Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Moral Particularism

Moral particularism is the view that the moral status of an action is not in any way determined by moral principles; rather, it depends on the configuration of the morally relevant features of the action in a particular context. It can be seen as a reaction against a traditional principled conception of morality as comprising a true and coherent set of moral principles. The chief motivation for moral particularism derives from the observation that exceptions to principles are common, and exceptions to exceptions are not unusual. Moral principles, which are equipped only to deal with homogeneous cases, seem to be too crude to handle the delicate nuances in heterogeneous moral situations.

Two counterarguments against moral particularism have been popular. One is the argument from supervenience. The other is the argument from the atomism of reason. The argument from supervenience is meant to establish the existence of true absolute moral principles, whereas the argument from the atomism of reason is meant to establish the existence of true, pro tanto, moral principles. If these arguments succeed, they will jointly consolidate a principled conception of morality. This article introduces the idea of moral particularism in more detail and assesses moral particularists’ responses to the two counterarguments mentioned above.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. Absolute Moral Principlism and the Supervenience Argument
  3. Moral Particularists’ Responses to the Supervenience Argument
  4. Argument from Atomism of Reason for Pro tanto Principlism
  5. Criticism of Argument from Atomism of Reason
  6. Concluding Remarks
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

Moral particularism, on a first approximation, is the view that the moral status of an action is not in any way determined by moral principles; rather, it depends on the configuration of the morally relevant features of the action in a particular context. To illustrate, whether killing is morally wrong is not determined by whether it violates any sort of universal moral principles, say, the moral principle against killing; rather, its moral status is determined by its morally relevant features in the particular context where it occurs. If it occurs in a normal context, it is wrong; however, if it occurs in a context where the killer kills because it is the only way to defend from a rascal’s fatal attack, it is not wrong. In this case, the moral principle against killing does not determine the moral status of the action; rather, its moral status is determined by its morally relevant features, that is, the feature of killing an aggressor and the feature of saving one’s own life, in the particular context. Now, let us call those who contend, contra moral particularists, that the moral status of an action is determined by moral principles the ‘moral principlists’. In the killing case, the moral principlists might well contend that the principle against killing is not the right sort of principle but the principle which says that ‘killing is wrong except it is done out of self-defense’ is. So still the moral principlists might contend that it is the principle that determines the moral status of the action. However, according to moral particularism, even in cases where the moral verdicts issued respectively by moral principles and particular features converge, it is still the particular features rather than universal principles that determine the moral status of an action. This is not to say that the moral particularists are right to think so; this merely illustrates the difference between the views of moral particularists and principlists. The gist of moral particularism is best summed up in the words of Terence Irwin (2000): the particulars are normatively prior to the universals.

To further illustrate the differences between moral particularism and principlism, moral particularism can be seen as a reaction against a top-down principled approach to morality. That is, it opposes the moral principlists’ idea that we can get morally right answers by applying universal moral principles to particular situations.

In more detail, in moral principlists’ conception of morality, morality is made up of a true and coherent set of moral principles. It follows from this conception that if one negates the existence of moral principles, one negates morality altogether. For without moral principles, it seems that there would be no standards against which the moral status of actions can be determined.

The above-mentioned principlists’ conception of morality has been, without a doubt, a dominant view. This can be confirmed by examining the work in normative ethics. One chief concern of normative ethics has been to formulate basic moral principles that govern the moral terrain. It is generally believed by the normative ethicists that in basic moral principles lies the ultimate source of moral truths. The normative ethicists, though arguing among themselves over what the correct basic moral principles are, all tacitly agree that a major part of normative ethics is built upon the articulation of the basic moral principles and their application to practical moral issues.

While the debate amongst normative ethicists is continuing about the correct formulation and application of the basic moral principle(s), the common principled conception of morality underlying it has not received proper attention—not until the appearance of the contemporary particularists.

Contrary to the principlists, the particularists argue that morality does not depend upon codification into a true and coherent set of moral principles. On their view, general principles fail to capture the complexity and uniqueness of particular circumstances. Exceptions to principles are common and exceptions to exceptions are not unusual (Davis 2004; Tsu 2010). In other words, there are no exceptionless principles of the sort which the principlists have in mind. The particularists believe that the moral status of an action is not determined by moral principles; instead it always relies on the particular configuration of its contextual features. In brief, moral particularists take a bottom-up approach and, as Irwin pointed out, they give the normative priorities to the particulars. That is, according to moral particularism, the moral status of an action is determined by its morally relevant features in a particular context.

More slowly, one chief motivation for moral particularism to place emphasis on the particulars comes from their observation that the whole history of moral philosophy has witnessed brilliant moral philosophers searching for true moral principles that codify the moral landscape, yet no principles have generated wide agreement. There can be many explanations for this, but one is particularly salient: there are no true moral principles to be had in the first place. Parallel situations like this are common in many corners of philosophy. Many brilliant philosophers have spent their whole life’s time analyzing concepts of probability, truth or knowledge, trying to supply non-trivial, non-circular necessary and sufficient conditions for them. As is generally acknowledged today, it is extremely difficult, if not entirely impossible, to come up with a widely accepted analysis. One plausible explanation is that no analysis of the kind is to be had in the first place. This is not to say that there cannot be alternative explanations. But until they are produced and justified, there is at least a prima facie case for doubting whether conceptual analysis can produce non-trivial, non-circular necessary and sufficient conditions for the meanings of many philosophically interesting terms. Likewise, as hardly any moral principle receives wide acceptance, there is also a prima facie case that can be made for doubting whether there are any true moral principles in the first place, until an alternative explanation of why agreement on principles is so hard to come by is produced and justified.

Adding to the untenability of the principled conception of morality, moral particularists argue, is the fact that the moral status of an action is context-sensitive in character. That is, whether an action is right or wrong depends entirely on the particular contexts where it takes place; no universal principles, which are only equipped to deal with homogeneous cases, are capable of capturing the context-sensitive character of the moral status of an action in various heterogeneous contexts. Take the action of killing for instance. A principle against killing will run into exceptions in cases of self-defense and a further qualified principle against killing except in cases of self-defense will run into exceptions again in cases of overreacting self-defense. The exceptions may well go on infinitely. This shows that, the moral particularists believe, no principles are able to handle the essentially context-sensitive character of the moral status of an action.

To forestall some possible misunderstanding, moral particularism is not just the view that the moral status of an action is not determined by moral principles of the absolute kind – the absolute moral principle against killing; rather, it is the more encompassing and more radical view that it is not determined by moral principles of the pro tanto kind either. The difference between absolute moral principles and pro tanto ones roughly lies in the fact that the former purport to determine the moral status of an action conclusively, whereas the later do not; instead, the pro tanto moral principles, on a standard construal, merely specify the contribution a morally relevant feature makes to the determination of the moral status of an action. To use an example to illustrate, the difference between an absolute principle against lying and a pro tanto principle against lying lies in the fact that according to the absolute principle, lying is wrong (period) whereas according to the pro tanto principle, lying is wrong-making. To put it differently, according to the absolute principle against lying, the fact that an action has a feature of lying conclusively determines its wrongness whereas according to the pro tanto principle against lying, the same fact merely contributes to the wrongness of the action and leaves open the possibility that it is right overall. For instance, if an action has not only a feature of lying, but also a feature of saving a life, then the wrongness the feature of lying contributes to the action may well be outweighed by the rightness the feature of saving a life contributes to the action. Overall, the action may still turn out to be right, despite its violation of the pro tanto principle against lying.

Moral particularism, as we have explained, not only opposes absolute principlism, i.e. the idea that the moral status of an action is determined by absolute principles, but also pro tanto principlism, i.e. the idea that pro tanto moral principles jointly determine the moral status of an action. As moral particularists see things, there are neither true absolute principles nor true pro tanto principles. They both are bound to run into exceptions in some cases. In what follows, we will introduce the arguments for absolute moral principlism and pro tanto principlism and moral particularists’ responses to them.

Before we move on, however, there is an important caveat to be noted about terminology. It is this. Some philosophers use ‘prima facie principles’ to mean pro tanto principles. This is largely due to W. D. Ross’s influence. Ross was perhaps the first philosopher who used ‘prima facie’ to mean ‘pro tanto’. Strictly speaking, however, there is a difference in the meanings of these two phrases, as Ross himself later recognized and apologized. The difference between ‘prima facie’ and ‘pro tanto’ principles can be put in the following way: a prima facie principle specifies a moral duty at first glance whereas a pro tanto principle specifies a moral duty sans phrase, unless it is overridden by other moral duties. To illustrate with examples, a pro tanto principle against lying means that other things being equal, we have a duty not to lie. By contrast, a prima facie principle against lying means that at first glance, we have a duty not to lie; however, as we take a closer examination of the facts of the situations, we discover that we do not in fact have such a duty, as, for example, in the case where we are playing a bluffing game, the rule of which states that lying to the other contestants is permitted.

Now, having clarified the distinction between ‘pro tanto principle’ and ‘prima facie principle’, it has to be noted, for our purposes, that pro tanto principlism is the view that the moral status of an action is determined jointly by pro tanto principles, instead of by prima facie principles we just elucidated. In fact, the prima facie principles do not in any way determine the moral status of an action, for as we have explained, they are merely indicative of its moral status (as our moral duty) at first glance.

With the above caveat in mind, we can proceed to examine the arguments for absolute moral principlism and pro tanto principlism, and moral particularists’ responses to them.

2. Absolute Moral Principlism and the Supervenience Argument

Absolute moral principlism  is the idea that there are true absolute moral principles. The most powerful argument that has been advanced in support of this idea is the supervenience argument. It was advanced collaboratively by Frank Jackson, Philip Pettit, and Michael Smith (henceforth the Canberrans, as they all worked in Canberra in Australia when they advanced the argument) in their co-authored paper “Ethical Particularism and Patterns”. Roughly, the supervenience argument takes the following form:

P1: The thesis of global supervenience is true.

P2: If the thesis of global supervenience is true, then there must be a true conditional of the form ‘(x) (Nx → Mx)’.

P3: The true conditional of the form ‘(x) (Nx → Mx)’ must be shaped.

P4: A true shaped conditional of the form ‘(x) (Nx → Mx)’ is a true absolute moral principle.

C: There are true absolute moral principles, that is absolute moral principlism is true.

The above argument is valid, but each premise needs some comment.

P1: The thesis of global supervenience is true.

The thesis of global supervenience means, according to the Canberrans, the following:

The thesis of global supervenience: Naturally identical worlds are morally identical.

To illustrate, suppose that N1 stands for the sum of natural properties of world 1 and M1 for the sum of its moral properties. According to the thesis of global supervenience, for any world that is naturally identical with world 1, that is for any world that has N1, it must have M1. The Canberrans take the global thesis to be true, for it is a dictum in the realm of ethics that there cannot be a moral difference without a natural difference. So it follows from this dictum that naturally identical worlds are morally identical.

P2: If the thesis of global supervenience is true, then there must be a true conditional of the form ‘(x) (NxMx)’.

Suppose again that N1 stands for the sum of natural properties of world 1 and M1 for the sum of its moral properties. As we have illustrated, according to the thesis of global supervenience, for any world that is naturally identical with world 1, that is for any world that has N1, it must have M1. Likewise, let N2 and M2 stand respectively for the sum of natural properties of world 2 and the sum of its moral properties. According to the thesis of global supervenience, for any world that is naturally identical with world 2, it must have M2. Such being the case, from the thesis of global supervenience we can get the following raft of conditionals:

If x has N1, then x has M1.

If x has N2, then x has M2.

For the sake of simplicity, let us focus on the moral property of rightness and use ‘M’ for it, and use ‘N’ for ‘N1 or N2 or N3…’. Now, we can simplify the above raft of conditionals as follows:

If x has N, then x has M.

Hence, we can infer from the thesis of global supervenience that there must be a true conditional of the form ‘(x) (Nx → Mx)’.

P3: The true conditional of the form ‘(x) (NxMx)’ must be shaped.

The meaning of ‘shaped’ requires some explanation. According to the Canberrans, a conditional of the form ‘(x) (Nx → Mx)’ is shaped if and only if there is some commonality in the various Ns ‘N’ refers to. Remember that ‘N’ stands for ‘N1 or N2 or N3…’. So this just means that a conditional of the form ‘(x) (Nx → Mx)’ is shaped if and only if there is some commonality amongst N1, N2, N3... Having clarified the meaning of ‘shaped’, one question that needs to be addressed here is why there must be some commonality amongst N1, N2, N3…

The Canberrans contend that there must be some commonality amongst the various Ns, for if there were not, an absurd consequence would follow. The absurd consequence is this: we are not competent with the use of moral terms. This is absurd because we are indeed competent with the use of moral terms. We condemn a cold-blooded case of murder as immoral whereas we approve of an act of self-sacrifice as virtuous. It is absurd to suggest that we are not competent with the use of moral terms. Let’s call this absurd consequence conceptual incompetence for short. So how is it the case that if there were no commonality amongst the various Ns, conceptual incompetence would follow? Or to put the question somewhat differently, why is commonality in the various Ns essential for our competence with the use of moral terms?

To answer this question, let us use an example to illustrate. According to the Canberrans, the moral term ‘M’ (or ‘right’ in our current case) applies to various actions that have Ns. These actions that have Ns can be infinite in number. In order to know that ‘M’ can be applied to these various actions that have Ns, we, as finite human beings, cannot possibly acquaint ourselves with each and all of the actions that have Ns which ‘M’ applies to. That is to say, we cannot become competent with the use of ‘M’ by acquainting ourselves with all the possible actions ‘M’ applies to. The only viable way via which we can become competent with the use of ‘M’ is when these various actions have some finite commonality we can latch on to. Once we latch on to that commonality, we become competent with the use of ‘M’. So, the fact that we are indeed competent with the use of ‘M’ shows that there must be some commonality amongst the various Ns.

P4: A true shaped conditional of the form ‘(x) (NxMx)’ is a true absolute moral principle.

This premise is by definition true, as the Canberrans contend that a true absolute moral principle is one that displays a shaped connection between the natural ways things might be and the moral ways things might be. Suppose that ‘N’ stands for the natural property of maximal utility and ‘M’ for the moral property of rightness. Then the true shaped conditional of the form ‘(x) (Nx → Mx)’ just says that an action that has maximal utility is right. This is clearly equivalent to a true absolute moral principle of utility.

C: There are true absolute moral principles, that is absolute moral principlism is true).

C follows validly from P1 to P4. If there are true absolute moral principles, this just means that absolute moral principlism is true. Besides, this also means that moral particularism, the claim that there are neither true absolute moral principles nor true pro tanto moral principles will be refuted.

3. Moral Particularists’ Responses to the Supervenience Argument

In section 2, we have examined Canberrans’ supervenience argument for moral absolute principlism, or against moral particularism. Now, in this section, we will examine moral particularists’ response to Canberrans’ supervenience argument. Much of the philosophical action has focused on P3, especially on ‘conceptual incompetence’. This is understandable, as all the other premises seem to be relatively uncontroversial. So now, without further detain, let us just cut to the chase and introduce moral particularists’ response to P3. Jonathan Dancy (1999a, 2004), a chief proponent of moral particularism, responds to the supervenience argument by taking issue with P3. He contends that the Canberrans have not provided us with very convincing reasons to believe that P3 is true. In particular, Dancy argues that the Canberrans’ claim with regard to ‘conceptual incompetence’ is far from being justified.

As a reminder, P3 is the claim that the true conditional of the form ‘(x)

(Nx → Mx)’ must be shaped. As we have explained, the meaning of a ‘shaped’

conditional boils down to this: there is some commonality in the various Ns. And the Canberrans contend that if there were no commonality in the

various Ns, then the absurd consequence of ‘conceptual incompetence’ would

result, that is the absurd consequence that we are not competent with the use of

moral terms.

Remember that the Canberrans’ reason for thinking that ‘conceptual

incompetence’ would result is this. The Canberrans argue that the only plausible way for us to learn a moral term is by latching onto a commonality that the various actions that have Ns have in common, for we, as finite beings, cannot possibly acquaint ourselves with all the various actions that have Ns which the moral term can be applied to. So if there were no commonality amongst the various actions that have Ns, then it would be impossible for us to become competent with the use of moral terms.

However, Dancy maintains that Canberrans’ line of reasoning is a non sequitur. He argues that we can become competent with the use of moral terms even if there is no commonality amongst the various actions that have Ns. For there is one theory of competence the Canberrans unduly neglected, that is, the prototype theory, which is firstly advanced by Rosch (1975). According to the prototype theory, there is no commonality amongst the various Ns the moral term ‘right’ can be applied to; we do not latch unto the commonality amongst various Ns when we learn the term ‘right’ since there is none. Instead, what we latch unto are the ‘prototypical properties’ of a right action, that is the properties that are typical of a right action.

To use an analogy to illustrate, the various things the concept ‘bird’ can be applied to really have no commonality. It is true that birds can typically fly. However, a penguin cannot fly. It is also true that birds typically have feathers. Nonetheless, some baby birds do not. So there is really no commonality all birds have in common. Does this mean that we are thus unable to learn how to use the term ‘bird’? No! For we are indeed competent with the use of the term ‘bird’. So how do we pick up the term ‘bird’ if there is really no commonality amongst the various birds? According to the prototype theory, what we pick up are the prototypical properties that are typical of a bird—for instance, its capability of flying, its having feathers, and its having wings, et cetera. With regard to the atypical cases, such as those of penguins and baby birds, we can rightly categorize them as birds because they have enough of those prototypical properties that are typical of a bird. Likewise, Dancy contends that in the moral cases, we can become competent with the use of moral terms, say, the term ‘right’, by picking up those prototypical properties that are typical of right actions. With regard to the atypical cases, we can rightly categorize them as right actions because they have enough of those prototypical properties that are typical of right actions just as we can rightly categorize penguins and baby birds as birds because they have enough of those prototypical properties that are typical of birds.

So far, we have seen Dancy’s response to the ‘conceptual incompetence’ claim that is used to support P3 in the supervenience argument. Whether Dancy’s response is successful is an issue that requires further investigation. The crux of the question lies in whether the term ‘right’ is really analogous to the term ‘bird’ with regard to the lack of commonality amongst the things they can be applied to. The use of analogy, while illuminating, does not seem to prove that the term ‘right’ is really analogous to the term ‘bird’ in that aspect. To put it somewhat differently, is there any good reason to think that the prototype theory that can be used to explain our competence with the term ‘bird’ can explain equally well our competence with the term ‘right’? Perhaps a natural response from the moral particularists would be to say that the morally right actions are multiply realizable at the natural level—even killing, stealing, and lying can be morally right in some circumstances, and if so, it seems plausible to contend that these morally right actions do not seem to have anything in common with other morally right ones such as saving a drowning kid in the pond or donating to Oxfam. This is one of the possible responses that can be made. As to exactly how plausible it is and whether there are other more plausible responses await further exploration. These issues will not be pursed here.

4. Argument from Atomism of Reason for Pro tanto Principlism

In sections 2 and 3, we have examined respectively the supervenience argument that purports to establish the truth of absolute principlism and moral particularist’s response to it. Now, remember that moral particularism does not just hold the view that absolute principlism is false, but also the view that pro tanto principlism is false. Now, if there are good arguments to show that pro tanto principlism is true, then moral particularism will be falsified.

Remember that pro tanto principlism is the claim that there are true pro tanto moral principles. Pro tanto moral principles specify a feature of an action that is either right-making or wrong-making. For instance, the pro tanto principle against lying specifies the feature of lying as a wrong-making feature whereas the pro tanto principle demanding promise-keeping specifies the feature of promise-keeping as right-making. The strongest argument that has been advanced to support pro tanto principlism is the argument from the atomism of reason. It runs as follows:

P1. The atomism of reason is true.

P2. If the atomism of reason is true, then there are true pro tanto moral

principles.

C. There are true pro tanto moral principles

The above argument is valid. But in the meantime, each premise needs some comments.

P1: The atomism of reason is true.

In its simplest form, the atomism of reason is the idea that features of an action, qua reasons, behave in an atomistic way. The atomism of reason is contrasted with holism of reason, the view that features of an action, qua reasons, behave in a holistic way. To grasp the difference between atomism and holism, it is of course necessary for us to understand what ‘atomistic way’ and ‘holistic way’ mean. According to atomism, features, qua reasons, behave in an atomistic way in the sense that their status as reasons for or against performing an action is constant, insusceptible to the change of contexts. It is as if they had an intrinsic nature that remains constant across contexts. Hence, the analogy to ‘atom’. To illustrate, according to atomism of reason, if a feature of lying is a reason against performing the action in one context, its status as a reason against remains constant; even in a context where you have to lie in order to save a life, the feature of lying still remains as a reason against performing the action. Its status as a reason against does not change, although its moral significance might well be outweighed by that of saving a life.

On the other hand, holism contends that features, qua reasons, behave in a holistic way in the sense that their status as reasons for or against might change due to the change of contexts. For instance, the fact that an action has a feature of lying might be a reason against performing it in a normal context; however, it might not be so in a context where we are playing a bluffing game. Indeed, it might even become a reason for performing the action because it makes the game more exciting and enjoyable.

In face of the challenges from the holists, there are typically three routes the atomists take to respond. First, the atomists might well bite the bullet and contend that the feature of lying is a reason against no matter what. In the context of playing a bluffing game, the atomists might well contend that the fact that bluffing has a feature of lying is still a reason against so doing; it is just that its moral significance is outweighed by that of the harmless pleasures of the participants. That is why bluffing seems overall morally permissible in that context. However, this does not mean that the status of the feature of lying as a reason has changed from a reason against to a reason for in that context.

Another response from the atomists is this. The features that change their reason status are overly simplified. The more the features get specified, the less compelling the case is that they can change their reason status. For instance, the feature of killing might change its status from a reason against in a normal context to a reason for in a context where the only possible way to defend oneself against a rapist is to kill him. However, when the feature of killing gets more specified as the feature of killing a little girl merely for one’s own pleasure, it does not seem likely that its status as a reason against can change.

A third line of response from the atomists is this. There are two sorts of features we need to distinguish in the current context: the morally thin and the morally thick. The difference between the thin and the thick, according to Crisp (2000), lies chiefly in whether they are couched in virtue terms. For instance, the features of lying and killing belong to the thin whereas the features of honesty and cruelty belong to the thick. They also differ in the way they behave. While the morally thin might change their reason status according to contexts, the morally thick don’t. For instance, while it might well be the case that the feature of lying might change its status from a reason against to a reason for, it is never the case for the feature of dishonesty. The feature of dishonesty is always a reason against. To think otherwise is to distort the meaning of ‘dishonesty’. In fact, according to Crisp, the invariant reason status of the feature of dishonesty is the best explanation for the variance of reason status of lying. In cases where lying brings about dishonesty, it is a reason against, whereas in cases where it does not, it is not a reason against. To put it more generally, the invariant reason status of the morally thick provides an illuminating explanation for why the morally thin change their reason status. So the atomists contend that it is both linguistically intuitive and explanatorily illuminating to regard the morally thick as invariant reasons. Such being the case, the atomists contend that while holism might be true of the morally thin, it is not true of the morally thick.

P2. If the atomism of reason is true, then there are true pro tanto moral principles.

The atomism of reason is the claim that features, qua reasons, behave in an atomistic way. As we have explained, this means that their reason status does not change according to contexts. If a feature of lying is a reason against in one context, it is a reason against in all contexts. If so, this just means that there is (always) a reason against lying. On the other hand, according to the pro tanto moral principle against lying, the fact that an action has a feature of lying always is a reason against performing it. So if the atomism of reason about lying is true, it follows naturally that there is a true pro tanto moral principle against lying. The same line of reasoning can be generalized to apply to other features as well.

5. Criticism of Argument from Atomism of Reason

P1 in the argument from the atomism of reason is where all the philosophical action is. In section 3, we have seen the atomists’ three possible replies to the particularists’ holism charge against P1. However, the particularists are not thus satisfied. In what follows, I will introduce respectively particularists’ further challenges to the atomists’ three replies.

First, the atomists contend that the atomism is simply true of how all features qua reasons behave. Even in cases where we are playing a bluffing game, the feature of lying is still a reason against but not a reason for. It does not thus change its reason status. Against this line of reasoning, the particularists might well contend that the atomists’ point is simply question-begging. For whether atomism is true of how all features qua reasons behave is exactly the issue disputed. The atomists’ assertion is no substitute for persuasion.

Second, the atomists contend that when the features get more and more specified, it is less and less likely that their reason status can change. For instance, while it might be possible for a feature of killing to change its reason status from a reason against to a reason for, it seems very unlikely for a more specified feature of killing, the feature of killing a little girl merely for fun, to change its reason status. In reply, the particularists might well contend that while the specified feature of killing a little girl merely for fun cannot change its moral status, it does not thus establish a pro tanto moral principle in the relevant sense. For the ‘merely for fun’ bit is a description of the agent’s motive, whereas a pro tanto principle is exclusively about the moral status of actions. When the controversial bit of the description of the feature is eliminated, it no longer seems as intuitively plausible to maintain that the feature of killing a little girl is always a reason against, for doing so might eliminate her needless suffering as a terminally ill patient and serves as a reason for. Against this line of reasoning, the atomists might well contend that the ‘merely for fun’ bit is added to the description only to prevent other principles from getting involved (for instance, the girl is not being killed as demanded by some other principle, where doing so is necessary to save a large number of girls) and that the specified feature can thus establish the truth of a pro tanto principle in the relevant sense. If the atomists were to so contend, the particularists might counter, as Dancy (2000) did, that true moral principles generated out of specified features like this are far and few between in the moral landscape. So while the atomists might have won a few battles against the particularists by producing a few true moral principles based on specified features, they certainly have not won the war. For morality, for the larger part, still cannot be codified into exceptionless moral principles and does not depend on them for its existence, the particularists might insist.

Finally, the atomists contend that atomism is true of the morally thick, the features that are couched in virtue terms, such as honesty or cruelty. In reply, the particularists might well contend that this is not necessarily the case. A spy might well be too honest whereas a platoon leader relentless in training his soldiers who are about to be sent to the battlefields might well be only cruel to be kind. In these cases, the feature of honesty might well change its reason status from a reason for to a reason against whereas the feature of cruelty might well do the reverse. In short, the morally thick, contra what the atomists claim, might well change their reason status. And calling someone ‘too honest’ or ‘cruel to be kind’ does not really run counter to our linguistic intuitions. On the other hand, with regard to the explanation of why a morally thin feature such as that of lying changes its reason status, the holists are not completely clueless as the atomists like to think. In fact, they might well appeal to the change of the context as providing an explanation. For instance, the holists might well contend that the reason why a feature of lying which is normally a reason against becomes a reason for in the context of playing a bluffing game is because of the change of the context. The atomists do not have any theoretical edge in terms of providing an explanation for why the morally thin can change their reason status.

6. Concluding Remarks

Moral particularism, as we have introduced it, is the view that the particulars are normatively prior to the universals. That is, the moral status of an action is not in any way determined by universal moral principles, but by the morally relevant features in a particular context where the action takes place. This view is motivated by the observation that universal principles, no matter whether they are absolute or pro tanto, often run into exceptions. This observation has led moral particularists to believe that the moral status of an action is context-sensitive, susceptible to the influences of various morally relevant factors in the particular circumstances. And as both absolute moral principles and pro tanto ones deal in the same sort of moral answer in all contexts they cover, moral particularists believe that they oversimplify the moral matter. The moral principles, be they absolute or pro tanto, fly in the face of the context-sensitivity of the moral status of an action. Moral particularists therefore contend that there are neither true absolute moral principles nor true pro tanto ones,

As we have seen, two major arguments against moral particularism have been advanced respectively by absolute moral principlists and pro tanto moral principlists. However, as we have also seen, they are far from being conclusive. P3 in the supervenience argument and P1 in the argument from the atomism of reason can both be disputed. Of course, this does not mean that there can never be compelling arguments against moral particularism. In fact, there are several outstanding issues remaining for moral particularism. Roughly, they all point to the fact that moral particularism has not really undermined a principled conception of morality, when the idea of a moral principle is construed in various specific ways. For instance, Holton (2002) has argued that the gist of moral particularism is entirely compatible with the existence of what he calls ‘that’s-it principle’. Ridge and McKeever (2006), on the other hand, propose to view moral principles as ‘regulative ideals’ and argue that this view of moral principles is not scathed by any particularist argument that has been advanced so far. Moreover, Väyrynen (2006) champions the notion of ‘hedged moral principles’ and argues that they might well play an indispensable role in action guidance. Finally, Robinson (2006) has urged a dispositionalist understanding of moral principles; when moral principles are so understood, Robinson contends that they are immune from the particularists’ attacks. We cannot afford to pursue the details of the above-mentioned proposals here. To determine whether they are successful or not lies beyond the scope of the current article. However, they all provide interesting topics for future research. It is fair to say that debates on moral particularism are still very lively. They cut deep into the nature of morality. This article has barely begun to scratch the surface.

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Author Information

Peter Shiu-Hwa Tsu
Email: u4079238@alumni.anu.edu.au
Taipei Medical University
Republic of China




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