Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Mozi (Mo-tzu, c. 400s—300s B.C.E.)

moziMo Di (Mo Ti), better known as Mozi (Mo-tzu) or “Master Mo,” was a Chinese thinker active from the late 5th to the early 4th centuries B.C.E. He is best remembered for being the first major intellectual rival to Confucius and his followers. Mozi’s teaching is summed up in ten theses extensively argued for in the text that bears his name, although he himself is unlikely to have been its author. The most famous of these theses is the injunction that one ought to be concerned for the welfare of people in a spirit of “impartial concern” (jian’ai) that does not make distinctions between self and other, associates and strangers, a doctrine often described more simplistically as “universal love.” Mozi founded a quasi-religious and paramilitary community that, apart from propagating the ten theses, lent aid to small states under threat from military aggressors with their expertise in counter-siege technology. Along with the Confucians, the Mohists were one of the two most prominent schools of thought during the Warring States period (403-221 B.C.E.), although contemporary sources such as the Hanfeizi and the Zhuangzi indicate that the Mohists had divided into rival sects by this time. While Mohist communities probably did not survive into the Qin dynasty (221-206 B.C.E.), Mohist ideas exerted a decisive influence upon the thinkers of early China. Between the late 4th and late 3rd centuries B.C.E., later Mohists wrote the earliest extant Chinese treatise on logic, as well as works on geometry, optics and mechanics. Mohist logic appears to have influenced the argumentative techniques of early Chinese thinkers, while Mohist visions of meritocracy and the public good helped to shape the political philosophies and policy decisions of both the Qin and Han (202 B.C.E.-220 C.E.) imperial regimes. In these ways, Mohist ideas survived well into the early imperial era, albeit by being absorbed into other Chinese philosophical traditions.

Table of Contents

  1. Historical Background
  2. The Core Chapters of the Mozi
  3. The Ten Core Theses of Mohism
  4. The Aims and Character of Mohist Doctrine
  5. Moral Epistemology
  6. The Foundations of Mohist Morality
  7. Impartial Concern
  8. Moral Psychology and Human Nature
  9. Government
  10. Frugality
  11. Just War
  12. Heaven and Spirits
  13. References and Further Reading

1. Historical Background

The details of Mozi’s life are uncertain.  Early sources identify him variously as a contemporary of Confucius or as living after Confucius’ time.  Modern scholars generally believe that Mozi was active from the late 5th to the early 4th centuries B.C.E., before the time of the Confucian philosopher Mencius, which places him in the early Warring States period (403-221 B.C.E.) of ancient Chinese history.  Little can be known of his personal life.  Some early sources say that he, like Confucius, was a native of the state of Lu (in modern Shandong) and at one point served as a minister in the state of Song (in modern Henan). According to tradition, he studied with Confucian teachers but later rebelled against their ideas.  As was the case with Confucius, Mozi probably traveled among the various contending states to present his ideas before their rulers in the hope of obtaining political employment, with an equal lack of success.

Mozi founded a highly organized quasi-religious and military community, with considerable geographical reach.  Overseen by a “Grand Master” (juzi), members of the community — “Mohists” (mozhe) — were characterized by their commitment to ten theses ascribed to “Our Teacher Master Mo” (zimozi), versions of which are articulated in the “Core Chapters” of the eponymous text.  Quite apart from propagating the teachings of Mozi, the Mohist community also functioned as an international rescue organization that dispatched members versed in the arts of defensive military techniques to the aid of small states under threat from military aggressors. This outreach presumably stemmed from the Mohists’ opposition to all forms of military aggression.

Some scholars speculate that Mozi and the Mohists probably came from a lower social class than, for instance, the Confucians, but the evidence is inconclusive and at best suggestive. Nevertheless, if the conjecture is true, it could well explain the often repetitive and artless style in which much of the Mozi is composed and the anti-aristocratic stance of much Mohist doctrine, as well as why the Mohists paid such attention to the basic economic livelihood of the common people.

2. The Core Chapters of the Mozi

The text known as the Mozi traditionally is divided into seventy-one “chapters,” some of which are marked “missing” in the received text. Most scholars believe that the Mozi was probably not written by Master Mo himself, but by successive groups of disciples and their followers. No part of the text actually claims to be written by Mozi, although many parts purport to record his doctrines and conversations.

While there remain intense and complicated scholarly disputes over the exact dating and provenance of different parts of the Mohist corpus, it is probable that chapters 8-37 (the so-called “core chapters”) derive either from the teachings of Mozi himself or from the formative period of the Mohist community and contain doctrines that were nominally adhered to by its members throughout much of the community’s existence. The core chapters are replete with the formula “the doctrine of Our Teacher Master Mo says” (zimozi yan yue), prefixed to sayings presented as records of Master Mo’s teaching.  (However, since the text most likely was not written by Mozi himself, this entry will refer to the doctrine presented in the core chapters in terms of “the Mohists” and “Mohist doctrine” rather than “Mozi” and “Mozi’s doctrine.”)

The core chapters consist of ten triads of essays, with seven chapters marked “missing.” Each triad of chapters correlates with one of the ten Mohist theses.  Traditionally, these triads correspond to the “upper” (shang), “middle” (zhong) and “lower” (xia) versions of the thesis in question; in Western scholarship, they are usually referred to as versions “A,” “B,” and “C” of the corresponding thesis.  Intriguingly, the chapters that make up each triad often are very close to each other in wording without being exactly identical, thus raising questions about the precise relationship between them and with how the text assumed its present shape. One influential theory in recent times is Angus C. Graham’s proposal that the triads correspond to oral traditions of Mohist doctrine transmitted by the three Mohist sects mentioned in the Hanfeizi, a third century B.C.E. philosophical text associated with a student of the Confucian thinker Xunzi.

Much of the core chapters is written in a style that is not calculated to please.  As Burton Watson puts it, the style is “marked by a singular monotony of sentence pattern, and a lack of wit or grace that is atypical of Chinese literature in general.”  But Watson also concedes that the Mohists’ arguments “are almost always presented in an orderly and lucid, if not logically convincing fashion.” Whether or not the arguments of the core chapters are logically convincing can only be determined on a case-by-case basis, but it is at least possible that the artless style is the consequence of a deliberate choice to prioritize clarity of argumentation.

3. The Ten Core Theses of Mohism

The contents of the ten triads and thus the outlines of the ten core theses are briefly described below:

Chapters 8-10, “Elevating the Worthy” (shangxian), argue that the policy of elevating worthy and capable people to office in government whatever their social origin is a fundamental principle of good governance.  The proper implementation of such a policy requires that the rulers attract the talented to service by the conferring of honor, the reward of wealth and the delegation of responsibility (and thus power). On the other hand, the rulers’ practice of appointing kinsmen and favorites to office without regard to their abilities is condemned.

Chapters 11-13, “Exalting Unity” (shangtong), contain a state-of-nature argument on the basis of which it is concluded that a unified conception of what is morally right (yi) consistently enforced by a hierarchy of rulers and leaders is a necessary condition for social and political order. The thesis applies to the world community as a whole, conceived as a single moral-political hierarchy with the common people at the bottom, the feudal princes in the middle, and the emperor at the summit, above whom is Heaven itself.

Chapters 14-16, “Impartial Concern” (jian’ai), argue that the cause of the world’s troubles lies in people’s tendency to act out of a greater regard for their own welfare than that of others, and that of associates over that of strangers, with the consequence that they often have no qualms about benefiting themselves or their own associates at the expense of others. The conclusion is that people ought to be concerned for the welfare of others without making distinctions between self, associates and strangers.

Chapters 17-19, “Against Military Aggression” (feigong), condemn military aggression as both unprofitable (even for the aggressors) and immoral. Version C introduces a distinction between justified and unjustified warfare, claiming that the former was waged by the righteous ancient sage rulers to overthrow evil tyrants.

Chapters 20-21 (22 is listed as “missing”), “Frugality in Expenditures” (jieyong), argue that good governance requires thrift in the ruler’s expenditures. Useless luxuries are condemned. The chapters also argue for the clear priority of functionality over form in the making of various human artifacts (clothing, buildings, armor and weapons, boats and other vehicles).

Chapter 25 (23-24 are listed as “missing”), “Frugality in Funerals” (jiezang), has the same theme as “Frugality in Expenditures,” but applies it to the specific case of funeral rituals. The aristocratic practices of elaborate funerals and prolonged mourning are condemned as “not morally right” (buyi) because they are not only useless to solving the world’s problems, but add to the people’s burdens.  Here, the Mohists target practices beloved by their Confucian contemporaries, for whom the maintenance of harmonious moral order in society is best accomplished through strict fidelity to ritual codes.

Chapters 26-28, “Heaven’s Will” (Tianzhi), argue that the will of Heaven (Tian) — portrayed as if it is a personal deity and providential agent who rewards the good and punishes the wicked — is the criterion of what is morally right.  Here again, the Mohists contrast themselves with the Confucians, who regard Heaven as a moral but mysterious force that does not intervene directly in human affairs.

Chapter 31 (29-30 are listed as “missing”), “Elucidating the Spirits” (minggui), claims that a loss of belief in the existence, power and providential character of spirits — supernatural agents of Tian tasked with enforcing its sanctions — has led to widespread immorality and social and political chaos. The chapter consists of an exchange with certain skeptics, whom Mozi answers with arguments purporting to prove that providential spirits exist, but also that widespread belief in their existence brings great social and political benefit.

Chapter 32 (33-34 are listed as “missing”), “Against Music” (feiyue), condemns the musical displays of the aristocracy as immoralon the same basis according to which elaborate funerals and prolonged mourning are condemned in “Frugality in Funerals.”  Just as in that chapter, here again the Mohists attack practices that are particularly dear to their Confucian rivals, who believe that music, if properly performed according to ancient canons, can play a vital role in the regulation of moral order and the cultivation of virtue.

Chapters 35-37, “Against Fatalism” (feiming), argue against the doctrine of fatalism (the thesis that human wisdom and effort have no effect on the outcomes of human endeavor) as pernicious and harmful in that widespread belief in it will lead to indolence and chaos. The chapters also contain crucial discussions on the general conditions or criteria (traditionally called the “Three Tests of Doctrine”) that must be met by any doctrine if it is to be considered sound. (See Section 5: “Moral Epistemology” below.)

4. The Aims and Character of Mohist Doctrine

As in the case of many other philosophical conceptions in early China, Mohist doctrine is deeply rooted in the thinkers’ response to the social and political problems that are perceived to beset the world (tianxia, “all beneath Heaven”).  In particular, the Mohists are concerned to offer a practical solution to the chaos (luan) of the world so as to restore it to good order (zhi). A way to characterize the Mohists’ concern is to say that they (like many early Chinese philosophers) seek and to put the Way (dao, the right way to live and to conduct the community’s affairs) into practice rather than merely to discover and state the Truth about the universe. But there are also several more distinctively Mohist twists to this underlying concern.

First, the Mohists tend to equate the Way with a conception of what is morally right (yi or renyi ). For them, good order obtains when “right rules” (yizheng) rather than “might rules” (lizheng) in the world, and “right rules” when agents (both individual and groups) conduct themselves in a manner that is morally right. A way by which we might make sense of the Mohists’ project is to see it as concerned with promoting the public good, where the public good is defined in terms of social and political justice.

Second, Mohist doctrine is almost exclusively concerned with moral behavior rather than moral character  although, to be more precise, the main object of moral evaluation in Mohist doctrine is usually a way of conduct (for the individual) or a policy (for the state), rather than individual acts. In line with this focus on behavior, concepts that are naturally understood to be virtues or desirable qualities of agents (e.g., benevolence and filial piety) in Confucian texts often are discussed as if they are reducible to the moral rightness of conduct. In “Frugality in Funerals,” for instance, “the business of the filial son” is defined in terms of conduct that benefits the world, which is in turn, a criterion of moral rightness (see the next section).

Third, the Mohists see the morally right as conceptually distinct from the customary or traditional. An argument that appeals to the distinction can be found in “Frugality in Funerals.”  The Mohists point to the variety between burial customs among the tribal peoples on the periphery of the Chinese world and note that, although what the tribes practice is customary within their communities, these practices also are all understood by an elite Chinese audience to be barbaric and immoral.  The Mohists thus urge that, just because elaborate funerals and lengthy mourning are customary practices among the gentlemen of the central states, this fact alone will not secure their consistency with moral rightness.

Fourth, for the Mohists, the Way is the subject of explicit expression in the form of “doctrine” (yan).  Before proceeding with this point, it must be stressed that the term yan in the core chapters and other texts contemporary to the period ( the Mencius for instance) is often not best taken as “language” or “speech” in any generic sense. Rather, it often means “doctrine” or “maxim of conduct,” a verbal package meant to guide individual conduct and state policy. In other words, we can take yan in the core chapters as the verbal counterpart to a conception of the Way, a linguistic formula that identifies a Way of life and guiding the conduct of those who hold to it.

Not only are Mozi and the Mohists concerned to advance a Way, they are explicit in verbalizing their Way as doctrine, offering arguments for it and defending it against rival doctrines. In disputation, they often first formulate their rivals’ positions as opposing doctrines before attempting to refute them.  They also often identify rivals by the doctrines they supposedly “hold to” (for instance, they speak of “the doctrine of those who hold to [the thesis that] (“fate exists’” in “Against Fatalism”).  There is even a tendency to see the problematic conduct of people as largely springing from wrong doctrine, quite apart from the concern to offer arguments against various opponent positions. In addition, when the Mohists evaluate a practice or way of conduct, they sometimes speak in terms of evaluating the doctrinethat (putatively) corresponds to that practice (see, for instance, “Frugality in Funerals”).

The “Ten Theses” as a whole can thus be taken as presenting the sum of Mohist doctrine, which is itself the verbal or linguistic counterpart to their Way, their conception of what is morally right. The characteristically Mohist tendency to see the Way as open to linguistic formulation puts them in sharp contrast with “Daoist” traditions such as those associated with Laozi and Zhuangzi. In fact, as Robert Eno has argued, the Mohist focus on doctrine very likely forms the polemical background to the critique against language in texts such as the “Discourse on Making Things Equal” chapter in the Zhuangzi.

5. Moral Epistemology

One of the philosophically most interesting aspects of the Mohist concern with doctrine is their explicit discussion of criteria for evaluating doctrine in the “Against Fatalism” chapters.  The “Three Tests of Doctrine” are introduced as the “standards” or “gnomons” (yi) without which doctrinal disputes become futile. As version C puts it: “To expound doctrine without first establishing standards (yi) is like telling time using a sundial that has been placed on a spinning potter’s wheel.”  The consequence is that the dispute will be interminable.

Although each version of “Against Fatalism” lists three “Tests,” the lists differ and a total of four distinct “Tests” can be identified:

  1. Conformity to the Will of Heaven and the Spirits — this criterion is mentioned only in “Against Fatalism” B but forms the subject matter of the “Heaven’s Will” chapters. In those chapters, we can also find the claim that Heaven’s will is to Mozi like as “the compass is to a wheelwright or the setsquare is to a carpenter.”  Just as the wheelwright and carpenter use these tools to evaluate if some object is properly considered round or square, so Mozi is said to lay down Heaven’s will as a model (fa) and establish it as a standard (yi) by which conduct and doctrines can be evaluated.
  2. Conformity to the teaching and practice of the ancient sage kings — Varieties of this “Test” are reported in all versions of “Against Fatalism” and its application can be seen throughout the core chapters.
  3. Good consequences for the welfare of the world (especially the material wellbeing of the common people understood in terms of them having food, shelter and rest) —  Varieties of this “Test” are also reported in all versions of “Against Fatalism” and a lengthy elaboration can also be found in “Frugality in Funerals.”
  4. Confirmation by the testimony of the masses’ sense of sight and hearing — This “Test” is listed in “Against Fatalism” A and C, and there are only two certain applications” in the core chapters: in the “Elucidating Ghosts” chapter as part of the proof that providential ghosts exist, and in “Against Fatalism” B as part of the argument against the doctrine of fatalism.

There seems to be a widespread temptation to construe the different “Tests” in the following way: if a doctrine (yan) passes a “Test,” it is true. On this interpretation, the third “Test” might suggest a pragmatic conception of truth (or at least a pragmatic conception of the justification of truth claims).  But such a reading is at best underdetermined by the text. It is also unnecessary as long as we keep in mind that the sort of yan at stake in the Core Chapters is usually such doctrine as is meant to guide conduct.

With that background in mind, we can at least see the first three “Tests” as being meant precisely for evaluating such yan as are naturally evaluated in terms of whether they correctly guide human conduct, rather than whether they make a true factual claim.  This means that these “Tests” are best taken as criteria for assessing the soundness of normative rather than descriptive claims.  Now given that Mohist doctrine is meant to be the verbal correlate of their conception of the Way, which in turn can be taken as their conception of what is morally right, it follows that “sound doctrine” in the context of Mohist thought is ultimately doctrine that enjoins morally right conduct and in this specific sense correctly guides human conduct. This also implies that each of these “Tests” can be understood as a criterion for moral rightness.

As for the fourth “Test,” while it seems natural to take it as a criterion for evaluating factual, rather than normative claims, it should still be kept in mind that the Mohists appear to be primarily interested in the normative or policy implications of the (putatively factual) claims involved.

6. The Foundations of Mohist Morality

An intriguing question concerns how the different “Tests of Doctrine” (and thus the criterion of moral rightness to which each corresponds) relate to each other and whether any among them is the ultimate criterion to which the others can be reduced.

Of the three main “Tests,” the second one (conformity to the teaching and practice of the ancient sage kings), is most easily shown to be derivative. The core chapters define the sage (and the related “benevolent man,” which means roughly “ideal ruler” in context) as someone whose business it is to bring about order to the world (“Impartial Concern” A) or to promote the world’s welfare and eliminate things that harm it (“Impartial Concern” B, C, “Frugality in Funerals,” “Against Music”). In “Heaven’s Will,” on the other hand, the ancient sages are cited as examples of those who conducted themselves in accordance with Heaven’s will. In summary, the ancient sages are presented by the Mohists as widely acknowledged exemplars of past rulers who successfully conducted themselves according to the Way, and the very reason why they are acknowledged to be sage kings is precisely because they taught sound doctrine and practiced the Way.

Given the wider cultural setting and prevailing rhetorical conventions, the Mohists’ extensive appeal to the example and authority of the ancient sages is entirely understandable. Whatever their actual attitudes concerning the deeds and writings of the ancient sages as constituting a criterion of sound doctrine, the Mohists present themselves as addressing people who take the moral example of the ancient sages seriously. In this, their rhetorical practices do not differ from those of the Confucians. The two groups even share an overlapping taste in their choice of favored ancient sages: Yao, Shun, Yu, Tang, Wen, and Wu.

This leaves Heaven’s Will and good consequences for the welfare of the world as criteria of sound doctrine. There is a strong tradition of modern interpreters, such as Fung Yu-lan, Angus C. Graham, and Benjamin Schwartz, who see the latter as primary and take Mohist doctrine to exemplify a form of utilitarianism. Other scholars, such as Dennis M. Ahren, David E. Soles, and Augustine Tseu, see the former as suggesting a divine command theory of morality, although this interpretation has been criticized by Kristopher Duda among others.  This controversy is not well framed if it is stated purely in terms of the modern and somewhat alien categories of command theory and utilitarianism (or consequentialism). But this criticism aside, the genuine question remains as to how “Heaven’s Will” and “good consequences” relate to each other as criteria of the morally right.

In favor of the position that the criterion of good consequences is ultimate, it may be pointed out that even within the “Heaven’s Will” chapters, the Mohists argue on the basis that certain ways of conduct are in accordance with Heaven’s Will because they promote the public good. It is further claimed that Heaven desires that people do certain sorts of things or conduct themselves in a certain manner because such conduct will promote the public good, an outcome that Heaven desires. These considerations suggest that the criterion of Heaven’s Will might ultimately be reducible to that of good consequences.

In response, it is at least possible that while the question what ways of conduct are morally right? is always answerable in terms of whether or not a way of conduct promotes good consequences, the separate question of why these ways of conduct (picked out using the criterion of good consequences) are ultimately obligatory is answered with reference to Heaven’s Will.  If this is right, then there is a sense in which the two criteria neither reduce to each other nor potentially conflict, as they answer to different concerns altogether.

In any case, almost all of the Mohists’ proposals are explicitly defended on the basis that adopting them will promote the public good. We might thus modestly conclude that whatever the final status of Heaven’s Will as a criterion of the morally right, good consequences for the world is the operational criterion by which the Mohists evaluate various doctrines and the ways of conduct they verbalize.  This conclusion is lent further support by the fact that Heaven’s Will almost never features as an explicit part of the Mohists’ arguments for their specific proposals outside of the “Heaven’s Will” chapters.

7. Impartial Concern

Whether “Heaven’s will” or “good consequences for the world” forms the ultimate criterion of the morally right, the most salient first-order ethical injunction in Mohist doctrine remains that of “impartial concern” (jian’ai).  This is an injunction that is argued for both on the basis that it exemplifies Heaven’s Will (in the “Heaven’s Will” triad) and that it is conducive to the order and welfare of the world (in the “Impartial Concern” triad). In addition, the presentation of the doctrine (in all versions of “Impartial Concern”) strongly suggests that it is meant to be the panacea for all that is seriously wrong with the world and, to that extent, identifies the main substance of the Mohists’ Way.

As earlier indicated, “impartial concern” might be stated as the injunction that people ought to be concerned for the welfare of others without making distinctions between self and others, associates and strangers. Scrutiny of the core chapters, however, suggests both more and less stringent interpretations of what it entails by way of conduct. At one extreme, the injunction seems to require that people ought (to seek) to benefit strangers as much as they do associates, and others, as much as they do themselves. At the other extreme, it only requires that people refrain from harming strangers as much as they do associates, and others, as much as they do themselves. A third, intermediate possibility says that people ought (to seek) to help strangers with urgent needs as much as they do associates, and others, as much as they do themselves.

The least stringent interpretation is implied by passages (in all versions of “Impartial Concern”) where the injunction is argued for on the basis that adopting it will put a stop to the violent inter-personal and inter-group conflicts that beset the world, since on the Mohist account, it is people’s tendency to act on the basis of a greater regard for their own welfare over that of others, and that of their associates over that of strangers, that led them to have no qualms about benefiting themselves or their own associates at the expense of others and even to do so using violent means. The injunction of “impartial concern” is meant to be a reversal of this tendency. On the other hand, the more demanding interpretations are suggested especially by “Impartial Concern C,” in which it is said that if the doctrine is adopted b people, then not only will people not fight, the welfare of the weak and disadvantaged will be taken care of by those better endowed.

Whichever interpretation is taken, the basic injunction points toward an underlying notion of impartiality. We can take “impartial concern” as making explicit the notion that the common benefit of the world is, in some sense, impartially the benefit of everyone.

In “Impartial Concern” C, the Mohists put forward an interesting thought experiment ostensibly to show that even people who are committed to being more concerned for the welfare of self that for that of others, and associates than strangers have some reason to value impartial concern. They described a scenario in which the audience is asked to imagine that they are about to go on a long journey and need to put their family members in the care of another.  The Mohists claim that the obvious and rational choice would be to put one’s family members in the care of an impartialist rather than a partialist (that is, someone who is committed to “impartial concern” as opposed to someone who is committed to the opposite).

There are several problems with this argument. It seems to involve a false dilemma since the options of impartialist and partialist hardly exhaust the range of possible choices.  Even if the Mohists were correct to claim that the impartialist is the obvious and rational choice, all it shows is that partialists have good reason to prefer that other people conduct themselves according to the dictates of impartial concern, rather than that they have reason to so conduct themselves, as Chad Hansen and Bryan W. Van Norden have pointed out.  In defense of the Mohists, however, it might be the case that they are ultimately only concerned to establish that even partialists have reason to propagate the Mohists’ doctrine of impartial concern, a conclusion that could follow from their argument.

8. Moral Psychology and Human Nature

Mohist doctrine as it is presented in the core chapters does not contain explicit discussions of the psychological aspects of the ethical life.  “Human nature” (xing), a term that plays an important role in the thinking of the Confucian thinkers Mencius and Xunzi, as well as Yang Zhu, does not even appear in the core chapters. Nonetheless, various aspects of Mohist doctrine might well entail commitments to potentially controversial positions in moral psychology and the theory of human nature.

Consider the Mohists’ reply to the main objection raised against their doctrine of “impartial concern” — that the doctrine is overly demanding, given that people in general just do not have the motivational resources to act according to its dictates (“Impartial Concern” B and C). Citing historical accounts, the Mohists respond that the requirements of “impartial concern” are no harder than the sorts of things that rulers in the past had been able to demand and get from their subjects, such as reducing one’s diet, wearing coarse clothing, and charging into flames at the ruler’s command. It was because the rulers delighted in such actions and offered suitable incentives to encourage them that they were done, even on a regular basis. The Mohists conclude that people in general can be made to practice “impartial concern” as long as rulers delight in it and offer the right incentives to encourage it.

On the basis of passages such as this one, David S. Nivison and Bryan W. Van Norden argue that either the Mohists held the view that human nature is infinitely malleable or they thought that there is no human nature. Such a reading focuses on the extravagant claim made in the text that as long as the rulers delight in “impartial concern” and offer the right incentives, human beings (especially the structure of their motivations) can be radically changed “within a single generation.”  While this interpretation certainly is compatible with the tenor of the text, it is not necessarily the only possible interpretation.  After all, all that is needed for the Mohists to make their reply is the thought that people — given their nature — can be made to practice “impartial concern” through offering them the right leadership and incentives. They hardly need the stronger (and less plausible) claim that people can be remolded in any fashion whatsoever given the right leadership and incentives. Furthermore, at least some of the historical examples cited by the Mohists suggest that they are thinking more of the people responding to incentives in the environment (e.g., the comfort-loving courtier wearing coarse clothing or going on a diet so as to please the ruler) rather than more radical changes to the structure of their motivations (as might be suggested by the story of the soldiers who have been conditioned to charge into flames on the ruler’s command).

A weaker and to that extent more defensible interpretation is that the Mohists do not consider the Way in a Mencian sense — as “the realization of certain inclinations that human beings already share,” as Shun Kwong-loi puts it. To be more precise, the Mohists do not appear to have considered the inclinations and predispositions that people already have as pointing to the contents of the Way. But they need not deny that these inclinations might, under suitable conditions (e.g., under a suitable regime of incentives), furnish the motivational resources for an agent to conduct himself well (the “Mohist” Yi Zhi in Mencius 3A5 seems to have taken a version of such a position) — as long as it is recalled that what counts as “conducting oneself well” is given by something else other than those inclinations or their development: sound doctrine established by rational arguments. Seen this way, the Mohists would be in direct opposition to Mencius, insofar as Mencius regards those “inclinations that human beings already share” (explicitly construed within the context of an account of human nature) as providing both the contents of morality and the motivational resources for moral cultivation.

9. Government

The Mohists’ political ideal is most prominently stated in the “Elevating the Worthy” and “Exalting Unity” chapters, which include the only theses that are explicitly said to identify “fundamentals of governance” (wei zheng zhi ben).

The “Exalting Unity” triad of chapters contains a “state of nature” argument that bears comparison both with ideas found in the Confucian philosopher Xunzi and perhaps more remotely, Thomas Hobbes’ Leviathan and the social contract tradition of early modern European thought. As with the latter, it is at least arguable that even though the account is couched as if making historical claims about how human beings were like in a distant past “before there were any laws and criminal punishment” (version A) or “before there were rulers or leaders” (versions B and C), its logic is better appreciated if taken as a thought experiment of what things would be like were certain hypothetical conditions to hold.

The most important implications of such a hypothesis, for the Mohists, is that people will hold to different and conflicting opinions about what is morally right (yi), on the basis of which they will condemn each other. The end result is a state of violent conflict and chaos. This chaos is fully resolved only with the installment of a hierarchy of rulers and leaders consistently enforcing a unified conception of what is morally right through surveillance and incentives. The conclusion of the argument is that such a solution is a necessary condition for social and political order.

The “Elevating the Worthy” triad of chapters, on the other hand, proposes that good governance requires that the state cultivate worthy and capable people and employ them as officials, whatever their social origin. This doctrine opposes a form of meritocracy to the nepotism and cronyism prevalent among the rulers. It also insists that if the doctrine is to be successfully carried though, the rulers need to confer high rank, generous stipend and real power upon the worthy. Interestingly, in arguing for the doctrine, version B both traces it to the practices of the ancient sage kings and also says that the ancients were modeling their regime upon Heaven, thus suggesting that an application of the criterion of “Heaven’s will” in involved. Nonetheless, the main thrust of all three versions remains that meritocracy will bring great benefits to the state.

10. Frugality

Three of the ten core Mohist theses are related to the virtue of frugality: “Frugality in Expenditures,” “Frugality in Funerals,” and “Against Music.”  For the most part, the arguments in these chapters are paradigmatic cases of “good consequences to the welfare of the world” as criterion of the morally right. (As mentioned earlier, a lengthy elaboration of the criterion can be found in the opening parts of “Frugality in Funerals.”) In “Frugality in Expenditures,” the criterion is applied positively through showing that the preferred policy of government thrift brings about beneficial consequences. In the other two triads, the criterion is applied negatively through detailing the harmful consequences that attend elaborate funerals and prolonged mourning, and extravagant music displays of the aristocracy.

One interesting feature of the arguments in these chapters is the weight given to the welfare of the common people in the Mohists’ calculation of the benefit and harm that result from the policy under assessment. This aspect of Mohist doctrine is especially prominent in “Against Music,” where a large part of what counts as the “good consequences” of a policy is articulated in terms of the common people receiving enough to eat, being protected from the elements and having sufficient rest. It thus seems that, despite their commitment to “impartial concern,” the Mohists have a partisan concern for the interests of the lower social classes. The more charitable interpretation, however, is that they are accommodating concerns in the region of distributive justice. That is, the common benefit of the world is in some sense impartially and equally the benefit of everyone; but since the Mohists — like most thinkers in ancient China — do not envision a radical elimination of the vast social, economic and political inequalities that are simply a fact of life in Warring States China, the distributive concerns are met by giving extra weight to the interests of the disadvantaged. This reading is also consonant with their claim that were “impartial concern” to be widely practice, the welfare of the weak and disadvantaged will be taken care of by those better endowed (in “Impartial Concern C”).

A more serious charge against the Mohists, however, is that their doctrine on frugality commits them to an overly restrictive and hence highly implausible conception of the good. The Confucian thinker Xunzi defends elaborate Confucian funeral rituals and musical displays against Mohist attacks by claiming that they given form to, and meet, the emotional needs of people. Conversely, Mohist doctrine simply fails to take into account aspects of the human good not reducible to material livelihood. Insofar as Mohist doctrine does imply such a reduced conception of the human good, this is a cogent objection.

But insofar as the main weight of the Mohist arguments lies in the thought that it is unjust of the aristocrats to provide for their own emotional needs (through elaborate funerals and prolonged mourning) or refined enjoyment (though elaborate musical displays) through an imposition upon the labor of the common people, the objection is not decisive. Interestingly enough, that this what the Mohists have in mind is indicated in “Against Music.” The text apologizes for attacking the aristocracy’s musical displays by conceding that while music and other refinements are “delightful,” they bring no benefit to the common people and, in fact, harm their livelihood.

11. Just War

The Mohists reserved some of their most trenchant condemnations against military aggression, asserting that offensive war is harmful to the welfare of the world and contrary to Heaven’s will. One argument (two variations of which can be found in “Against Military Aggression” A and “Heaven’s Will” C) proceeds by claiming that there is an analogy between the actions of a military aggressor and those of people who steal or rob others or who murder. And since (as even the audience agrees) stealing, robbing and murdering are morally wrong, and since actions that cause greater harm to others are, to that extent, greater wrongs, military aggression is a great wrong indeed.

Another series of arguments (in “Against Military Aggression” B and C) proceeds by pointing out in some detail the economic and human cost of military aggression even to the aggressors. To the reply that some of the Warring States appear to have greatly profited from their aggressive ways, the Mohists point out that they are the rare exceptions and seeking profit by such means is tantamount to calling a medication effective that cured four or five out of myriads.

Perhaps as befits the difference in addressee, the second set of arguments appears more pragmatic as it appeals to the “war-loving” rulers’ sense of self-interest. The earlier argument, on the other hand, appears to aim showing the gentlemen of the world that they ought to condemn military aggression if they are to be consistent with their own normative convictions — if they know that stealing, robbing and murdering is wrong and blameworthy, they ought also to consider military aggression wrong and blameworthy.

The objection is raised in “Against Military Aggression” C that the ancient sage kings waged war, and since they are supposed to be models of moral rectitude, it follows that war cannot be unqualifiedly wrong. In response, the Mohists introduce a distinction between justified and unjustified warfare, claiming that the former was waged by the righteous ancient sage rulers to overthrow evil tyrants. The precise criterion of the distinction between the two forms of warfare, however, is not explicitly spelled out in that chapter. Instead, justified warfare is associated with supernatural signs indicating that Heaven has given the ruler a mandate to wage war so as to visit condign punishment upon some wicked tyrant. This is surprising since elsewhere (“Impartial Concern” C), the Mohists present the sage Yu’s military campaigns to pacify the unruly Miao tribes as an example of his “impartial concern” for the welfare of the people of the world. This suggests that there are ample resources within Mohist doctrine to spell out the distinction in less exotic terms. But since they did connect the distinction between justified and unjustified warfare to Heaven and the spirits, a discussion of the Mohists’ religious views is in order.

12. Heaven and Spirits

Within the core chapters, the Mohists consistently portray Heaven as if it possesses personal characteristics and exists separately from human beings, though intervening in their affairs. In particular, they present Heaven if it is an entity having will and desire, and concerned about the welfare of the people of the world, even a providential agent that rewards the just and punishes the wicked through its control of natural phenomena or by means of its superhuman intermediaries, the spirits (guishen). Finally, Heaven and the spirits are also portrayed as the objects of reverence, sacrificial offerings and supplication (“Heaven’s Will” B).

Apart from the earlier mentioned role of Heaven’s will in providing a criterion for what is morally right, the Mohists also blame people’s loss of belief in the existence, power and providential character of spirits for the perceived immorality and chaos of their time. This motivates them to argue that such spirits do exist in “Elucidating the Spirits.”  But the Mohists’ considered position with regards to the existence of providential spirits as opposed to the usefulness of a widespread belief in their existence is an ambiguous one at best. While the first parts of “Elucidating the Spirits” seem aimed at establishing that the spirits exist (by appealing to the testimony of people sense of sight and hearing), the bulk of the arguments in the chapter are better taken as attempts to show that it is socially and politically beneficial that people in general believe in the existence of providential spirits and that the government organize its affairs on the basis that they exist. As the text puts it:

If the fact that ghosts and spirits reward the worthy and punish the evil can be made a cornerstone of policy in the state and impressed upon the common people, it will provide a means to bring order to the state and benefit to the people.

In this regard, an argument that appears towards the end of the chapter is most telling. To the objection that the doctrine on spirits entails the need to sacrifice to them, which in turn interferes with one’s duties towards one’s living parents, the Mohists reply that if the spirits do exist, then the sacrifices cannot be considered a waste of resources; but if they do not exist, then the community can still come together to share in the communion of the sacrificial wine and millet and the sacrifice will still serve a socially useful function. The argument implies that what the Mohists are ultimately concerned to argue for is neutral with respect to whether or not providential spirits actually exist, as the author and Benjamin Wong have pointed out.

13. References and Further Reading

  • Ahern, Dennis M. “Is Mo Tzu a Utilitarian?” Journal of Chinese Philosophy 3 (1976): 185-193.
  • Duda, Kristopher. “Reconsidering Mo Tzu on the Foundations of Morality.” Asian Philosophy 11/1 (2001): 23-31.
  • Fung Yu-lan. A History of Chinese Philosophy. 2 vols. Trans. Derk Bodde. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1952-53.
  • Graham, Angus C. Divisions in Early Mohism Reflected in the Core Chapters of Mo-tzu. Singapore: Institute of East Asian Philosophies, 1985.
  • Graham, Angus C. Later Mohist Logic, Ethics, and Science. Hong Kong: Chinese University Press / London: School of Oriental and African Studies, 1978; reprinted 2003.
  • Hansen, Chad. A Daoist Theory of Chinese Thought: A Philosophical Interpretation. New York: Oxford University Press, 1992.
  • Hsiao Kung-chuan. A History of Chinese Political Thought, Vol. 1: From the Beginnings to the Sixth Century A. D. Trans. F. W. Mote. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1979.
  • Hu Shih. The Development of the Logical Method in Ancient China. 2nd edition. New York: Paragon Book Reprint Corp., 1963.
  • Ivanhoe, Philip J. “Mohist Philosophy.”  In Routledge Encyclopedia of Philosophy, ed.  Edward Craig (London and New York: Routledge, 1998), 6:451-458.
  • Knoblock, John, trans.  Xunzi: A Translation and Study of the Complete Works. 3 vols. Stanford: Stanford University Press, 1988-94.
  • Lai, Whalen. “The Public Good that does the Public Good: A New Reading of Mohism.” Asian Philosophy 3/2 (1993): 125-141.
  • Lowe, Scott. Mo Tzu’s Religious Blueprint for a Chinese Utopia: The Will and the Way. Ontario: Edwin Mellen Press, 1992.
  • Loy, Hui-chieh. “On a Gedankenexperiment in the Mozi Core Chapters.” Oriens Extremus 45 (2005): 141-158.
  • Maeder, Erik W. “Some Observations on the Composition of the €˜Core Chapters’ of the Mozi.Early China 17 (1992): 27-82.
  • Mei, Yi-pao. Mo-tse, the Neglected Rival of Confucius. London: Arthur Probsthain, 1934.
  • Mei, Yi-pao. The Ethical and Political Works of Motse. London: Arthur Probsthain, 1929.
  • Nivison, David S. The Ways of Confucianism: Investigations in Chinese Philosophy. Ed. Bryan W. Van Norden. La Salle, IL: Open Court, 1996.
  • Pines, Yuri. Foundations of Confucian Thought: Intellectual life in the Chunqiu Period, 722-453 B.C.E. Honolulu: University of Hawaii Press, 2002.
  • Schwartz, Benjamin. The World of Thought in Ancient China. Cambridge, MA: Belknap Press, 1985.
  • Shaughnessy, Edward L., and Michael Loewe, eds. The Cambridge History of Ancient China: From the Beginnings of Civilization to 221 b.c. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1998.
  • Shun, Kwong-loi. Mencius and Early Chinese Thought. Stanford: Stanford University Press, 1997.
  • Soles, David E. “Mo Tzu and the foundations of Morality.” Journal of Chinese Philosophy 26/1 (1999): 37-48.
  • Taylor, Rodney L. “Religion and utilitarianism: Mo Tzu on spirits and funerals.” Philosophy East and West 29/3 (July 1979): 337-346.
  • Tseu, Augustine. The Moral Philosophy of Mozi. Taipei: China Printing Limited, 1965.
  • Van Norden, Bryan W. “A Response to the Mohist Arguments in €˜Impartial Caring.’”  In The Moral Circle and the Self: Chinese and Western Approaches, eds. Kim-chong Chong, Sor-Hoon Tan and C. L. Ten (Chicago: Open Court, 2003), 41-58.
  • Vorenkamp, Dirck. “Another Look at Utilitarianism in Mo Tzu’s Thought.” Journal of Chinese Philosophy 19 (1992): 423-443.
  • Watson, Burton, trans. Mo Tzu: Basic Writings. Columbia University Press, 1963.
  • Wong, Benjamin, and Hui-chieh Loy. “War and Ghosts in Mozi’s Political Philosophy.” Philosophy East and West 54/3 (2004): 343­-363.
  • Wong, David B. “Mohism: The Founder, Mozi (Mo Tzu).”  In Encyclopedia of Chinese Philosophy, ed. Antonio S. Cua (London and New York: Routledge, 2003), 453-461.
  • Wong, David B.  ”Universalism versus Love with Distinctions: An Ancient Debate Revived.” Journal of Chinese Philosophy 16/3-4 (September-December 1989): 251-272.
  • Yates, Robin D.S. “The Mohists on Warfare: Technology, Technique, and Justification.” Journal of the AmericanAcademy of Religion 47 (1979): 549-603.

Author Information

Hui-chieh Loy
Email: philoyhc@nus.edu.sg
National University of Singapore
Singapore




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