism — as we saw from the above argument— is oftentimes guided by the apparent difficulties that the noncognitivist analysis of moral judgments faces. For instance, there is the famous Frege-Geach problem, namely, the noncognitivist difficulty of rendering emotive, prescriptive or projective meaning for embedded moral judgments.

Geach (1965) uses the “the Frege point,” according to which “a proposition may occur in discourse now asserted, now unasserted, and yet be recognizably the same proposition,” to establish that no noncognitivist (“the anti-descriptive theorist”) analysis of moral sentences and utterances can be adequate.

Consider a simple moral sentence: “Setting a kitten on fire is wrong.” Suppose that the simple sentence means, “Boo to setting a kitten on fire!” The Frege point dictates that the antecedent of “if setting a kitten on fire is wrong, then getting one’s friends to help setting a kitten on fire is also wrong” must mean the same as the simple sentence. But this cannot be because the antecedent of the conditional makes no such assertions while the simple moral sentence does. In other words, the noncognitivist analysis of moral sentences cannot be given to the conditional sentences with the embedded simple moral sentence. The problem can be generally applied to cases of other compound sentences such as “It is wrong to set a kitten on fire, or it is not.” Even if the noncognitivist analysis of the simple sentence were correct, compound sentences within which a simple moral sentence is embedded should be given an analysis independently of the noncognitivist analysis of it. This seems unacceptable to many. For the following argument is valid: “It is wrong to set a kitten on fire, or it is not; it is not ‘not wrong’; hence, it is wrong to set a kitten on fire.” If the argument is valid, then the conclusion must mean the same as one of the disjuncts of its first premise. The argument would be otherwise invalid because of an equivocation, and the noncognitivist seems to be forced to say that the argument is invalid.

The Frege-Geach problem demonstrates the noncognitivists’ requirement of adequately rendering emotive, prescriptive, expressive, or projective meaning of those moral sentences that are embedded within compound moral sentences. (For more on the Frege-Geach problem, see Non-Cognitivism in Ethics. See also Darwall, Gibbard, and Railton 1992: 151-52.)

The cognitivist understanding of moral judgments is at the center of moral realism. For the cognitivist, moral judgments are mental states; moral judgments are of the same kind as ordinary beliefs, that is, cognitive states. But how are we to know this? One manageable way is to focus on what we intend to do when we make moral judgments, and also on how we express them. Moral judgments are intended to be accurate descriptions of the world, and statements express moral judgments (as opposed to command or prescription) just as statements express ordinary beliefs. That is, statements express moral language. The statements that express moral judgments are either true or false just as the statements that express ordinary beliefs are. Moral truths occur when our signs match the world.

Language allows us to communicate with one another, typically using sentences and utterances. A large part of language involves, among many other things, influencing others and us. Normative language, in contrast with descriptive language, includes moral language (that is, moral language is part of evaluative or normative language). It is even more important not to be swayed by moral language because moral reality grips us. It is bad that others try to deceive us, but it is worse that we deceive ourselves into accepting moral facts simply because of the language that we use. That is, moral language — if it is not to describe the world —must not be mistaken as descriptive. Moral language binds us in a certain manner, and the manner in which it binds us is important.

i. Descriptivism

Moral language and descriptive language share the same syntactic structure. “Sam is good” predicates a kind of goodness to Sam just as “Sam is four-legged” predicates having four legs to her. “Being good” as in “being good is being able to bear one’s own scrutiny” and “having four legs” as in “having for legs is not required of being a dog” are both noun-like phrases. Again, to say, “If Sam is good, then she will be able to bear her own scrutiny,” illustrates that moral predication could be embedded to form a compound sentence just as descriptive predication could. We use both parts of language with an equal ease. Almost all of us are proficient in using moral language. Most of us understand what others express with it; and, we are expected to have understood what moral language means. Few people would apply the term “morally permissible” to an apparent case of wanton cruelty. Furthermore, moral language is governed by the same fundamental rules of logic as descriptive language. For instance, one and the same action cannot be good and bad at the same time. (The philosophical rejection of moral facts remains popular, although this focal reliance on the logico-linguistic aspect of the moral practices is no longer fashionable. See Darwall, Gibbard, and Railton 1992, especially p. 123.)

From this, must we then infer that there are entities like “moral goodness” and “obligation” to which moral language refers in the world? Are the three characteristics of structural similarity between moral and descriptive languages, the equal ease with which we employ them, and the logical interplay between them good enough reasons for thinking that there are moral facts? Is it not possible that our ways of influencing others and ourselves are exactly where syntax and semantics of our language betray us and, consequently, that moral language suffers from a lack of referents analogous to terms such as “nothing,” the “present king of France,” do?

Either moral language describes (or, it is intended to describe accurately) the world or it does not. According to descriptivists, moral language describes the world. The descriptivist position has been thought as the mark of moral realism, while the non-descriptivist position as that of antirealism. This is captured as follows:

(C1) S is a moral realist if and only if S is a moral descriptivist.

So while one may hold that there are no moral facts, according to C1, one may not at the same time hold that moral language describes or is intended to describe the world. Again, one may not hold both that there are moral facts but that our languages about them do not describe the world. For if C1 were true, being a moral realist and being a descriptivist about moral language are logically equivalent. So any non-descriptivist realism and any descriptivist antirealism would show that C1 is false. The possibilities will be discussed shortly in §2 and §3. Descriptivism and, hence, the truth-aptness of moral language. is discussed in more detail in what follows. (Ignored for the moment is what Blackburn calls “quietism” according to which “at some particular point the debate is not a real one, and that we are only offered, for instance, metaphors and images from which we can profit as we please” 1984, 146. One may claim quietism to be present in pretty much any important and interesting philosophical dispute, like “primary versus secondary, fact versus value, description versus expression, or of any other significant kind” 1998, 157. Quietism about whether moral language describes the world, if true, would render the traditional realism/antirealism debate over descriptivism as a dispute over no difference where there is nothing more than “the celebration of the seamless web of language” 1998, 157.)

Descriptivism in meta-ethics is a cognitivist view, according to which moral language describes (or, is intended to describe) the world. (Cf. Horgan and Timmons 2000, 124. This rough definition, according to them, falls under the dogma of the “[mistaken] semantic assumption: All genuinely cognitive content is descriptive content.” Conflating descriptivism with cognitivism is, according to them, “a largely unquestioned dogma.”) An inevitable corollary of descriptivism is that moral language is apt to truth evaluation; that is, statements express moral judgments that are either true or false. We may say alternatively that moral sentences express propositions without affecting the result of the discussion. As Nicholas Sturgeon puts it, “moral [sentences] typically express [statements] capable of truth and falsity” (1986, 116). Strictly speaking, then, descriptivism says little about, and remains neutral with respect to, the two views in moral epistemology: there are moral statements that are known to be true. Descriptivism does not tell us whether there is any moral statement known to be true. Nor does it tell us anything about the things by virtue of which moral statements are true when they are true. (Cf. Skorupski 1999. He thinks that descriptivism in conjunction without a substantial theory of truth is no descriptivism at all. There is just a terminological difference, and the descriptivism in conjunction with a substantial theory of truth will be discussed in section 2.)

The moral descriptivist believes that moral statements express moral judgments, and that they are either true or false. If every sentence that is capable of truth-value describes the world, then so does every moral statement. Moral language describes the world because every truth-apt sentence describes, or is intended to describe the world. The non-descriptivist denies that. The non-descriptivist believes that moral statements do not express moral judgments. Rather, the non-descriptivist believes that moral judgments are expressed by commands or prescriptions. Neither commands nor prescriptions are truth-apt, and as a result they typically are not meant to describe the world. Moral language does not describe the world, according to the non-descriptivist. That is, it represents our wishes, preferences, emotions, and so on, but it represents nothing over and above them. Figure 1 illustrates the disagreement between the descriptivist and the non-descriptivist. (Definite antirealist positions are marked with the dotted boxes in the figures that follow. An oval box will mark definite realist positions. See figure 5.)

Figure 1

Non-descriptivists disagree about exactly what moral language accomplishes, while they are unanimous about what it does not. G. E. Moore’s open question argument supports emotivism, a non-descriptivism contrary to his intention in the beginning of the 20th century. A. J. Ayer and C. L. Stevenson argue that moral judgments express feelings of approval or disapproval, or that making moral judgments is equivalent to emoting in reference to behaviors of others and ours. (See Ayer 1952 and Stevenson 1937, 1944, and 1963.) Stevenson says that, “Mr. G. E. Moore’s familiar objection about the open question is chiefly pertinent in this regard. No matter what set of scientifically knowable properties a thing may have (says Moore, in effect), you will find, on careful introspection, that it is an open question to ask whether anything having these properties is good,” (1937, 18). R. M. Hare’s universal prescriptivism, according to which “‘ought’-judgments are prescriptive like plain imperatives, but differ from them in being universalizable” (1991, 457) emphasizes that moral language facilitates ways of prescribing actions for all of us. The norm-expressivism of Allen Gibbard has renewed arguments for non-descriptivism recently. Rejecting emotivism, Gibbard,1990, holds that moral judgments are concerned about rational-to-have or justified moral sentiments, not just about feelings or preferences one has. Apparently, he holds that some moral feelings can be called rational-to-have or justified. It is when “one’s acceptance of norms that permit the feeling” (Darwall, Gibbard, and Railton: 1992, 150-51) is expressed, a feeling may be called rational-to-have. So while moral judgments (and moral language) are expressive of what we accept as norms, namely, a state of mind, they are not about describing the world, namely, non-descriptivism about moral judgment and language. Blackburn’s projectivism seems difficult to classify one way or another especially when it is considered in conjunction with his quasi-realism (Blackburn: 1984, 1993, and 1998). Moral language according to the projectivist lets us spin our own story onto the world. Non-descriptivists agree, nonetheless, that moral language is the tool of choice when we are panting for help, recommending a course of actions, passing judgments on what others do, and so on, but it is never the tool for describing the world.

The views discussed above can be illustrated with an example. Consider the moral sentence, “Petal ought to avoid eating too much.” The utterance of the sentence expresses the speaker’s judgment about Petal and perhaps about her tendency to the excessive consumption of food. The cognitivist holds that the speaker’s judgment is of the same kind as ordinary beliefs, that is the cognitivist holds that the speaker’s moral judgment is a cognitive state. Beliefs are representations of how things are, namely, possible states of affairs; and, language typically expresses beliefs. According to the cognitivist, then, the moral sentence that expresses the moral judgment represents a possible state of affairs. We may say that the descriptivist maintains that the moral sentence describes what ought to be the case about Petal and her tendency toward food. Petal could be instantiating the property of the “oughtness” of avoiding the excessive consumption of food, although this is not the only cognitivist way of maintaining her descriptivism about moral language. Just as the morning star refers to Venus, the linguistic item “ought to avoid eating too much” may refer to a moral property. It might even be maintained that there obtains the referential relation between moral expressions and the things in the world that they are supposed to pick out.

Noncognitivists hold that the speaker’s judgment in saying, “Petal ought to avoid eating too much,” is not of the same kind as cognitive states. Some noncognitivists go further and deny that the moral sentence represents a possible state of affairs. That is, some noncognitivists are non-descriptivists as well. The non-descriptivists maintain that the surface structure of moral language—and the logical interplay it displays within our use of it—is not a good guide in understanding what moral language does for us (and what we intend to do with it). The word “nothing” picks out no object whatsoever, although it serves as a grammatical subject; the definite description the “present King of France” refers to no one, although its article “the” indicates a unique satisfier of the description, and so on. These are familiar cases (of our language betraying us ontologically). So, part of the non-descriptivist claim is that moral language ontologically manipulates us just as “nothing” and the “present king of France” do. The merit of the view according to which there lurks a deeper structure (or meaning) to our moral language must be judged on how successful the non-descriptivist construal of the sentence about Petal is.

The non-descriptivist construal of “Petal ought to avoid eating too much” varies. Emotivism construes it as the way of emoting the speaker’s disapproval of Petal’s excessive consumption of food, or the way of informing Petal of her feeling. The expressivist construes it as the speaker’s way of expressing her preference with regard to Petal’s eating habit. The prescriptivist construes it as the way of commanding Petal to not eat excessively. The norm-expressivist construes it as the way of expressing the speaker’s non-acceptance of the norms that allow such a consumption of food. Perhaps the projectivist would construe the statement about Petal as a way of “objectifying” the speaker’s disapproval. However, all reject that there is a dyadic relationship of reference or correspondence, between the moral sentence and how the world is. The dyadic relation has all but been reduced to the monothetic relation of showing/manifesting the speaker’s psychological state. (The truth of this does not entail that people do not believe in moral principles. A. J. Ayer says that “[t]o say…that these moral judgments are merely expressive of certain feelings, feelings of approval or disapproval, is an over simplification” 1954, 238.) Figure 2 diagrams the non-descriptivist positions.

Figure 2

The contrast between descriptivism and non-descriptivism seems inapt for Gilbert Harman’s relativism because his relativism is a definite moral antirealist position. He rejects the objective status of moral facts. (See his 1977, 1986, and 2000; see also Harman and Thomson 1996 in which an interesting discussion of reasons both for and against moral objectivity is presented.) The relativist maintains that there are some ethical questions that can be correctly answered with “yes” for one, and “no” for another. Her claim implies nothing concerning for what moral language is meant. Error theorists maintain that moral judgments systematically err by positing moral facts. (For instance, Mackie says that “[t]he assertion that there are objective values or intrinsically prescriptive entities or features of some kind, which ordinary moral judgments presuppose is, I hold it not meaningless but false” 1977, 40.) That is, moral language aims to get the world right, but it always misses the mark. Mackie’s error theory in this respect occupies an important niche between the sides of the descriptivism divide and the sides of the moral realism divide. Figure 3 incorporates projectivism, relativism, and error theories, into figures 1 and 2.

Figure 3

The ontological ramification of accepting descriptivism (or, cognitivism) is not inevitably moral realism. Figure 3 indicates that descriptivism is not sufficient for moral realism. Mackie’s error theory is discussed in §2 in establishing the insufficiency. Blackburn’s projectivism, and John Skorupski’s “irrealist cognitivism” will be very briefly discussed as well. Descriptivism is nonetheless necessary for moral realism. The necessity is argued in §3 when Bruce Waller’s “megaethical level” is considered and rejected. That is, a conjunct of C1 will be shown to be false while the other conjunct of C1 will be shown to be true, thereby making the conjunction C1 false; more specifically, it will be shown that “if S is a moral descriptivist, thenS is a moral realist” is false and it will be shown that “S is a moral realist only if S is a moral descriptivist” is true.

ii. Mackie’s Error Theory

Is it true that S is a moral realist if and only if S is a descriptivist? That is, is C1 true? Any coherent descriptivist antirealism would establish that C1 is false. Another way that C1 could be shown to be false is to establish the possibility of non-descriptivist realism. The insufficiency of descriptivism will be established in this section. The realist territory, as it were, will not be properly marked by descriptivism.

Consider Mackie’s remark that:

The assertion that there are objective values or intrinsically prescriptive entities or features of some kind, which ordinary moral judgments presuppose is, I hold it not meaningless but false (1977, 40).

Moral judgments are false, or so the above-quoted passage reads. But why are they all false? It is because there are no entities to which moral language refers. Moral language purports to describe things that are not there. According to Mackie, it is a (perpetual) error to suppose that there are moral entities, thus, the name “error theory.” Mackie’s error theory is a prima facie descriptivist antirealist position: it maintains that there are no moral facts. In addition he accepts that moral judgments are meant to describe the world. Is this combination of moral antirealism and descriptivism plausible? Blackburn certainly thinks that it is not.

Blackburn, whose own view seems to be indeterminate between descriptivism and non-descriptivism, thinks that Mackie’s error theory is inconsistent. This is partly because of the apparent difficulty in attributing a pervasive systematic error to our making moral judgments. As Blackburn puts it, “[T]he puzzle is why, in the light of the error theory, Mackie did not at least indicate how a shmoral vocabulary [that is, a moral vocabulary cleansed of its ontological error] would look, and why he did not himself go on only to shmoralize, not to moralize.” According to Blackburn, this is so seriously puzzling that Mackie’s failure to shmoralize “in itself suggests that no error can be incorporated in mere use of those concepts” (1985, 2).

To try avoiding the pervasive and systematic error should appear reasonable to those who were aware of it. But Mackie seemed “quite happy to go on to express a large number of straightforward moral views [namely, to moralize rather than to shmoralize]” (Blackburn 1985, 1).

Does Blackburn’s charge establish that Mackie’s antirealism and descriptivism combination is inconsistent? No, it does not. What Blackburn demands of Mackie is the consistent deployment of his meta-ethical view in his moral practice. But to lead a moral life strictly according to one’s meta-ethical view requires heroic efforts. Try imagining an error theorist deploying his meta-ethical views when it comes to the existence of an external world! She cannot help but conduct her business as if it is no error in thinking that there exists a world external to her. It is impossible for her to show that it is an error to believe in the existence of such a world. More generally, the second-order beliefs on the first-order moral practices are rarely made explicit. Everyday moral practices (within which Mackie continues to moralize) are not a translucent showcase for meta-ethical views. So, Blackburn fails to establish that descriptivist antirealism is inconsistent. That is, Blackburn should expect no explicit display of Mackie’s error-theoretic commitments.

Blackburn’s projectivism may qualify for the descriptivist antirealism. (Blackburn’s descriptivism will be discussed in §2 of section 1.2 in more detail.) Moral language has content, according to Blackburn, but the content is not determined by the world. The content of moral language is determined rather by what “the mind [expresses as] a reaction by ‘spreading itself on the world’” (Blackburn 1984, 75). That moral language has content suggests that part of its function is to accurately describe the world. At the same time, Blackburn’s projectivism is an antirealist position because he maintains that the content is somehow “written” by us.

There are other recent theories that result from explicit attempts at combining descriptivism and antirealism. Hatzimoysis says “a minimalist conception of truth fits the bill of antirealist cognitivism in ethics.” (See for example, Hatzimoysis 1997, 448.) Skorupski’s “irrealist cognitivism” is one such theory. He argues for it by denying “all content is factual content” (1999, 438).

The fact that moral language expresses cognitive states, that is, that moral language has descriptive content, according to Skorupski does not guarantee the existence of moral facts; nor does it justify belief in the existence of moral facts. (Cf. Horgan and Timmons 2000. They distinguish three different kinds of content: declarative, cognitive, and descriptive.) Skorupski says that “normative claims are truth-apt contents of cognition…but their truth is not a matter of correspondence or representation” (1999, 436). The truth-apt fragment of language is truth-apt because of its descriptive content. So the first conjunct of Skorupski’s remark is descriptivist. But when moral language is true (or false), it is so not because it corresponds to the world: there is nothing that answers to moral language. That is, Skorupski rejects the existence of moral facts, and his position is hence antirealism.

Is Skorupski’s irrealist cognitivism consistent? Descriptivism by no means entails the correspondence theory of truth, and Skorupski’s antirealism is based solely on his denial of the correspondence theory of truth. Irrealist cognitivism is hence consistent.

Mackie’s error theory, Blackburn’s projectivism, and Skorupski’s irrealist cognitivism are instances of descriptivist antirealism. We may then conclude that moral descriptivism is not sufficient for moral realism. But is it a necessary condition for moral realism? If it is, then we may hope to mark the proper realist territory by adding additional necessary conditions. (My emphasis on consistency of maintaining both descriptivism and antirealism is not meant to suggest that a descriptivism/non-descriptivism debate as represented by, say, the Frege-Geach problem which claims that embedded moral language appears to have descriptive contents rather than emotive, prescriptive or projective content, is not as important and relevant to the realism/antirealism debate. See Darwall, Gibbard, and Railton 1992, especially pp. 151-152.) The necessity of descriptivism for realism will be discussed in the following section. Another conjunct of C1, “S is a moral realist only if Sis a descriptivist” will be examined.

iii. Waller’s Megaethical Level

Few philosophers take the noncognitivist realist position seriously. For instance, Geoffrey Sayre-McCord (1988, 9-14) dismisses it quickly as inconsistent. But noncognitivist realism is certainly a logical possibility. In this section, we shall examine Waller’s arguments for its tenability.

Waller’s noncognitivism is attenuated: moral judgments are not cognitive states when no fundamental common values are in place. He says “noncognitivism insists that when fundamental value conflicts arise and basic value questions are posed, then the disputes and values are noncognitive” (1994, 63). Statements only express moral judgments when an assumed set of common fundamental values is present. Waller’s remark that “such independent moral conversion is evidence in favor of moral realism and against noncognitivism” sounds inconsistent with the label of his theory “noncognitivist moral realism.” (See his 1992, 129.) Waller’s remark makes it seem as if moral realism and noncognitivism are contradictory to each other. Waller’s strategy is to distinguish the “megaethical” level from the level where there are uncontested fundamental values. This allows Waller to maintain that at one level “the moral facts are internally real,” but at another level, namely, the megaethical level, “[the moral facts] are ideal” (1994, 67). Waller’s divide-and-conquer strategy entitles him to either cognitivist moral realism at the level of assumed values, or noncognitivist antirealism at the megaethical level. So Waller’s “noncognitivist realism” fails as a noncognitivist realist position. We may then conclude that cognitivism (or, descriptivism) is necessary for moral realism. Cognitivism, the view that moral judgments are cognitive states like ordinary beliefs (with its two corollaries, namely, descriptivism and their truth-aptness), could facilitate the realist/antirealist debate, but cognitivism alone is not sufficient in facilitating the discussion, not solely in its terms anyway.

The necessity of cognitivism for realism may lead us to expect that specifying additional necessary conditions for realism could mark the proper realist territory. Cognitivism combined with some substantial theory of truth is taken up next.

b. Truth in Moral Judgments

Moral statements express judgments, and for some, moral statements describe the world. But moral realism is not present everywhere cognitivism (or, descriptivism) is present. That is, cognitivism and descriptivism, which had once crystallized the realism/antirealism debate, no longer do so. Crispin Wright’s recommendation that “moral anti-realists, for instance, should grant that moral judgments are apt for truth and falsity” (1993, 65) illuminates more recent discussions of the subject. Mackie’s error theory (1977), Skorupski’s irrealist cognitivism (1999), and perhaps Blackburn’s projectivism (for example, 1984) illustrate, as we saw earlier, the possibility of consistently combining cognitivism with antirealism.

An error theorist maintains her antirealism by insisting that moral judgments involve a pervasive error. No moral judgments are true, according to the error theorist, although they are truth-apt because they purport to describe the world. Moral realists part company with the error theorists over truth in moral judgments: some moral judgments are true. Still, this is not sufficient for moral realism. The projectivist functioning as a quasi-realist and Skorupski should be able to claim that some moral judgments are true. Moral truths can be literal or figurative; and, they can be the matter of correspondence or coherence (coherence with other already held beliefs stands in here for the range of “modified characteristics” of truth). Figure 4 illustrates this point:

Figure 4

Deflationist theorists of truth reject that the truth-predicate “is true” adds to the meaning of linguistic items. For instance, “snow is white” and “‘snow is white’ is true,” mean, according to them, the same. Deflationist theories include F. P. Ramsey’s redundancy theory of truth (or, the prosentential theory of truth) and Paul Horwich’s more recent minimalism. Inflationist (substantive or robust) theorists of truth, in contrast with deflationists, maintain that truth is a real and important linguistic item. Inflationist theories include the correspondence theory of truth, the coherence theory of truth, and the so-called pragmatic theory of truth. Inflationists disagree not only about the nature of the property of truth, but also disagree about the bearers of the property truth.

i. An Analogy

Consider the judgment, “Suffering from lack of food is bad.” The judgment is usually expressed with the statement “suffering from lack of food is bad.” Call it a “B-statement.” Sometimes, we find it necessary to express it with “it is true that suffering from lack of food is bad.” Call it a “T-statement.” (To complete it, there are “F-statements” like “it is false that suffering from lack of food is bad.”) We use T-statements to emphasize partiality toward “being true to the world.” However, regardless of what motivates us to use T-statements, the explicit ascription of truth in T-statements commands our attention. Does the T-statement add anything extra to the B-statement? If so, what is it that the T-statement says over and above the B-statement?

There are two broad ways to answer the question: deflationism and various forms of substantial theory (or what we called above “inflationist theory”). Substantial theorists deny that the B-statement and the T-statement are exactly the same while the deflationist maintains that the difference is merely stylistic. If the deflationist has her way, then it is obvious that antirealists could have truth in moral judgments. (David Brink argues against the coherentist theory of truth with respect to moral constructivism. See Brink 1989, 106-7 and 114; see Tenenbaum, 1996, for the deflationist approach.) Antirealist moral truths would seem irrelevant in marking the realist territory. If some form of substantial theory is true, then the T-statement adds something to what the B-statements say. Here are two alternatives.

Letting a coherence theory of truth stand in for the range of “modified theories” (namely, the inflationist theories of truth that are different from the correspondence theory of truth), and the “B-proposition” for what the B-statement describes about the world, the T-statement adds that:

(1) The B-proposition corresponds to an actual state of affairs.

(2) The B-proposition belongs to a maximally coherent system of belief.

It is worth noting also that even the non-descriptivist may say that the T-statement adds to the B-statement, insofar as the B-statement expresses something other than the B-proposition. The non-descriptivist has two alternatives as well.

The T-statement adds that (letting a coherence theory of truth stand in for the range of “modified theories,” and the “B-feeling-proposition” stand in for the range of non-descriptivism, for example, the speaker dislikes suffering from lack of food):

(3) The B-feeling-proposition corresponds to an actual state of affairs.

(4) The B-feeling-proposition belongs to a maximally coherent system of belief. We may say that the T-statement specifies truth conditions for the B-proposition or for the B-feeling-proposition. It could be objected that the non-descriptivist must deny that there are truth-conditions for moral language. Nonetheless, she need not object to moral language describing something about the world figuratively.

If option (1) were true, then there would have to be an actual state of affairs that makes the B-statement true. That is, there must be a truth-maker for the statement, “suffering from lack of food is bad,” and the truth-maker is the fact that suffering from lack of food is bad. But no other alternatives require the existence of the fact for them to be true.

If one ignores deflationism, truth in moral judgments gives rise to exactly four alternative theories of truth. Realists cannot embrace options (3) and (4) because, as we saw, non-descriptivism is sufficient for moral antirealism. The remaining option (2), although it is a viable option for the realist, falls short of guaranteeing that there are moral facts. In other words, moral realists must find other ways to establish the existence of moral facts, even if option (2) allows a way of maintaining moral truths for the realists. Modified theories, for example, the coherence theory of truth are simply silent about whether there are B-facts. That is, option (2) could be maintained even if there were no B-facts such as suffering from lack of food is bad. Thus, the most direct option for realists in marking her territory from the above list of alternatives is (1). It appears then that the correspondence truth in moral judgments properly marks the realist territory. This is captured in C2:

(C2) S is a moral realist if and only if S is a descriptivist; S believes that moral judgments express truth, and S believes that the moral judgments are true when they correspond to the world.

Is C2 true? No, it is not. For the antirealist may choose to deny that moral judgments literally describe the world. This is how Skorupski earns his antirealist title.

ii. Skorupski’s Irrealist Cognitivism

If C2 were true, then there could not be any cognitivist antirealist who believes that some moral judgments are true, and who also holds that moral truth is a matter of correspondence to the world. However, Skorupski’s irrealist cognitivism qualifies as one such position.

Skorupski maintains that moral judgments have truth-apt contents, but he denies that the contents of moral judgments are factual. Skorupski remarks “[normative language’s] truth is not a matter of correspondence or representation” (1999, 436). This remark may suggest that Skorupski’s irrealist cognitivism is a variant of option (2) above about what the T-statement adds to the B-statement. Nonetheless, there is an extension of Skorupski’s theory that would consistently allow it to fall within option (1). This extension of Skorupski’s theory would be a cognitivist antirealist position, combined with a correspondence theory of truth.

Moral statements express moral judgments, and as such, moral statements can be either true or false. What makes moral statements true when they are true? Skorupski’s remark above rejects that correspondence to the world is the truth-making relation. As was mentioned, this rejection could indicate that Skorupski holds a modified theory of truth or a deflationist theory. Perhaps he does, but it is not explicit. What is explicit is Skorupski’s denial that moral judgments have factual contents. How is it possible that some moral judgments are true if moral judgments are not factual? One way to answer it—and to extend Skorupski’s irrealism—is to maintain that moral judgments are not literal. Moral judgments are still expressed by moral statements, but what moral statements describe are not moral states of affairs. Moral statements express states of affairs of the world other than moral ones. In this way, moral statements can be true by corresponding to the world, once moral statements are recognized as describing, for example, a psychological aspect of the world.

Consider the statement “Santa Claus came early last year.” Call it the S-statement. (The “S-statement,” “T-statement,” “S-proposition,” “S-feeling-proposition,” and cognates are used as “B-Statement”, “T-Statement,” “B-proposition”, “B-feeling-proposition” and its cognates are above.) Does the S-statement describe the world as it was last year? Surely, it does. It reports either that (1) there was at least one person whose image fits the description of Santa, or that (2) there was the giver of toys around Christmas. It reports also that the person in either case came earlier than other years. Children are delighted by Santa’s early appearance in primarily the sense of (2). And they wonder, “Will Santa come early this year as well?” Similarly, children reason, “If Santa comes early, I will have an early Christmas present.” Of course, very few us of are Santa realists, although most of us are cognitivists about the S-statement in either sense.

How are adults able to maintain both cognitivism about the S-statement (more specifically descriptivism about it) and antirealism about Santa facts in the sense of S-statement (1)? Adults acknowledge the existence of surrogate toy-givers, while denying that the S-statement expresses the S-proposition in the sense of (1), namely, adults deny that there was at least one person whose image fits the description of Santa. Instead, adults believe that the S-statement expresses the S-feeling-proposition, or something equivalent to it. This is how one maintains antirealist cognitivism about Santa judgments.

There are many garden-variety Santa judgments. Santa judgments are expressed by Santa-statements, but no Santa-statements express the S-proposition. The S-statement does not involve the state of affairs in which there is the person whose name is Santa Claus. Nonetheless, the S-statement could be either true or false. Suppose that it is true, that Santa did come early last year, but suppose that we are also not realists about Santa Claus. We know better than those who are perplexed by the existence of people who fit perfectly the descriptions of Santa. We know that the S-statement does not say anything about a person named Santa Claus. For most, the S-statement is never about Santa, but rather it is about, for example, the toy-givers, the state of one’s national economy, and so on. That is, we deny that the S-statement expresses the S-proposition, however, this rejection does not force us to adopt deflationism or a modified theory of truth. The S-statement could express something true when it corresponds with the world as long as it expresses something other than the S-proposition. For instance, the S-statement expresses something true if the S-statement expresses the fact that the state of the national economy was good last year, and if the state of the national economy last year was actually good: in this case the S-statement expresses something true when it correctly reports the economy of last year. There is no inconsistency.

Analogously, moral statements express moral judgments. Insofar as moral statements are understood as expressing psychological facts about the world, moral statements can be true or false. Some “moral” statements are true in this way. Furthermore, they are true because they correspond to the world. Even if this is not Skorupski’s theory, it is an extension of his theory that instantiates cognitivist antirealism, combined with a correspondence theory of truth. This shows that C2 is false.

iii. The Correspondence Theory Requires Realism, Not Vice Versa

Our previous discussion of Skorupski’s cognitivist irrealism gives no details about the correspondence theory of truth it employs. It might be objected that such lack makes it impossible to judge whether or not Skorupski’s theory, or an extension of it, constitutes a counterexample to C2. But the “correspondence theory” is ambiguous between the general conception of truth that appeals to correspondence as the truth-making relation, and the very detailed analysis of truth that satisfactorily specifies the notion of truth in terms of the correspondence relation. As the general conception, the correspondence theory of truth is insufficient for moral realism. Antirealists are entitled to the correspondent truth of moral judgments insofar as moral judgments are understood “figuratively.” For as the general conception, the correspondence theory of truth imposes “for any proposition , it is true that just in case there is a way things could be such that anyone who believed, doubted, etc. that would believe, doubt, etc. that things were that way, and things are that way” (Wright 1999, 218). Apparently, the conception “offers little more than a long-hand version of the correspondence platitude,” and it “certainly carries no direct implications for the realism debate in its modern conception” because “there is so far no commitment to any specific general conception of the kind of relations that may be involved in truth, or of the nature of the non-propositional items in their fields” (Wright 1999, 223-24). On the other hand, as analysis, the correspondence theory perhaps is too strong for realism. The latter point will not be discussed further as our purpose here is to establish the non-sufficiency and the non-necessity of the correspondence theory of truth for moral realism. It seems reasonable to suppose that Skorupski’s irrealist cognitivism, or an extension of it, constitutes a counterexample to C2 as the general conception of correspondence theory of truth.

To sum up, consider the following five claims:

  1. The correspondence theory of truth is false or implausible.
  2. The correspondence theory of truth requires the truth of realism.
  3. The correspondence theory of truth is not required for realism (and no particular theory of truth is).
  4. “The correspondence theory of truth in conjunction with cognitivism” is not sufficient for realism.
  5. “The correspondence theory of truth in conjunction with cognitivism and the correspondence (truth) of moral judgments” is not sufficient for realism.

The discussion of Skorupski’s (extended) antirealism aims at establishing claim (5), but since (5) implies (4) there is no need for independently establishing claim (4). Claim (1) is apparently bold, controversial, and not required for our purpose. Claim (2) seems false: an error theorist like Mackie is a moral antirealist, however, he may adopt a correspondence theory of truth and not contradict his particular brand of moral antirealism. Furthermore, claim (2) is not required for our purpose either. To properly mark the realist territory, we need not determine if the correspondence theory of truth— whether one considers it to be general theory or analysis—requires realism. Finally, claim (3) seems at least OK, and it is relevant to our goal. The T-statement discussed above, namely the T-statement that “‘Santa came early last year’ belongs to a maximally coherent system of beliefs,” shows that realists, moral or otherwise, are not forced to accept the correspondence theory of truth. That said, if moral realists opt for moral truths of the non-correspondence kind, then they would have to find other ways of establishing the existence of moral facts.

c. Literal Moral Truth?

In the previous section, it is proposed that one need not be a moral realist if she is a cognitivist that believes moral judgments express moral truths and that the truths they express are truths because of a correspondence between the judgments and facts in the world. The argument might attract the following response: such an antirealist position appears possible simply because it involves denying that there are any literal truths in moral discourse; even if cognitivism and moral truths that are obtained by employing a revisionary theory of meaning are considered to not be adequate for moral realism, then cognitivism and moral truths that are obtained on a literal understanding of moral language should be considered adequate for moral realism. This section offers replies to such a potential response.

Consider again the Santa statement, “Santa Claus came early last year.” An antirealist may construe it as saying

The national economy last year was good, and the economic boom was manifested by consumer confidence.

Consequently, the antirealist can say that because the S-statement expresses the S-feeling-proposition about the national economy and consumer confidence, nothing prevents the antirealist from adopting a correspondence conception of truth. Children, of course, insist that the S-statement is literal, that is, it expresses the S-proposition, “Santa Claus came early last year.” If the S-statement were to be taken literally, no antirealist could hold both that there are some Santa truths and that those Santa truths are matters of correspondence to the world. Santa antirealists cannot acknowledge any Santa fact if such an acknowledgement presupposes the existence of Santa, the person. The S-statement obviously express something other than the S-proposition, but is it the same with moral judgments and statements?

The preceding discussion signals a shift in the realist/antirealist debate. The literal meaning of moral language now comes to the fore of the discussion. We seem to have run a full circle. The non-descriptivist and the non-cognitivist point out that moral language may manipulate us ontologically because it misleads us into thinking that moral statements describe the world: obviously, the Santa statement cannot be taken literally. Even if it is unreasonable to insist on the literal interpretation of the S-statement, the same cannot be maintained with an equal confidence about moral statements. It is not obvious that moral language must not be taken literally. We are certain that there is no such living person as Santa Claus: that is why we can be certain that the S-statement cannot be taken literally. Nonetheless, with respect to moral statements, the existence of moral facts is exactly the issue. As a result, we cannot be as certain about moral language as we are about the S-statement that it must not be taken literally.

Granted, one of the most deeply rooted realist and antirealist disagreements has been whether moral language expresses things literally. Should moral language be taken literally or in some revisionist fashion? Skorupski, an antirealist cognitivist, must maintain that moral language describes the world, yet it does not do so literally. For instance, it expresses our ways of influencing others and ourselves. Realists, on the other hand, must maintain that moral language describes the world, and it does so literally. Moral language comes with shades of normativity, but that does not entail that moral language cannot be taken literally. Instead, the logico-linguistic considerations prove that moral language is no different from ordinary declarative statements that express ordinary beliefs. How are we to decide between the two? Does “species-ism is as (morally) bad as racism” express whatever it expresses literally? Is it even feasible to apply literalism, in the first place, to the realist/antirealist debate?

Surely, it is difficult to decide between the two above-mentioned alternatives. Language allows many things for us. For example, people sometimes disagree about whether an utterance expresses a genuine question or whether it expresses an assertion (in the form of a rhetorical question). This indicates that it can be difficult to know when a statement is to be taken literally and when it is not. If literalism were to carry any weight for the realism/antirealism debate, then there should be some independent way of telling when a statement is to be taken literally. That is, literalism about moral language requires an independent footing. Furthermore, it is very difficult to imagine that the long and recalcitrant history of the realist/antirealist debate has been just about the literal meaning of moral language. We presumably understand what moral statements express, if only in a rudimentary fashion. The disagreement about literalism may help explain why moral realists and antirealists often seem to talk past each other. Nevertheless, attributing different meaning to moral terms fails to further our inquiry. At any rate, it does not seem feasible to make literalism a criterion for moral realism, especially when the difficulty associated with literalism about moral language is considered.

d. Moral Knowledge

Some moral judgments are literally true, but some truths are not known. It is sometimes thought that we get moral facts right, while others get them totally wrong. Is there any merit to such a claim? Does one ever know a certain moral judgments to be true? (Joel Kupperman asks, for instance, “[i]f there is some set of moral truths, or approximately correct moral beliefs, independent of our feelings, attitudes, or opinions, then how can we ever know that we have found or arrived at them?” 1988, 33.) We get some moral facts right sometimes, according to the realist. That is, we succeed in knowing certain moral judgments to be true. Moral realism implies some sort of literal success theory, and so moral knowledge is implied by it. Or, moral realism entails at least the possibility of such knowledge.

Moral realists hold that we can have justified true moral beliefs, or that we can have warranted moral beliefs, according to some post-Gettier theories of knowledge. (See, for instance, Alvin Plantinga’s discussion of “warrant.”; See Gettier, 1963, and Plantinga, 1993a and 1993b). Some moral antirealists deny this. For example, Mackie’s error theory insists that no moral judgments are known to be true because the moral statements that express them always describe the world falsely. It is impossible to know something false as true! Moral skeptics hold that no moral judgments are justified or warranted. The epistemic success claim at once provokes epistemological questions: under what conditions are we ever justified or warranted in holding moral beliefs? And, how can we truly say that we have correct moral facts?

In answer, some moral realists have adopted a coherentist theory of justification, while others have opted for foundationalism and intuitionism. For instance, David Brink adopts coherentism in defense of a naturalist version of moral realism. (See especially Brink 1989, 122-43.) Naturalistic epistemology also deserves a serious consideration. (Cf. Consider Jaegwon Kim’s worry of losing normativity. See Kim, 1988, and Quine, 1986.) Some theories of justification are able to accommodate moral knowledge more easily than others. A causal theory of knowledge and justification, for instance, is ill suited for the task. Alvin Goldman’s reliabilism may not be the best-suited theory for it either. (See Goldman, 1978, and 1986.) But it seems obvious that the belief that moral knowledge is possible can be maintained even with these externalist theories of justification. Consider, for instance, a version of reliabilism: S is justified in holding “that p” iff pis the result of a reliable cognitive process. One can be justified in holding that Doctor Evil is no good if the judgment results from a reliable cognitive process, say, for example, the cognitive process that results in Austin Powers being good.

The possibility of moral knowledge does not entail moral realism, even though moral realism entails moral knowledge. As was shown above, there is nothing to stop the moral antirealist from claiming moral knowledge once she helps herself to cognitivism, moral truths, and some theory of justification. On the other hand, moral realists need not be shy about adopting an externalist epistemology either. A naturalistic realist would hope that moral knowledge is on a par with empirical knowledge. The realist may even agree that the paradigm justification for empirical knowledge is perceptual and is thus causal. The moral realist would have to reject causal reductionism, according to which the causal power of the supervening facts is entirely reducible to that of base facts. Moral judgments are true just in case they correctly report the supervening facts that depend on the non-moral base facts.

e. Moral Objectivity

Moral realists maintain that some literal moral truths are known, or that we are justified in holding them. Moral judgments are true just in case they correctly report the supervening facts that depend on the non-moral base facts. But are moral facts—the supposed truth-makers of moral judgments—objective? It could be the case that no ethical judgments are true independently of the desires or emotions that we happen to have, or, there could be different yet valid answers to the same ethical question as ethical relativists insist. Neither subjectivists nor relativists are obliged to deny that there is literal moral knowledge. Of course, according to them, moral truths imply truths about human psychology. Moral realists must maintain that moral truths —and hence moral knowledge—do not depend on facts about our desires and emotions for their truth. For instance, W. D. Falk analyzes the good as “a dispositional property of things as ideally assessed, a power to evoke favor by way of an ideal assessment” (Piker 1995, 102). Having objective literal moral knowledge seems to be sufficient for moral realism because no moral antirealists would acknowledge the possibility of such knowledge. Figure 5 summarizes the results of the discussion from 1.1-1.5.

Figure 5

We finally arrive at the definite moral realist position, which is marked by the oval box above. The combination of cognitivism, descriptivism, success theory, literalism, and objectivism seems sufficient for moral realism. Nonetheless, there are a couple of reasons why the moral realist territory is better marked by the explanationist consideration. This consideration leads to explanationist moral realism according to which there must be moral facts because they are essential in our understanding of the world. Literalism faces uncertainty if one considers what moral sentences mean, a consideration that is not ideal for the realism/antirealism debate. Despite these categories, the advent of quasi-realism signals the new antirealist way. A quasi-realist can claim that cognitivism, descriptivism, moral truths, moral knowledge, and even moral objectivity, are within the antirealist camp.

2. Quasi-Realism, Antirealism, and the EI thesis

Quasi-realists such as R. M. Hare, Gilbert Harman, and Simon Blackburn promise to set people free from the unduly rigid ontology of moral realism, namely, the existence of moral facts. Quasi-realism would allow people to enjoy the traditional realist comforts such as moral truths, moral knowledge, and moral objectivity, without the realists’ baggage of commitments, theoretical burdens, and practical costs, or so they contend. It all sounds too good to be true, but such a possibility seems exciting: why insist on the existence of moral facts if all aspects of our moral practices, especially the realist-sounding ones, could be understood without the fact-multiplying realist ontology? Of course, the real question is this: is there anything significant that will be lost in our understanding of our moral practices if we were to settle for quasi-realism? A definite “yes” to the question has to be given, and we shall see why in this section.

The possibility that the quasi-realist extends to people is that quasi-realism poses no serious threat to the moral realist position. However, this quasi-realist contention— that by siding with quasi-realism nothing significant will be lost in our understanding of our moral practices—is simply mistaken. The quasi-realist loses some of the best explanations of events, states of affairs, and phenomena within the world: the quasi-realist must reject folk moral explanations. This is so, it will be argued, because the quasi-realist cannot accommodate folk moral explanations without reducing them to naturalistic explanations.

a. An Analogy: Quasi-Realism about Derogatory Judgments

Blackburn discusses derogatory judgments in his attempt to show how the quasi-realist allows for realist comforts. The quasi-realistic understanding of these judgments, according to Blackburn, allows for antirealist cognitivism about derogatory judgments, derogatory descriptivism, derogatory truth, derogatory knowledge, and even derogatory objectivity. The same may be said of the quasi-realistic understanding of moral judgments: for example, the quasi-realist might be entitled to cognitivism when it comes to moral judgments, descriptivism when it comes to moral language, moral truth, moral knowledge, and the quasi-realist perhaps may even be entitled to moral objectivity. Analogously to the quasi-realism about derogatory judgments, Blackburn claims that quasi-realists are entitled to all these, without being committed to the existence of moral facts as part of the supposed fabric of the world.

Blackburn’s derogatory judgments argument goes something like this: “Kraut” is an inherently derogatory expression. The judgment “Franz is a Kraut” is a cognitive state just like ordinary non-derogatory beliefs. It consists partly of the judgment that Franz is German. The sentence or utterance “Franz is a Kraut” expresses a statement that describes how the world is. The Franz sentence expresses something true, namely, that Franz is a German insofar as it expresses nothing further about him. But the Franz sentence expresses more than just his nationality. It also expresses that Germans, including Franz, are fit objects of derision. We may call this additional part the “derogatory judgment” of the Franz sentence. The Franz sentence expresses something false because, according to Blackburn, the part that expresses the derogatory judgment is false. No one is a fit object of derision solely because of his nationality. Consequently, the Franz statement describes the world falsely.

What makes the Franz statement false? What makes the Franz statement false is twofold: 1) no one is a fit object of derision solely because of his nationality, so, the statement is false because it has failed to refer to anything; and 2) there is no person in the world toward whom it is appropriate to have the derogatory attitude and/or intention that is expressed by way of the Franz statement. The quasi-realist may maintain that the truth or falsity of the Franz statement is to be determined by the existence or non-existence of the person toward whom it is appropriate to have such an attitude. Since there is no such person, the Franz statement is false. That is to say, the speaker of the Franz sentence speaks falsely because she reports a state of affairs as actual that is non-actual, namely she is falsely reporting that it is appropriate to have derogatory attitudes toward some people solely because of their nationality, although she may be correctly identifying Franz’s nationality as German. Truth or falsity in derogatory judgments may be found in the way that they correspond or do not correspond to the world.

Analogously, quasi-realists may earn the right to maintain cognitivism when it comes to moral judgments, descriptivism, moral truths, moral knowledge, moral objectivity, and so on. For the quasi-realist, the inner workings of moral language are such that they afford such realist-sounding expressions like moral truths without ever accepting the realist ontology.

b. Quasi-Realism, Antirealism, and Explanationist Moral Realism

The quasi-realist paints a rosy philosophical picture in which one can enjoy realist-sounding luxuries while not multiplying entities beyond necessity. Nonetheless, the nagging question remains: is it not better to have a real thing than to have a quasi-real thing, especially when the theoretical price is right? We must challenge the quasi-realist’s entitlement to be regarded as the contemporary heir of moral antirealism, and examine her reasons for thinking that quasi-realism is true. It is ethical relativism that wins Harman antirealist entitlements. Blackburn earns his spurs through projectivism that eventually allows for the ontological parsimony. But why do quasi-realists think their particular brand of antirealism is true? Both Harman and Blackburn give a surprisingly unanimous explanation. They call it the explanatory inadequacy thesis of the moral and it addresses the comparative explanatory inferiority of moral facts, the total lack of explanatory power of moral facts, or explanatory reductionism.

For instance, according to Blackburn, projectivism must be true because “we need to explain the ban on mixed worlds, and the argument goes that antirealism [projectivism] does this better than realism” (1984, 184). Harman thinks that ethical relativism—the view that “there is no single true morality”—must be true because it is a “reasonable inference from the most plausible explanation of moral diversity” (Harman and Thomson 1996, 8). Harman’s reason is a version of the explanatory inadequacy of moral facts thesis. It is the inadequacy thesis that entitles the quasi-realist to the antirealist parsimony. To mark the moral realist territory in such a way that implies the irrelevance view (the view that the explanatory inadequacy of moral facts does not constitute evidence against moral realism) ignores the fact that it is primarily the inadequacy thesis that entitles the quasi-realist to anti-realism. The explanatory power of moral facts is the only realist doctrine that is immune from quasi-realist debunking.

It is puzzling for the quasi-realist to advance the explanatory inadequacy thesis since she has ample room for accommodating folk moral explanations. She only needs to appeal to the putative moral facts as though they are real. The “as though” attitude does a yeoman’s work. It gives her the right to use notions such as bivalence, moral truth, moral knowledge, and so on. It seems rather arbitrary to stop at accommodating moral explanations. The quasi-realist’s dismissive attitude toward moral explanations is the quasi-realist’s qualification as an antirealist.

3. Moral Realism after Quasi-Realism

Such quasi-delicacies like quasi-moral-truths, quasi-moral-knowledge, or quasi-moral-objectivity allow for contemporary antirealist ways, but moral realists surely cannot rest content with them. Moral realists must find a way for not only rejecting the quasi-realist’s debunking of the disagreements between the traditional realist and the antirealist, but also a way for establishing “real” moral comforts. A couple of ways moral realists do this is by asserting the existence of objective literal moral truths and explanationist moral realism.

Figure 5 indicates an inflated way of establishing the realist’s ontological thesis, namely, that there are moral facts. On this inflated moral realism, the realist view turns out to be a jumble of 4 major theories in philosophy: cognitivism, descriptivism, literalism, and success theory. (The correspondence theory of truth is neither necessary nor sufficient for moral realism as we saw above.) Although the existence of objective literal moral truths may show that the aforementioned theories are jointly sufficient for moral realism, it ignores the quasi-realist’s ways of saying the realist-sounding things (the quasi-realist’s way in masquerading as moral realists, if you will). A less inflated way of marking the realist territory would be advisable, should there be such a way. This is because quasi-realists insist that they are as much entitled to cognitivism, descriptivism, moral truth, moral knowledge and even moral objectivity as moral realists. Their insistence effectively thwarts realist attempts at marking their territory by relying on the traditional disagreement between realists and antirealists mapped in figure 5.

Explanationist moral realism has been suggested as a way of blocking the alleged quasi-realist masquerade. It focuses on the significance of having moral explanations. The explanationist moral realist holds that moral facts genuinely explain events and states of affairs in the world. In a rough and ready way, the explanationist realist maintains that there are moral facts because they explain non-moral events. However, her claim is debated even within the realist camp. Some moral realists consider that explanatory adequacy (or, inadequacy for that matter) is irrelevant in establishing the truth of moral realism; and, it is no easy task to show that moral facts are genuinely explanatory (or, that the quasi-realist’s accommodation of moral explanations is not as robust as she claims it to be). Nonetheless, since explanationist moral realism is much simpler than the inflated moral realism of figure 5, explanationist moral realism demands the realist’s close attention.

4. References and Further Reading

  • Alston, William P. 1996. A Realist Conception of Truth. Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
  • Ayer, A. J. 1952. Language, Truth, and Logic. New York: Dover Publications.
  • Blackburn, Simon. 1981. “Rule Following and Moral Realism,” In Holtzman and Leich (1981).
  • Blackburn, Simon. 1984. Spreading the Word: Groundings in the Philosophy of Language. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Blackburn, Simon. 1993. Essays in Quasi-Realism. New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Blackburn, Simon. 1998. Ruling Passions: A Theory of Practical Reasoning. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Blackburn, Simon, and Keith Simmons, eds. 1999. Truth. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Brink, David O. 1989. Moral Realism and the Foundations of Ethics. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Darwall, Stephen, Allan Gibbard, and Peter Railton. 1992. Toward Fin de siècle Ethics: Some Trends. The Philosophical Review, 101 (1):115-89.
  • Dodd, Julian. 2002. “Recent Work on Truth,” Philosophical Books, 43:279-91.
  • Fine, Kit. 2001. “The Question of Realism,” Philosopher’s Imprint 1, (1):1-30.
  • Geach, Peter. 1965. “Assertion,” The Philosophical Review, 74:449-465.
  • Gettier, E. L. 1963. “Is Justified True Belief Knowledge?” Analysis, 23 (6).
  • Gibbard, Allan. 1990. Wise Choices, Apt Feelings. Cambridge: Harvard University Press.
  • Goldman, Alvin I. 1978. “A Causal Theory of Knowing,” in Essays on Knowledge and Justification, edited by G. S. Pappas and M. Swain. Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
  • Goldman, Alvin I. 1986. “What is Justified Belief?” in Empirical Knowledge: Readings in Contemporary Epistemology, edited by P. K. Moser: Rowman & Littlefield Publishers, Inc.
  • Hare, R. M. 1952. The Language of Morals. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Harman, Gilbert. 1977. The Nature of Morality. New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Harman, Gilbert. 1986. “Moral Explanations of Natural Facts—Can Moral Claims Be Tested Against Moral Reality?” The Southern Journal of Philosophy, XXIV (Supplement):57-68.
  • Harman, Gilbert. 2000. Explaining Value and Other Essays in Moral Philosophy. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Harman, Gilbert, and Judith Jarvis Thomson. 1996. Moral Relativism and Moral Objectivity. Cambridge: Blackwell.
  • Hatzimoysis, Anthony. 1997. “Minimalism about Truth and Ethical Cognitivism,” in Analyomen, 2, Volume III: Philosophy of Mind, Practical Philosophy, Miscellanea, edited by G. Meggle. de-Gruyter: Hawthorne.
  • Horgan, Terence, and Mark Timmons. 2000. “Nondescriptivist Cognitivism: Framework for a New Metaethic,” Philosophical Papers, 29:121-153.
  • Horwich, Paul. 1998. Truth. 2nd ed. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Kim, Jaegwon. 1988. What is “Naturalized Epistemology?” Philosophical Perspectives 2 (Epistemology):381-405.
  • Kupperman, Joel J. 1988. “Ethical Fallibility,” Ratio 1:33-46.
  • Lynch, Michael P. 1997. “Critical Study: Minimal Realism or Realistic Minimalism?” The Philosophical Quarterly 47 (189):512-518.
  • Piker, Andrew. 1995. “W. D. Falk’s Alternative to Moral Realism and Anti-Realism,” Auslegung 20 (2):100-105.
  • Plantinga, Alvin. 1993a. Warrant: the Current Debate. New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Plantinga, Alvin. 1993b. Warrant and Proper Function. New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Quine, W. V. O. 1986. “Epistemology Naturalized,” in Empirical Knowledge: Readings in Contemporary Epistemology, edited by P. K. Moser: Rowman & Littlefield Publishers, Inc.
  • Sayre-McCord, Geoffrey. 1988. “The Many Moral Realisms,” in Essays on Moral Realism. Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press.
  • Skorupski, John. 1999. “Irrealist Cognitivism,” Ratio XII:436-459.
  • Stevenson, C. L. 1937. “The Emotive Meaning of Ethical Terms,” Mind 46:14-31.
  • Stevenson, C. L. 1944. Ethics and Language. New Haven: Yale University Press.
  • Stevenson, C. L. 1963. Facts and Values. New Haven: Yale University Press.
  • Sturgeon, Nicholas L. 1986. “Harman on Moral Explanations of Natural Facts,” The Southern Journal of Philosophy XXIV (Supplement):69-78.
  • Tenenbaum, Sergio. 1996. “Realists without a Cause: Deflationary Theories of Truth and Ethical Realism,” Canadian Journal of Philosophy 26 (4):561-90.
  • Waller, Bruce N. 1994. “Noncognitivist Moral Realism,” Philosophia 24 (1-2):57-75.
  • Wedgwood, Ralph. Forthcoming. Nature of Normativity, Oxford University Press.
  • Wright, Crispin. 1992. Truth and Objectivity. Cambridge: Harvard University Press.
  • Wright, Crispin.1993. “Realism: The Contemporary Debate: Whither Now?” in Reality, Representation and Projection, edited by J. Haldane and C. Wright. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Wright, Crispin.1999. “Truth: A Traditional Debate Reviewed,” in Blackburn and Simmons (1999).

Author Information

Shin Kim
Hankuk University of Foreign Studies

Last updated: May 24, 2006 | Originally published: