Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Mind and Multiple Realizability

The claim that mental types are multiply realizable has played an important role in supporting antireductionism in philosophy of mind. The multiple-realizability thesis implies that mental types and physical types are correlated one-many not one-one. A mental state such as pain might be correlated with one type of physical state in a human and another type of physical state in, say, a Martian or pain-capable robot. This has often been taken to imply that mental types are not identical to physical types since their identity would require one type of mental state to be correlated with only one type of physical state. The principal debate about multiple realizability in philosophy of mind concerns its compatibility or incompatibility with reductionism. On the assumption that reduction requires mental-physical type identities, the apparent multiple realizability of mental types, such as a pain being both a type of human brain state and a type of robot state, has been understood to support antireductionism. More recent work has challenged this understanding.

The antireductionist argument depends on the following premises:

  1. Mental types are multiply realizable;
  2. If mental types are multiply realizable, then they are not identical to physical types;
  3. If mental types are not identical to physical types, then psychological discourse (vernacular or scientific) is not reducible to physical theory.

Among these claims, the most controversial has been Premise 1, the multiple-realizability thesis. Antireductionists have supported it both a priori by appeal to conceivability-possibility principles, and a posteriori by appeal to findings in biology, neuroscience, and artificial intelligence research. Reductionists have criticized these arguments, and they have also directly challenged the antireductionist premises.

Reductionist challenges to Premises 1 and 2 claim that antireductionists dubiously assume that psychophysical relations must be reckoned relative to our current mental and physical typologies. Contrary to this assumption, some reductionists argue that future scientific investigation will result in the formulation of new mental and/or physical typologies which fail to support the antireductionist premises. Typology-based arguments of this sort have been among the most important and most widely discussed reductionist responses to the multiple-realizability argument. Responses that target Premise 3 have been less popular. They argue either that psychophysical reduction can be carried out without identity statements linking mental and physical types, or else that ontological issues concerning the identity or nonidentity of mental and physical types are completely orthogonal to the issue of reduction.

The multiple-realizability thesis has also played an important role in recent discussions about nonreductive physicalism. The antireductionist argument has often been taken to recommend some type of nonreductive physicalism. Recently, however, Jaegwon Kim has effectively stood the argument on its head. He argues that physicalists who endorse multiple realizability are committed either to denying that mental types are genuine properties, ones that make a causal difference to their bearers, or else they are committed to endorsing some type of reductionism which identifies mental types with physical types.

Table of Contents

  1. Multiple Realizability and the Antireductionist Argument
    1. Multiple Realizability and Multiple Correlatability
    2. Identity Theory, Functionalism and the Realization Relation
    3. Defining Multiple Realizability
    4. Multiple Realizability and Mental-Physical Type Identities
    5. Type Identities and Psychophysical Reductionism
  2. Arguments for the Multiple-Realizability Thesis
    1. Conceptual Arguments for the MRT
    2. Empirical Arguments for the MRT
  3. Responses to the Antireductionist Argument
    1. Typology-Based Responses
      1. New Mental Typologies: The Local Reduction Move
      2. New Physical Typologies I
      3. New Physical Typologies II: The Disjunctive Move
        1. Law-Based Criticisms
        2. Metaphysical Criticisms
      4. Coordinate Typologies
    2. Reduction-Based Responses
  4. Multiple Realizability and Nonreductive Physicalism
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Multiple Realizability and the Antireductionist Argument

Multiple-realizability theses claim that it is possible for the tokens of a certain type to be realized by tokens of two or more distinct types. Multiple-realizability theses can be applied to a broad range of types: chemical, biological, social, mathematical. But what has been of primary interest in philosophy of mind is the purported multiple realizability of mental types. In what follows, the multiple-realizability thesis (MRT) will be understood as the claim that specifically mental types are multiply realizable.

Roughly, a type φ is multiply realizable if and only if it is possible for φ-tokens to be realized by tokens of two or more distinct types. If, for instance, it is possible for tokens of the mental type pain to be realized by tokens of the types c-fiber firing and q-fiber firing, where c-fiber firingq-fiber firing, then pain is a multiply-realizable mental type. Debate about the MRT in philosophy of mind has principally concerned its compatibility or incompatibility with reductionism. The MRT has been widely understood to have antireductionist implications. It seems to imply that mental types are not identical to physical types. If psychophysical reduction requires mental-physical type identities, then the MRT seems to imply that psychophysical reductionism is false.

The antireductionist argument is roughly as follows: Suppose a certain type of mental state – pain, say – is multiply realizable. We discover, for instance, that Alexander’s pains are intimately correlated in a way we label ‘realization’ with a certain type of physical occurrence, the firing of his c-fibers. We also discover, however, that Madeleine’s pains are realized not by c-fiber firing but by a distinct type of physical occurrence, q-fiber firing. Since c-fiber firing does not in any way involve q-fiber firing, and q-fiber firing does not in any way involve c-fiber firing, we conclude that pain can occur without c-fiber firing, and that it can also occur without q-fiber firing. We conclude, in other words, that neither c-fiber firing nor q-fiber firing is by itself necessary for the occurrence of pain. In that case, however, it seems that pain cannot be identical to either type of physical occurrence since identity implies necessary coextension. If having a mass of 1 kilogram is identical to having a mass of 2.2 pounds, then necessarily something has a mass of 1 kilogram if and only if it has a mass of 2.2 pounds. Likewise, if pain is identical to c-fiber firing, then necessarily anything that has pain will also have c-fiber firing; and if pain is identical to q-fiber firing, then necessarily anything that has pain will also have q-fiber firing. Madeleine, however, experiences pain without c-fiber firing, and Alexander experiences pain without q-fiber firing. Since pain is not correlated with a single physical type, it seems that pain cannot be identical to a physical type. Moreover, because the identity of type M and type P implies that necessarily every M-token is a P-token, we need not actually discover the correlation of pain with diverse physical types; the bare possibility of such correlations is sufficient for the argument to succeed. If the case of Alexander and Madeleine is even possible, it would follow that pain is not a physical type; and, says the argument, it seems intuitively certain or at least overwhelmingly probable that this type of situation is possible not only for pain, but for all mental types. Since psychophysical reductionism requires that mental types be identical to physical types, psychophysical reductionism must be false.

The foregoing line of reasoning has been extremely influential since 1970. It is largely responsible for what has been and continues to be a widespread, decades-long consensus that psychophysical reductionism must be false. The argument trades on the following premises:

  1. Mental types are multiply realizable;
  2. If mental types are multiply realizable, then they are not identical to physical types;
  3. If mental types are not identical to physical types, then psychological discourse (vernacular or scientific) is not reducible to physical theory.

These premises will be considered in order.

a. Multiple Realizability and Multiple Correlatability

The term ‘multiple realizability’ is often used as a label for any claim to the effect that mental and physical types are correlated one-many. Properly speaking, however, multiple realizability is tied to the notion of realization. Since the notion of realization is tied to a particular account of mental properties and psychological language it will be helpful to distinguish the multiple-realizability thesis from a more general multiple-correlatability thesis (MCT), a claim to the effect that φ-tokens might be correlated with tokens of more than one type.

The form of a bare multiple-correlatability argument against psychophysical identification is something like the following:

1. If mental type M = physical type P, then necessarily every M-token is a P-token and vice versa;

2. It is not necessarily the case that every M-token is a P-token and vice versa;

Therefore, mental type M ≠ physical type P.

Given reasonable assumptions the first premise follows from Leibniz’s law: type-identity implies necessary token coextension. Premise 2 states the MCT: M-tokens and P-tokens needn’t be correlated one-one. An MCT does not specify whether M- and P-tokens are systematically related to each other or in what way. It is thus weaker than the MRT which claims specifically that tokens of one type realize tokens of the other type.

One important observation here is that the MRT is not the only way of endorsing an MCT. Bealer (1994), for instance, defends an MCT in a way that does not appeal to realization at all. Moreover, even Putnam, who is often credited with having been the first to advance a multiple-realizability argument against psychophysical identity theory, appealed to a bare MCT as opposed to an MRT:

Consider what the brain-state theorist has to do to make good his claims. He has to specify a physical-chemical state such that any organism… is in pain if and only if (a) it possesses a brain of a suitable physical-chemical structure; and (b) its brain is in that physical-chemical state. This means that the physical-chemical state in question must be a possible state of a mammalian brain, a reptilian brain, a mollusc’s brain… etc. At the same time, it must not be a possible… state of the brain of any physical possible creature that cannot feel pain… [I]t is not altogether impossible that such a state will be found… [I]t is at least possible that parallel evolution, all over the universe, might always lead to one and the same physical “correlate” of pain. But this is certainly an ambitious hypothesis (Putnam 1967a: 436).

Putnam claims it is highly unlikely that pain is correlated with exactly one physico-chemical state. There is no mention of realization.

The notion of realization was introduced in connection with functionalism, the theory Putnam advanced as an alternative to the identity theory. According to functionalism mental types are not identical to physical types; they are instead realized by physical types. Putnam argued that functionalism was more plausible than the identity theory precisely because it was compatible with mental types being correlated one-many with physical types. Before discussing this point, however, it will be helpful to say a word about functionalism since the term ‘functionalism’ has been used to refer to theories of at least two different types: a type originally inspired by a computational model of psychological discourse and developed in a series of papers by Putnam (1960, 1964, 1967a, 1967b); and a type of identity theory endorsed by Lewis (1966, 1970, 1972, 1980) and independently by Armstrong (1968, 1970). Talk of realization has been used in connection with both.

b. Identity Theory, Functionalism and the Realization Relation

Early identity theorists claimed that psychological discourse was like theoretical discourse in the natural sciences. Mental states, they said, were entities postulated by a theory to explain the behavior of persons in something analogous to the way atoms, forces, and the like were entities postulated by a theory to explain motion and change generally (Sellars 1956: 181-87; 1962: 33-34; Putnam 1963: 330-331, 363; Feigl 1958: 440ff.; Fodor 1968a: 93; Churchland 1989: 2-6). The entities postulated by psychological discourse – beliefs, desires, pains, hopes, fears – were to be identified on the basis of empirical evidence with entities postulated by the natural sciences, most likely entities postulated by neuroscience. Originally, identity theorists supposed that theoretical identifications of this sort were a matter of choice. Empirical data would support correlations between mental and physical types such as ‘Whenever there is pain, there is c-fiber firing’, and scientists would then choose to identify the correlated types on grounds of parsimony. Identifying pain with c-fiber firing would yield a more elegant theory than merely correlating the two, and it would avoid the potentially embarrassing task of having to explain why pain and c-fiber firing would be correlated one-one if they were in fact distinct (Smart 1962). Lewis (1966) criticized this model of theoretical identification, and advanced an alternative which was also endorsed independently by Armstrong (1968, 1970).

According to the Lewis-Armstrong alternative, theoretical identifications are not chosen on grounds of parsimony, but are actually implied by the logic of scientific investigation. In our ordinary, pre-scientific dealings we often introduce terms to refer to things which we identify on the basis of their typical environmental causes and typical behavioral effects. We introduce the term ‘pain’, for instance, to refer to the type of occurrence, whatever it happens to be, that is typically caused by pinpricks, burns, and abrasions, and that typically causes winces, groans, screams, and similar behavior. That type of occurrence then becomes a target for further scientific investigation which aims to discover what it is in fact. Pain is thus identified by definition with the type of occurrence that has such-and-such typical causes and effects, and that type of occurrence is then identified by scientific investigation with c-fiber firing. Pain is thus identified with c-fiber firing by the transitivity of identity. Call this sort of view the Lewis-Armstrong identity theory.

By contrast with the Lewis-Armstrong identity theory, functionalism claims that psychological states are postulates of abstract descriptions which deploy categories analogous to those used in computer science or information-theoretic models of cognitive functioning. Functionalists agree with identity theorists that psychological discourse constitutes a theory, but they disagree about what type of theory it is. Psychological discourse is not like a natural scientific theory, functionalists claim, but like an abstract one. The mental states it postulates are analogous to, say, the angles and lines postulated by Euclidean geometry. We arrive at Euclidean principles by abstraction, a process in which we focus on a narrow range of properties and then construct “idealized” descriptions of them. We focus, for instance, on the spatial properties of the objects around us. We ignore what they are made of, what colors they have, how much they weigh, and the like, and focus simply on their dimensions. We then idealize our descriptions of them: slightly crooked lines, for instance, we describe as straight; deviant curves we describe as normal, and so on. According to functionalists, something analogous is true of psychological discourse. It provides abstract descriptions of real-world systems, descriptions which ignore the physical details of those systems (the sorts of details described by the natural sciences), and focus simply on a narrow profile of their features. Originally Putnam suggested that those features were analogous to the features postulated by Turing machines.

A Turing machine is an abstract description which postulates a set of states related to each other and to various inputs and outputs in certain determinate ways described by a machine table. A certain machine table might postulate states, S1,…,Sn, inputs, I1,…, Im, and outputs O1,…,Op, for instance, which are related in ways expressed by a set of statements or instructions such as the following:

If the system is in state S13 and receives input I7, then the system will produce output O32, and enter state S3.

According to Putnam’s original proposal, which has come to be called machine functionalism, psychological descriptions are abstract descriptions of this sort. They postulate relations among sensory inputs, motor outputs, and internal mental states. The only significant difference between Turing machine descriptions and psychological descriptions, Putnam (1967a) suggested, was that psychological inputs, outputs, and internal states were related to each other probabilistically not deterministically. If, for instance, Eleanor believes there are exactly eight planets in our solar system, and she receives the auditory input, “Do you believe there are exactly eight planets in our solar system,” then she will produce the verbal output, “Yes,” not with a deterministic probability of 1, but with a probability between 1 and 0.

Functionalists need not endorse a Turing machine model of psychological discourse; they could instead understand psychological discourse by appeal to models in, say, cognitive psychology; but in general, they make two claims. First, psychological discourse is abstract discourse which postulates an inventory of objects, properties, states or the like which are related to each other in ways expressed by the theory’s principles. Second, the behavior of certain concrete systems maps onto the objects, properties, or states that psychological discourse postulates. The notion of realization concerns this second claim.

Let T be a theory describing various relations among its postulates, S1,…,Sn.The relations among the concrete states of a certain concrete system might be in some way isomorphic to the relations among S1,…,Sn. If T says that state S1 results in state S2 with a probability of .73 given state S15, it might turn out that, for instance, Alexander’s brain state B5 results in brain state B67 with a probability of .73 given neural stimulus B4. It might turn out, in other words, that states B5, B67, and B4 in Alexander’s brain provide a model of the relations among S1, S2, and S15 in T. If this were true for all of Alexander’s brain states, one might say that T described a certain type of functional organization, an organization which was realized by Alexander’s brain, and one might call Alexander’s brain a realization of T. The states of Alexander’s brain are related to each other in ways that are isomorphic with the ways in which S1,…,Sn, are related according to T. In fact, concrete systems in general might be said to realize the states postulated by abstract descriptions. The wooden table realizes a Euclidean rectangle; the movements of electrons through the silicon circuitry of a pocket calculator realize a certain algorithm; the movements of ions through the neural circuitry of Alexander’s brain realize a belief that 2 + 2 = 4, and so forth.

Realization, then, is a relation between certain types of abstract descriptions, on the one hand, and concrete systems whose states are in a relevant sense isomorphic with those postulated by abstract descriptions, on the other. Philosophers of mind have offered several different accounts of this relation. Putnam (1970: 313-315) suggested a type of account which has proved very influential. Realization, he said, can be understood as a relation between higher-order and lower-order types (he used the term ‘properties’) or tokens of such types. Higher-order types are ones whose definitions quantify over other types. Second-order types, for instance, are types whose definitions quantify over first-order types, and first-order types are types whose definitions quantify over no types. Effectively what Putnam suggested is that having mental states amounted to having some set of (first-order) internal states related to each other in ways that collectively satisfied a certain functional description. Being in pain, for instance, might be defined as being in some concrete first-order state S1 which results in a concrete first-order state S2 with a probability of .73 given a concrete state S15. In other words, the various Si postulated by theory T can be understood as variables ranging over concrete first-order state types such as brain state types. To say, then, that Alexander’s brain is currently realizing a state of pain is just to say that the triple < B5, B67, B4 > of concrete first-order states of his brain satisfies the definition of being in pain, a definition which quantifies over concrete first-order states of some sort.

The concept of realization is understood slightly differently in connection with the Lewis-Armstrong identity theory. That difference reflects the more general difference between the identity theory and functionalism. Functionalism takes mental states to be states postulated by an abstract description, whereas the Lewis-Armstrong identity theory takes mental states to be concrete physical states which have been described in terms of an abstract vocabulary. To help illustrate this difference consider a very rough analogy with a Platonic versus Aristotelian understanding of geometrical objects. The Platonist claims that ‘rectangle’ refers to an abstract object postulated and/or described by Euclidean geometry. The Aristotelian, by contrast, claims that ‘rectangle’ is a way of referring to various concrete objects in terms of their dimensions. There is a roughly analogous sense in which the functionalist claims that ‘pain’ expresses a type of abstract state whereas the Lewis-Armstrong identity theorist claims that ‘pain’ expresses a concrete type of physical state such as c-fiber firing. According to the identity theorist ‘pain’ refers to a physical state by appeal to a narrow profile of that state’s properties such as its typical causes and effects. According to the Lewis-Armstrong identity theory, then, what a theory such as T provides is not an inventory of abstract states, but an apparatus for referring to certain physical ones. On the Lewis-Armstrong theory those physical states, the ones expressed by the predicates and terms of T, provide a realization of T.

Because the multiple-realizability argument for antireductionism principally concerns the functionalist notion of realization, the term 'realize' and its cognates should be taken to express that notion in what follows.

c. Defining Multiple Realizability

Let us consider again the rough definition of multiple realizability stated earlier: a type φ is multiply realizable if and only if it is possible for φ-tokens to be realized by tokens of two or more distinct types. To make this more precise it will be helpful to draw some distinctions.

First, Shoemaker (1981) distinguishes what he calls a state’s core realizer from what he calls its total realizer. Consider again the theory T and Alexander’s brain. If B5 is the type of brain state which corresponds to S1 in T, then B5-tokens are core realizers of S1-tokens in Alexander’s brain. The total realizer of an S1-token, on the other hand, includes tokens of B5 together with tokens of the other types of states in Alexander’s brain whose relations to one another are collectively isomorphic with the relations among S1,…,Sn, expressed in T. The MRT has typically been understood to be a claim about core realizers.

Second, it is helpful to clarify ambiguities in the scope of the modal operator. The foregoing definition of multiple realizability is unclear, for instance, about whether or not -tokens must be realized by tokens of more than one type in the same world, or whether it is sufficient that -tokens be realized by tokens of more than one type in different worlds. Similarly, it is unclear about which worlds are relevant: nomologically possible worlds? metaphysically possible worlds? The following definition clears up these ambiguities:

[Def] A type M is multiply realizable iffdf. (i) possiblyM, P-tokens are core realizers of M-tokens, and (ii) possiblyM, Q-tokens are core realizers of M-tokens, and (iii) PQ.

Here, ‘possiblyM’ designates metaphysical possibility. (The subscript ‘M’ will be used henceforth to indicate that a modal operator covers metaphysically possible worlds.) Metaphysical possibility is all that is needed for the multiple-realizability argument to proceed. If M were identical to P, then it would not be possible for M-tokens to exist without P-tokens (or vice versa) in any possible world irrespective of other factors such the laws of nature obtaining at those worlds.

Consider again the original example concerning pain. According to the foregoing definition of multiple realizability, pain is multiply realizable if and only if there is a metaphysically possible world in which tokens of, say, c-fiber firing are core realizers of pain-tokens, and there is a metaphysically possible world in which tokens of a different type – say, q-fiber firing – are core realizers of pain-tokens. Hence, if token c-fiber firings are core realizers of Alexander’s pain-tokens in world w1, and token q-fiber firings are core realizers of Madeleine’s pain-tokens in world w2, then pain is a multiply-realizable mental type. Moreover, if w1 and w2 are identical with the actual world, then we can say not only that pain is multiply realizable, but that pain is also multiply realized.

d. Multiple Realizability and Mental-Physical Type Identities

As mentioned earlier, the MRT is one way of endorsing an MCT. The second premise of the antireductionist argument reflects this idea. It claims that if mental types are multiply realizable, then they are not identical to physical types. The argument for this premise trades on the following claim:

P1. Necessarily, for mental type M and physical type P, if M is multiply realizable, then it is not necessarilyM the case every M-token is a P-token and vice versa.

The antecedent of this conditional expresses the MRT, and the consequent expresses an MCT.

Claim P1 is supported by an additional assumption: mental types are not necessarilyMcorealized. If, for instance, a Q-token realizes an M-token, then the M-token needn’t be realized by some other token in addition. Hence, to show that M-tokens and P-tokens needn’t be correlated one-one it is sufficient to show that it is possible to have an M-token without having a P-token. Suppose, then, that in world w there is a Q-token that realizes an M-token. In order for it to follow from this that M-tokens couldM occur without P-tokens, we need to assume that, say, a Q-token doesn’t itself require a P-token – that a Q-token could realize an M-token on its own. We might call this assumption Corealizer Contingency: mental types don’t needM to be co-realized. Corealizer Contingency implies that it is possibleM for an M-token to be realized by, say, a Q-token alone, and hence it is possibleM that there might be an M-token without there being a P-token. The conclusion that M is not identical to P if M is multiply realizable now follows from the following premise:

P2. If type M = type P, then necessarilyM every M-token is a P-token and vice versa.

According to P2 the identity of M- and P-types requires the necessaryM coextension of M- and P-tokens. By the foregoing argument, however, if M is multiply realizable it is not necessarilyM the case that there is an M-token if and only if there is a P-token. Hence, it follows that if M is multiply realizable, it is not identical to P.

Now for some terminology. For types φ and ψ, call φ one of ψ's realizing types just in case possiblyM a φ-token realizes a ψ-token. In that case, one can say that the argument based on P1 and P2 purports to show that if M is multiply realizable, M is not identical to any of its realizing types.

e. Type Identities and Psychophysical Reductionism

Psychophysical reductionism claims that psychological discourse is reducible to some type of natural scientific theory such as a neuroscientific one. Paradigmatically, intertheoretic reduction reflects a certain type of ontological and epistemological situation. Domain A is included within Domain B, but for reasons concerning the way people are outfitted epistemically, they have come to know A-entities in a way different from the way they have come to know other B-entities. They have therefore come to describe and explain the behavior of A-entities using a theoretical framework, TA, which is different from the theoretical framework they have used to describe and explain the behavior of other B-entities, the framework TB. The result is that they do not initially recognize the inclusion of Domain A in Domain B. People later discover, however, that Domain A is really part of Domain B; A-entities really just are B-entities of a certain sort, and hence the behavior of A-entities can be exhaustively described and explained in B-theoretic terms. This situation is reflected in a certain relationship between TA and TB. The principles governing the behavior of A-entities, the principles expressed by the law statements of TA, are just special applications of the principles governing the behavior of B-entities in general – the principles expressed by the law statements of TB. The laws of TA, they say, are reducible to the laws of TB; and they say that they are able to provide a reductive description and explanation of A-behavior in B-theoretic terms. A-statements can be derived from B-statements given certain assumptions about the conditions that distinguish A-entities from B-entities of other sorts – so-called boundary conditions. The descriptive and explanatory roles played by the law statements of TA, the reduced theory, are thus taken over by the law statements of the more inclusive reducing theory, TB.

Consider an example. Kepler’s laws are thought to have been reduced to Newton’s. Newton’s laws imply that massive bodies will behave in certain ways given the application of certain forces. If those laws are applied to planetary bodies in particular – if, in other words, people examine the implications of those laws within the boundaries of our planetary system – the laws predict that those bodies will behave in roughly the way Kepler’s laws describe. Kepler’s laws, the laws of the reduced theory, are therefore shown to be special applications of Newton’s laws, the laws of the reducing theory. To the extent that they are accurate, Kepler’s laws really just express the application of Newton’s laws to planetary bodies. One upshot of this circumstance is that people can appeal to Newton’s laws to explain why Kepler’s laws obtain: they obtain because Newtonian laws imply that a system operating within the parameters of our planetary system will behave in roughly the way Kepler’s laws describe.

Intertheoretic reduction is thus marked by the inclusion of one domain in another, and by the explanation of the laws governing the included domain by the laws governing the inclusive one. There have been many attempts to give a precise formulation of the idea of intertheoretic reduction. Those attempts trade on certain assumptions about the nature of theories and the nature of explanation. One of the earliest and most influential attempts was Ernest Nagel’s (1961). Nagel endorsed a syntactic model of theories and a covering-law model of explanation. Roughly, the syntactic model of theories claimed that theories were sets of law statements, and the covering-law model of explanation claimed that explanation was deduction from law statements (Hempel 1965). According to Nagel’s model of reduction, to say that TA was reducible to TB was to say that the law statements of TA were deducible from the law statements of TB in conjunction with statements describing various boundary conditions and bridge principles if necessary. Bridge principles are empirically-supported premises which connect the vocabularies of theories which do not share the same stock of predicates and terms. On the Nagel model of reduction, bridge principles are necessary for intertheoretic reduction if the reduced theory’s vocabulary has predicates and terms which the vocabulary of the reducing theory lacks. Suppose, for instance, that LA is a law statement of TA which is slated for deduction from LB, a law statement of TB:

LA For any x, if A1(x), then A2(x);
LB For any x, if B1(x), then B2(x).

Since the vocabulary of TB does not include the predicates A1 or A2, additional premises such as the following are required for the deduction:

ID1 A1 = B1
ID2 A2 = B2;

Given ID1 and ID2, LA can be derived from LB by the substitution of equivalent expressions.

The reduction of thermodynamics to statistical mechanics is often cited as an example of reduction via bridge principles. The term ‘heat’, which occurs in the law statements of thermodynamics, is not included in the vocabulary of statistical mechanics. As a result, the deduction of thermodynamic law statements from mechanical ones requires the use of additional premises connecting the theories’ respective vocabularies. An example might be the following:

Heat = mean molecular kinetic energy.

Identity statements of this sort are called theoretical identifications. The theoretical identification of X with Y is supposed to be marked by two features. First, the identity is supposed to be discovered empirically. By analogy, members of a certain linguistic community might use the name ‘Hesperus’ to refer to a star that appears in the West in early evening, and they might use the name ‘Phosphorus’ to refer to a star that appears in the East in early morning, and yet they might not know but later discover that those names refer to the same star. Second, however, unlike the Hesperus–Phosphorus case, in the case of theoretical identifications, at least one of the predicates or terms, ‘X’ or ‘Y’, is supposed to belong to a theory.

There are numerous episodes of theoretical identification in the history of science, cases in which we developed descriptive and explanatory frameworks with different vocabularies the predicates and terms of which we later discovered to refer to or express the very same things. The terms ‘light’ and ‘electromagnetic radiation with wavelengths of 380 – 750nm’, for instance, originally belonged to distinct forms of discourse: one to electromagnetic theory, the other to a prescientific way of describing things. Those terms were nevertheless discovered to refer to the very same phenomenon. In the Nagel model of reduction, theoretical identifications operate as bridge principles linking the vocabulary of the reduced theory with vocabulary of the reducing theory. They therefore underwrite the possibility of intertheoretic reduction.

The Nagel model of reduction has been extensively criticized, and alternative models of reduction have been based on different assumptions about the nature of theories and explanation. But the idea that reduction involves the inclusion of one domain in another implies that the entities postulated by the reduced theory be identical to entities postulated by the reducing theory. In claiming to have reduced Kepler’s laws to Newton’s, for instance, the assumption is that planets are massive bodies, not merely objects the behaviors of which are correlated with the behaviors of massive bodies.

To illustrate the necessity of identity for reduction, imagine that Domains A and B comprise completely distinct entities whose behaviors are nevertheless correlated with each other. It turns out, for instance, that the principles governing the instantiation of A-types and those governing the instantiation of B-types are isomorphic in the following sense: for every A-law there is a corresponding B-law, and vice versa; and in addition, tokens of A-types are correlated one-one with tokens of B-types. Given this isomorphism, biconditionals such as the following end up being true:

BC1 Necessarily, for any x, A1(x) if and only if B1(x);
BC2 Necessarily, for any x, A2(x) if and only if B2(x).

Such biconditionals could underwrite the deduction of law statements such as LA from law statements such as LB. What they could not underwrite, however, is the claim that TA is reducible to TB. The reason is that A and B are completely distinct domains which merely happen to be correlated. This is not a case in which one domain is discovered to be part of another, more inclusive domain, and hence it is not a case in which the laws of one domain can be explained by appeal to the laws of another. Without identity statements such as ID1 and ID2, there is no inclusion of one domain in another, and without that sort of inclusion, there is no explanation of the reduced theory’s laws in terms of the reducing theory’s laws. (See Causey 1977: Chapter 4; Schaffner 1967; Hooker 1981: Part III.)

Sklar (1967) argued that reduction requires bridge principles taking the form of identity statements by appeal to an example: the Wiedemann-Franz law. The Wiedemann-Franz law expresses a correlation between thermal conductivity and electrical conductivity in metals. It allows for the deduction of law statements about the latter from law statements about the former. This deducibility, however, has never been understood to warrant the claim that the theory of electrical conductivity is reducible to the theory of heat conductivity, or vice versa. Rather, it points in the direction of a different reduction, the reduction of the macroscopic theory of matter to the microscopic theory of matter.

Suppose, then, that we apply the foregoing account of reduction to psychological discourse. Since that account claims that theoretical identifications are necessary for intertheoretic reduction, the upshot is that psychophysical reduction requires mental-physical type identities. The reduction of psychological discourse to some branch of natural science would require that mental entities be identified with entities postulated by the relevant branch of natural science. It could not involve two distinct yet coordinate domains. This is clear if we imagine a case involving psychophysical parallelism. Suppose two completely distinct ontological domains, one comprising bodies, the other nonphysical Cartesian egos, were governed by principles that happened to be isomorphic in the sense just described: the laws governing the behavior of bodies parallel the laws governing the behavior of the Cartesian egos, and the states of the Cartesian egos are distinct from but nevertheless correlated one-one with certain bodily states. In that case, it would be possible to make deductions about the behavior of Cartesian egos on the basis of the behavior of bodies, but this deducibility would not warrant the claim that the behavior of Cartesian egos was reducible to the behavior of bodies. The behavior of bodies might provide a helpful model or heuristic for understanding or predicting the behavior of Cartesian egos, but it would not provide a reducing theory which explained why the laws governing Cartesian egos obtained. The same point would follow if some type of neutral monism were true – if, say, mental and physical phenomena were correlated, but were both reducible to some third conceptual framework which was neither mental nor physical but neutral. Mere correlations between mental and physical types, even ones which are lawlike, are not sufficient to underwrite psychophysical reduction. Psychophysical reductionism requires the identity of mental and physical types.

Consider now the putative implications of this claim in conjunction with the MRT. Psychophysical reduction requires psychophysical type identities. If mental types are multiply realizable, then they are not identical to any of their physical realizing types. But if mental types are not identical to physical types (the tacit assumption being that the only physical candidates for identification with mental types are their realizing types), then psychological discourse is not reducible to physical theory.

2. Arguments for the Multiple-Realizability Thesis

Section 1 discussed the connection between multiple realizability and antireductionism. Antireductionists argue that if mental types are multiply realizable, then psychophysical reductionism is false. But why suppose that mental types are multiply realizable? Why suppose the MRT is true? The MRT has been supported in at least two ways: by appeal to conceptual or intuitive considerations, and by appeal to empirical findings in biology, neuroscience, and artificial intelligence research. In this section, arguments of both types will be considered.

a. Conceptual Arguments for the MRT

Conceivability arguments for the MRT claim that conceivability or intuition is a reliable guide to possibility. If that is the case, and it is conceivable that mental types might be correlated one-many with physical types, then it is possible that mental types might be correlated one-many with physical types. And, say exponents of the argument, one-many psychophysical correlations are surely conceivable. Consider the broad range of perfectly intelligible scenarios science fiction writers are able to imagine – scenarios in which robots and extraterrestrials with physiologies very different from ours are able to experience pain, belief, desire, and other mental states without the benefit of c-fibers, cerebral hemispheres, or other any of the other physical components that are correlated with mental states in humans. If these scenarios are conceivable and conceivability is a more or less reliable guide to possibility, then we can conclude that these scenarios really are possible. Conceivability arguments for the MRT, then, trade on the following premises:

CA1 If it is conceivable that mental types are multiply realizable, then mental types are multiply realizable;

CA2 It is conceivable that mental types are multiply realizable.

Therefore, mental types are multiply realizable.

Conceivability-Possibility Principles (CPs) have been a staple in philosophy of mind at least since Descartes. He used a CP to argue for the real distinction of mind and body in Meditation VI:

...because I know that everything I clearly and distinctly conceive can be made by God as I understand it, it is sufficient that I am able clearly and distinctly to conceive one thing apart from another to know with certainty that the one is different from the other – because they could be separated, at least by God… Consequently, from the fact that I know that I exist, and I notice at the same time that nothing else plainly belongs to my nature or essence except only that I am a thinking thing, I rightly conclude that my essence consists solely in being a thinking thing... [B]ecause I have on the one hand a clear and distinct idea of myself, insofar as I am merely a thinking thing and not extended, and on the other hand, a distinct idea of the body insofar as it is merely an extended thing and not thinking, it is certain that I am really distinct from my body, and can exist without it (AT VII, 78).

Descartes’ argument trades on three premises. First, clear and distinct conceivability is a reliable guide to possibility. In particular, if it is clearly and distinctly conceivable that x can exist apart from y, then it is possible for x to exist apart from y. Second, I can form a clear and distinct conception of myself apart from my body. Hence, I can exist without it. But third, if x can exist without y, then clearly x cannot be y. Hence, I cannot be my body. CPs have become controversial in part because of their association with arguments of this sort. Jackson’s (1982, 1986) knowledge argument and Searle’s (1980) Chinese Room argument as well as a host of other arguments concerning the possibility of inverted spectra, absent qualia, and the like trade on CPs.

Unrestricted CPs, ones that do not qualify the notion of conceivability or limit the scope of the modal operator, have clear counterexamples. Some of those counterexamples concern the scope of the operator. DaVinci, for instance, conceived of humans flying with birdlike wings despite the physical impossibility of such flight. Similarly, prior to the twentieth century people might have conceived that it was possible for there to be a solid uranium sphere with a mass exceeding 1,000 kg – another physical impossibility. Other counterexamples concern the notion of conceivability. It is unclear, for instance, whether the conceptions people form of things while drunk or drugged or in various other circumstances can serve as reliable guides to possibility.

Because of examples of this sort, exponents of CPs do not endorse unrestricted versions of them, but versions limited to a particular type of conceivability, a particular scope for the modal operator, and a particular subject matter for the claim or scenario being conceived. Descartes, for instance, spoke of clear and distinct conceivability, and took the scope of the modal operator to cover metaphysically possible worlds – or as he puts it, the range of circumstances God could have brought about. A CP along these lines is immune to counterexamples such as the uranium sphere and human birdlike flight since these examples pertain to nomological or physical possibility. Roughly, p is nomologically possible exactly if p is consistent with the laws of nature, and p is physically possible exactly if p is consistent with the laws of physics (physical possibility and nomological possibility are the same if the laws of physical are the same as the laws of nature). Since we can know these laws only through scientific investigation, it seems likely that our conceptions of nomological and physical possibilities can only be as reliable as our best scientific knowledge allows them to be. The same can be said of technological possibility or other kinds of possibility that involve consistency with conditions that are knowable only a posteriori.

Metaphysical possibility, on the other hand, involves compossibility with essences – the features things need to exist in any metaphysically possible world. Knowledge of essences does not necessarily depend on empirical considerations. Whether or not it does marks the difference between empirical essentialists and conceptual essentialists. Roughly, empirical essentialists claim that our knowledge of essences is analogous to our knowledge of the laws of physics or of nature: we can learn about them only a posteriori. Conceptual essentialists disagree: we can come to know essences a priori.

Descartes is a prototypical conceptual essentialist. He thinks it is possible to discover something’s essence by means of a certain kind of conceptual analysis. Consider, for instance, his argument in Meditation II that his essence consists in thinking alone:

Can I not affirm that I have at least a minimum of all those things which I have just said pertain to the nature of body? I attend to them... [N]othing comes to mind... Being nourished or moving? Since now I do not have a body, these surely are nothing but figments. Sensing? Surely this too does not happen without a body... Thinking? Here I discover it: It is thought; this alone cannot be separated from me... I am therefore precisely only a thinking thing… (AT VII, 26-27).

The procedure Descartes follows for forming a clear and distinct conception of something’s essence is roughly as follows. First, he reckons that the object in question has certain properties. He then considers whether it can exist without these properties by “removing” them from the object one-by-one in his thought or imagination. If he can conceive of the object existing without a certain property, he can conclude that that property does not belong to the object’s nature or essence. He thus takes himself to arrive by turns at a clearer, more distinct conception of what the object essentially is. When he applies this procedure to himself, he initially reckons that he has various bodily attributes such as having a face, hands, and arms, and being capable of eating, walking, perceiving, and thinking. He then considers whether he could still exist without these features by “removing” them from himself conceptually. He concludes that he could exist without all of them except the property of thinking. He can form no conception of himself without it, he says, whereas he can form a clear and distinct conception of himself without any bodily attributes. He concludes, therefore, that he can form a clear and distinct conception of himself as a thinking thing alone apart from his body or any other.

Conceptual essentialism was en vogue for a long time in modern philosophy, but empirical essentialism experienced a revival in the late twentieth century due to the work of Kripke (1972) and Putnam (1975b). According to empirical essentialists, discerning something’s essence is not a task that can be accomplished from an armchair. It requires actual scientific investigation since the conceptions we initially form of things may not correspond to their essential properties. We might have learned to identify water, for instance, by a certain characteristic look or smell or taste, but if we brought a bottle of water to a distant planet with a strange atmosphere that affected our senses in unusual ways, the contents of the bottle might no longer look, smell, or taste to us the same way. This would not mean that the substance in the bottle was no longer water; it would still be the same substance; it would simply be affecting our senses differently on account of the planet’s strange atmosphere. It would still be water, in other words, despite the fact that it did not have the characteristics we originally associated with water. The essential features of water would remain the same even if its “accidental” features underwent a change. According to empirical essentialists, the essential features of something, the features that enable us to claim that, for instance, the contents of the bottle are essentially the same on Earth and on the distant planet, are features it is up to science to discern -- features which might not correspond to our intuitive, prescientific conception of water.

Empirical essentialists tend to be inhospitable to conceivability-possibility arguments of the sort represented by CA1 and CA2. They can attack the argument in the following ways. First, against CA1, they can argue that the conceivability of multiple realizability is a guide to possibility which is only as reliable as our best scientific knowledge of mental phenomena and their realizers, and that in its current incomplete state, our scientific knowledge does not provide us with the resources sufficient to act as a reliable guide to possibility in this matter. Against CA2, on the other hand, they can argue that in our current state of scientific knowledge we cannot conceive of mental types being multiply realizable for either of two reasons: (a) we don’t know enough about mental types and their realizers to form any clear conception of whether or not they are multiply realizable, or (b) we do know enough about mental types and their realizers to form a clear conception that they are not multiply realizable.

b. Empirical Arguments for the MRT

Empirical arguments for the MRT largely avoid the aforementioned worries concerning CPs. They generalize from findings in particular scientific disciplines. Various scientific disciplines, they claim, provide inductive grounds that support the possibility of mental types being realized by diverse physical types. Those disciplines include evolutionary biology, neuroscience, and cognitive science – artificial intelligence research in particular.

The argument Putnam (1967a) originally advanced against the identity theory is an example of an appeal to evolutionary biology. According to Putnam, what we know about evolution suggests that in all likelihood it is possible for a given mental type to be correlated with multiple diverse physical types. Block and Fodor (1972: 238) and Fodor (1968a; 1974) have advanced similar arguments.

We can formulate the appeal to biology in roughly the following way. The phenomenon of convergent evolution gives us good reason to suppose there are beings in the universe that are mentally similar to humans. One reason for this is that the possession of psychological capacities would seem to be (at least under certain circumstances) selectively advantageous. The ability to experience pain, for instance, would seem to increase my chances of survival if, say, I am in danger of being burned alive. The pain I experience would contribute to behavior aimed at removing the threat. Likewise, if I am in danger of being eaten by a large carnivore, my chances of survival will be enhanced if I am able to feel fear and to respond to the threat appropriately. Similarly, it is plausible to suppose that in many circumstances my chances of surviving and successfully reproducing will be improved by having more or less accurate beliefs about the environment – knowing or believing that fires and large carnivores are dangerous, for instance. There are, in short, many reasons for thinking that possessing mental states of the sort humans possess would be selectively advantageous for beings of other kinds. This gives us some reason to suppose that there might be beings in the universe that are very similar to us mentally. On the other hand, there are analogous reasons to suppose that those beings are probably very different from us physically. The last forty years of biological research have shown us that life can evolve in a broad range of very different environments. Environments once thought incapable of supporting life such as deep sea volcanic vents have been discovered to support rich and diverse ecosystems. It seems very likely, then, that living systems will be capable of evolving in a broad range of environments very different from those on Earth. In that case, however, it seems very unlikely that mentally-endowed creatures evolving in those environments will be physically just like humans. Our current state of biological knowledge suggests, then, that there are most likely beings in the universe who are like us mentally but who are unlike us physically. Evolutionary biology thus gives us some reason to suppose the MRT is true.

A second kind of argument appeals not to evolutionary biology but to neuroscience. One such argument, for instance, appeals to the phenomenon of brain plasticity (Block and Fodor 1972: 238; Fodor 1974: 104-106; Endicott 1993). Brain plasticity is the ability of various parts of the brain or nervous system to realize cognitive or motor abilities. (See Kolb and Whishaw 2003: 621-641 for a description of brain plasticity and research related to it.) If the section of motor cortex that controls, say, thumb movement is damaged, cells in the adjacent sections of cortex are able to take over the functions previously performed by the damaged ones. What this seems to suggest is that different neural components are capable of realizing the same type of cognitive operation. And this gives us some reason to suspect it is possible for tokens of one mental type to be realized by tokens of more than one physical type.

Finally, a third type of empirical argument appeals to work in artificial intelligence (AI) (Block and Fodor, op cit.; Fodor, op cit). Some AI researchers are in the business of constructing computer-based models of cognitive functioning. They construct computational systems that aim at mimicking various forms of human behavior such as linguistic understanding. Incremental success in this type of endeavor would lend further support to the idea that mental types could be realized by diverse physical types: not just by human brains but by silicon circuitry.

One criticism of empirical arguments for the MRT is that they are merely inductive in character (Zangwill 1992: 218-219): the denial of multiple realizability is still consistent with their premises. In addition, Shapiro (2004) argues against the appeal to biology on the grounds that a view which denies the MRT is just as probable given convergent evolution as a view which endorses it. Against the appeal to neuroscience, moreover, Bechtel and Mundale (1999) argue that the argument’s principle of brain state individuation is unrealistically narrow. Real neuroscientific practice individuates brain states more broadly. In addition, the neuroscientific data is compatible with there being a single determinable physical type which simply takes on multiple determinate forms (Hill 1991). Finally, the appeal to AI would seem to be little more than a promissory note. That work hasn’t produced anything approaching a being with psychological capacities like our own. The argument is thus little different from a conceptual argument for the MRT. Moreover, there are arguments purporting to show that silicon-based minds are impossible. Searle’s (1980) Chinese Room argument is an example.

3. Responses to the Antireductionist Argument

Reductionists have several ways of responding to the multiple-realizability argument. It will be helpful to divide them into two groups. Typology-based responses target Premises 1 and 2 of the antireductionist argument: the MRT and the claim that the MRT is incompatible with mental-physical type identities. Reduction-based responses, on the other hand, target Premise 3 of the antireductionist argument, the claim that mental-physical type identities are necessary for reduction. These responses will be discussed in order.

a. Typology-Based Responses

Typology-based responses to the multiple-realizability argument take the definition of ‘multiple realizability’ to include a condition relating types to specific typologies. A condition of this sort was left implicit in the definition of multiple realizability given in Section 1-c. An explicit statement of such a condition would take something like the following form:

[Def*] A type M is multiply realizable relative to typologies T and T* iff df. (i) M is a type postulated by T; (ii) P and Q are types postulated by T*; (iii) possiblyM, P-tokens are core realizers of M-tokens; (iv) possiblyM, Q-tokens are core realizers of M-tokens, and (v) PQ.

According to typology-based responses, the multiple-realizability argument trades on the unwarranted and highly dubious assumption that psychophysical relations must be reckoned only relative to our current mental and physical typologies. In all likelihood, they claim, future scientific investigation will result in the formulation of new mental and/or physical typologies which will no longer support the MRT or the claim that it implies the non-identity of mental and physical types.

Kim (1972), it seems, was the first to appreciate the range of typology-based strategies available to opponents of the multiple-realizability argument. They include the postulation of a new mental typology, the postulation of a new physical typology, and the postulation of both a new mental and a new physical typology. The first strategy includes the local reduction move. The second strategy includes the postulation of overarching physical commonalities, the postulation of broad physical types, and the disjunctive move. Finally, the third strategy includes the coordinated typology strategy, the idea that mental and physical typologies will develop in a coordinated way that yields one-one mental-physical type correlations. These options are represented in Figure 1.

mr-fig1

Figure 1: Typology-based Responses

Relative to our current mental and physical typologies, the MRT implies that a mental type, M, is correlated with multiple physical types P1,…,Pn as in Column I. Psychophysical identification requires, however, that each mental type line up with a single physical type. Reductionists can respond to the argument either by “breaking up” M into a number of “narrower” mental types M1,…,Mn each of which corresponds to a single physical type as in Column II. This is the strategy represented by the local reduction move. Reductionists can also respond, however, by “gathering” the diverse physical types together under a single overarching physical type, P, which corresponds to M as in Column III. This is the strategy represented by the postulation of overarching physical commonalities, the postulation of broad physical types, and the disjunctive move. Finally, reductionists can respond by claiming that mental and physical typologies will both be altered in various ways that eventually yield one-one correlations between mental and physical types as in Column IV.

Typology-based responses can be understood to target either Premise 1 or Premise 2 of the antireductionist argument. Which they are understood to target depends on whether any of the types in question are defined relative to our current typologies. Consider an example. Someone who claims that the mental types postulated by our current typology will be retained in a new typology alongside more “narrow” mental types which are correlated one-one with physical types will claim that that Premise 2 is false: the MRT is compatible with mental-physical type identities. By contrast, someone who claims that the mental types postulated by our current typology will not be retained in a new typology will claim instead that the MRT is false: all mental types are really of a narrow variety; each corresponds to a single physical type.

i. New Mental Typologies: The Local Reduction Move

The local reduction move (LRM) has also been called an appeal to ‘narrow mental types’, or to ‘species-specific’ or ‘structure-’ or ‘domain-specific reductions’. Its exponents include Kim (1972: 235; 1989; 1992), Lewis (1969, 1980), Enc (1983: 289-90), P.M. Churchland (1988: 40-41), P.S. Churchland (1986: 356-358), Causey (1977: 147-149), and Bickle (1998). According to the LRM, a mental predicate or term such as ‘pain’, which seems to express a single mental type, really expresses multiple diverse mental types. The case of ‘pain’ is analogous to the case of ‘jade’. The latter was originally taken to refer to a single mineralogical type. Scientific investigation revealed, however, that ‘jade’ really corresponds to two distinct mineralogical types: jadeite and nephrite. Exponents of the LRM claim that mental predicates and terms are the same way. ‘Pain’ doesn’t express a single overarching mental type found in humans, in Martians, and in robots; ‘pain’ is instead an imprecise term which corresponds to multiple diverse mental types including pain-in-humans, pain-in-Martians, and pain-in-robots. As a result, we shouldn’t be seeking to identify physical types with “broad” mental types such as pain; we should instead be seeking to identify them with “narrower” mental types such as pain-in-humans, pain-in-Martians, and pain-in-robots.

In support of the LRM, Enc (ibid.) has drawn an analogy with thermodynamics (cf. Churchland 1986 and Churchland 1988). Heat, he argues, is multiply realized at the level of microphysical interactions. Temperature-in-gases is different from temperature-in-solids, which is different from temperature-in-plasmas and temperature-in-a-vacuum. The multiple realizability of heat, however, does not imply that thermodynamics has not been reduced to statistical mechanics; it merely implies that the reduction proceeds piecemeal. Temperature-in-gases is identified with one type of mechanical property; temperature-in-plasmas, with a different mechanical property, and so on. Thermodynamics is thus reduced to statistical mechanics one lower-level domain at a time through the mediation of restricted domain-specific thermodynamic types: temperature-in-gases, temperature-in-solids, and the like. Something similar could be true of psychophysical reduction. Psychology could reduce to physical theory by way of various domain-specific mental types such as pain-in-humans and pain-in-Martians.

Several criticisms of the LRM have appeared in the literature. Zangwill (1992: 215), for instance, argues that the thermodynamic example is irrelevant to the philosophy of mind. Another criticism claims that narrower mental types would be too narrow for the explanatory purposes psychological discourse aims to satisfy (cf. Putnam 1975c: 295-298; Fodor 1974: 114; Pylyshyn 1984: Chapter 1; Endicott 1993: 311-312). Science seeks the broadest, most comprehensive generalizations it can get, the argument claims, but the LRM seems to violate this methodological canon since the narrow mental types it postulates would prevent us from formulating broad cross-species generalizations. Sober (1999) attacks the argument’s major premise: science doesn’t always work by seeking the broadest, most comprehensive generalizations. Moreover, even if narrow mental types didn’t allow for the formulation of the most comprehensive generalizations, we might still be better off with local reductions for a variety of reasons including ontological parsimony and the value of grounding higher-level explanations in mental-physical type identities. (Endicott 1993: 311). (Bickle 1998: 150ff. criticizes this objection to the LRM in other ways as well.)

A third criticism claims that the LRM would fail to explain what all the phenomena called ‘pain’ have in common (Block 1980b: 178-9). Against this, Kim (1992) has argued that diverse types such as pain-in-humans and pain-in-Martians would still have in common their satisfaction of a certain functional description or causal role, and this commonality would be sufficient to explain the commonalities among diverse instances of pain.

A final criticism of the LRM claims that there are no mental types narrow enough to line up with physical types in a way that would support reduction. Endicott (1993: 314-318) argues that if we postulate mental types narrow enough to avoid multiple realizability we risk postulating types that are so narrow it no longer makes sense to speak of a reduction of types as opposed to a mere identification of tokens. The burden for exponents of the LRM, then, is to postulate types with the right sort of grain: narrow enough to avoid the implications of the multiple-realizability argument, but not so narrow that the notion of reduction drops out of the picture. (Endicott (1993) criticizes the LRM in other ways as well.)

ii. New Physical Typologies I

Reductionists can also respond to the multiple-realizability argument by positing new physical typologies. Kim states the idea in the following terms:

…the mere fact that the physical bases of two nervous systems are different in material composition or physical organization with respect to a certain scheme of classification does not entail that they cannot be in the same physical state with respect to a different scheme (Kim 1972: 235).

At least three suggestions have been advanced in the literature to this effect. The first claims that we might discover something had in common by all of the apparently diverse realizers of a mental type. We could discover, for instance, that c-fiber firing in humans and q-fiber firing in Martians actually have something interesting in common – that they are in fact instances of a broader physical type which is correlated one-one with pain. According to this strategy, the diverse realizers of a mental type are analogous to electricity, magnetism, and light – types of phenomena which initially seemed diverse but which were later discovered to belong to a single overarching type.

Hill (1991: 105) suggests something like the postulation of overarching physical commonalities in the following terms:

[I]t is not enough to appeal to a case in which a single qualitative characteristic is associated with two or more distinct neurophysiological state-types. One must go on to provide an exhaustive characterization of the distinct levels of description and explanation that belong to neuroscience, and show that no such level harbors a kind under which all of the states in question may be subsumed (Hill 1991: 105).

Shapiro (2000, 2004) has a similar idea. Although aluminum and steel count as diverse types relative to one scheme of classification, he argues, they don’t count as diverse realizations of corkscrews because they have too much in common relative to the performance of the activities that qualify something as a corkscrew. (Gillett 2003 criticizes Shapiro’s argument.) Similarly, Bechtel and Mundale (1999) cite examples from cognitive neuroscience which suggest that there are lower-level properties which are nevertheless the same in a more general functional respect.

The discovery of overarching commonalities is not the only way of developing a new physical typology. Reductionists might decide to individuate realizing types in a way that comprises a broad swath of environmental factors. Antony and Levine (1997), for instance, argue that we should understand realization in terms of the total realizers of mental types instead of their core realizers (see Section 1-c). If realizers are individuated this broadly, however, mental types will no longer be multiply realizable.

Finally, reductionists could develop a new physical typology on the basis of disjunctive physical types. If reductionists are willing to countenance the existence of disjunctive properties, they could identify a mental type with the disjunction of its realizing types. This particular response to the multiple-realizability argument has generated an extensive literature, and deserves separate treatment.

iii. New Physical Typologies II: The Disjunctive Move

The possibility of identifying mental types with disjunctive physical types has repeatedly asserted itself in the literature on multiple realizability. Given an inventory of basic physical predicates P1,…,Pn the idea is to use Boolean operations to construct disjunctive predicates which express disjunctive types (e.g. P1vP3, P7vP15vP39). Putnam (1967) dismissed the disjunctive move out of hand, but it has since been taken very seriously. Kim (1978), Clapp (2001), and Antony (1998, 2003), for instance, have all defended it in one way or another.

Criticisms of the disjunctive move have been thoroughly discussed in the literature (Antony 1999, 2003; Antony and Levine 1997; Block 1980b, 1997; Block and Fodor 1972; Clapp 2001; Endicott 1991, 1993; Fodor 1974, 1997; Jaworski 2002; Kim 1972, 1978, 1984, 1992, 1998; Macdonald 1989; Melnyk 2003; Owens 1989; Pereboom 2002; Pereboom and Kornblith 1991; Putnam 1967a; Seager 1991; Teller 1983). The criticisms discussed in what follows fall into two broad categories: law-based criticisms and metaphysical criticisms. In discussing them, it will be helpful to introduce the following terms: if P1,…,Pn are the types that realize mental type M, call P1,…,Pn an R-disjunction, and call a generalization featuring an R-disjunction as its antecedent an R-disjunctive generalization.

1) Law-Based Criticisms

Law-based criticisms of the disjunctive move focus on the nature of scientific laws. They claim that predicates such as ‘believes’, ‘desires’, and ‘is in pain’ express genuine properties. If mental types are genuine properties, and mental types are identical to R-disjunctive types, then it follows by the indiscernibility of identicals that R-disjunctive types must be genuine properties as well. Fodor (1974) suggested, however, that genuine properties were expressed by the predicates of law statements – a plausible idea if genuine properties make a causal or explanatory difference to their bearers, and causal/explanatory regularities are expressed by law statements. Law-based criticisms of the disjunctive move argue that R-disjunctive generalizations are not genuine law statements, and because they are not genuine law statements, R-disjunctive predicates do not express genuine properties.

Methodological criticisms of the disjunctive move such as Fodor’s (1997: 157-9) claim that the postulation of R-disjunctive types violates standard canons of scientific method. Standard inductive practice aims at formulating the strongest generalizations warranted by the limited available evidence, and closed law statements, as Fodor calls them, are stronger than open ones. Closed law statements are law statements that do not feature open-ended disjunctive predicates such as a psychological generalization with the form ‘Necessarily, for any x, if Mx, then M*x’. Open law statements are law statements that do feature open-ended disjunctive predicates. An example would be an R-disjunctive generalization with the form ‘Necessarily, for any x, if P1x v P2x v… then M*x’. Given reasonable assumptions, the MRT implies that a given mental type will be correlated with an indefinitely large number of realizing types. Consequently, the MRT will most likely imply the existence of open generalizations of the latter sort as opposed to closed generalizations of the former one. Because scientific practice aims at formulating the strongest generalizations, and closed generalizations are stronger than open ones, standard scientific method dictates a preference for closed generalizations over open generalizations such as those featuring R-disjunctions. There are good methodological reasons, then, for supposing that R-disjunctive generalizations are not genuine law statements and that their predicates do not express genuine properties. The problem with this argument is that its point is merely methodological. It does not rule out the possibility of there being R-disjunctive types or R-disjunctive laws (a point Fodor recognizes). It thus falls short of refuting the disjunctive move.

Other law-based criticisms correspond to two different features of law statements: their ability to ground explanations, and their projectibility – their ability to be confirmed by their positive instances. Explanation-based criticisms of the disjunctive move claim that R-disjunctive generalizations cannot express laws because they do not function explanatorily the way law statements do. One such criticism claims, for instance, that explanations must be relevant to our explanatory interests, and appeals to R-disjunctive generalizations are clearly irrelevant to the interests we have in explaining human behavior (Pereboom and Kornblith 1991; Putnam 1975c, 1981). If, for instance, we want to know why Caesar ordered his troops to cross the Rubicon, it doesn’t satisfying our interests to respond, “Because he was either in neural state N1 or in neural state N2 or…” One criticism of this argument is that the notion of relevance is highly context dependent. Although there are good reasons to suppose appeals to R-disjunctive generalizations are irrelevant in “pedestrian” contexts such as the context involving Caesar’s actions, there are also good reasons to suppose that appeals to R-disjunctive generalizations might be relevant in scientific contexts in which reduction is at stake (Jaworski 2002).

Confirmation-based criticisms, on the other hand, claim that R-disjunctive generalizations cannot express laws because they are not confirmed in the way law statements are. In particular, they are not projectible; they are not confirmed by their positive instances. Exponents of confirmation-based criticisms include Owens (1989) and Seager (1990), but Kim’s (1992) version of this criticism is both the best developed and most widely discussed representative of this approach.

Kim’s argument trades on two premises. First, if some evidence e confirms p and p entails q, then e also confirms q. Second, no generalization can be confirmed without the observation of some of its positive instances. Given these premises, the argument purports to show that generalizations with disjunctive antecedents cannot express laws. If they did express laws, they would be confirmed by their positive instances the way all law statements are. But clearly they are not, the argument claims. To show this, assume for the sake of argument that generalizations with disjunctive antecedents are confirmed by their positive instances – call this the Disjunctive Confirmation Hypothesis. Consider now an example: every piece of jade, says Kim, is a piece of either jadeite or nephrite, and vice versa. Suppose, then, that a certain number of jadeite samples confirm the following:

(1) All jadeite is green.

Since each piece of jadeite is also a piece of jade (that is a piece of jadeite or nephrite) each piece of green jadeite is also a positive instance of (2):

(2) All jade is green (i.e. all jadeite or nephrite is green).

So if (1) is confirmed by the samples of jadeite, then by the Disjunctive Confirmation Hypothesis, so is (2). But ‘∀x((Jx v Nx) → Gx)’ implies ‘∀x(NxGx)’ in the predicate calculus, so if (2) is confirmed by the samples, then by Kim’s first premise, so is (3):

(3) All nephrite is green.

The problem, however, is that none of the samples are samples of nephrite. Because no generalization can be confirmed without the observation of some positive instances (Kim’s second premise), we must reject the assumption which sanctioned this confirmation procedure, namely the Disjunctive Confirmation Hypothesis. (A parallel example: suppose a sexually active adult is a sexually active man or woman, and that a certain number of sexually active men confirm ‘No sexually active man becomes pregnant’. Parity of reasoning yields the conclusion that those men confirm ‘No sexually active adult becomes pregnant’, and hence ‘No sexually active woman becomes pregnant’!) If the Disjunctive Confirmation Hypothesis is rejected, however, it follows that R-disjunctive generalizations fail to be confirmed in a lawlike manner and hence fail to express laws.

The principal shortcoming of this argument is that many disjunctive predicates are capable of occurring in law statements. Suppose, for instance, that ‘All emeralds are green’ expresses a law statement. Consider a term that is necessarily coextensive with ‘emeralds’ such as ‘emeralds in the northern hemisphere or elsewhere’. Since this term expresses the same class as ‘emeralds’ it seems that ‘All emeralds in the northern hemisphere or elsewhere are green’ will be confirmed by its positive instances if ‘All emeralds are green’ is. But if these are both law statements, then there will have to be some way of distinguishing legitimate disjunctive predicates such as ‘is a northern or a non-northern emerald’ from illegitimate disjunctive predicates such as ‘is jadeite or nephrite’, and it seems the only way of doing that is to consider the objects to which these predicates apply. Hence, says Kim, “There is nothing wrong with disjunctive predicates as such; the trouble arises when the kinds denoted by the disjoined predicates are heterogeneous… so that instances falling under them do not show the kind of ‘similarity’, or unity, that we expect of instances falling under a single kind” (Kim 1992: 321). A confirmation-based criticism seems to depend, therefore, on some type of metaphysical criticism.

2) Metaphysical Criticisms

Metaphysical criticisms of the disjunctive move claim the idea of a disjunctive property is somehow metaphysically suspect. There are at least two arguments of this sort.

Armstrong (1978: II, 20) argues that accepting disjunctive properties would violate the principle that the same property is present in its diverse instances. Objects a and b, for instance, might both have the disjunctive property PvQ despite the fact that a has it by virtue of having property P instead of Q, and b has it by virtue of having Q instead of P. Clapp (2001) criticizes this argument on the grounds that determinables and their corresponding determinates seem to provide counterexamples. For example, being red, being blue, being yellow, and so forth, are determinates of the determinable being colored. Since everything that is colored must be a determinate shade, anything that satisfies the predicate ‘is blue, or is red, or is yellow,…’ will also satisfy the predicate ‘is colored’. Consequently, if a is red and b is blue, they will have in common the property being colored.

A second metaphysical criticism argues that mental types cannot be identical to R-disjunctive types because R-disjunctions do not express natural kinds. One basic assumption of the multiple-realizability debate is that mental types are natural kinds. Consequently, if mental types are identical to R-disjunctive types, the latter must be natural kinds as well. But R-disjunctive types are not natural kinds, the argument claims. The reason is that natural kindhood is based on similarity, and instances of R-disjunctions are not similar to each other in the right sort of way (Fodor 1974: 109ff.; 1997: 156, Block 1978: 266, Macdonald 1989: 36-7, Armstrong 1978: Vol. II, 20, Kim 1992, Antony and Levine 1997: 87ff.).

Individual instances or members of a natural kind are similar in important ways that have a bearing on, for instance, the projectibility of law statements. The generalization ‘All Ks are F’ is projectible only if Ks remain similar across actual and counterfactual circumstances in ways that have a bearing on their F-ness. Only if Ks are similar to each other in these ways can the observation of any K provide evidence about the F-ness of any other K. Inductive projection about Ks requires, then, that Ks be similar to each other in stable ways. One version of this similarity-based argument understands the relevant similarity in terms of causality (Kim 1992). Kim labels this the “Principle of Causal Individuation of Kinds”: “Kinds in a science are individuated on the basis of causal powers; that is, objects and events fall under a kind, or share in a property, insofar as they have similar causal powers” (Kim 1992: 326). The argument, then, is that R-disjunctive types can qualify as natural kinds only if they are causally similar – only if, for instance, R-disjunctive tokens have similar effects. But, the argument claims, R-disjunctive tokens are not causally similar. If they were causally similar; if, for instance, c-fiber firing and q-fiber firing produced the same effects, they probably wouldn’t qualify as diverse realizers of pain. The causal diversity of R-disjunctive tokens seems to be an implication of the MRT. Consequently, R-disjunctive types are not natural kinds.

Criticisms of this argument have sometimes appealed to the considerations that support physical commonalities among R-disjuncts (See Section 3-a-iii). Block (1997), Antony and Levine (1997), Shapiro (2000), and others have argued, for instance, that diverse physical realizers must have something interesting in common in order to satisfy the functional descriptions associated with mental states. If being in pain amounts to being in some lower-order physical state with such-and-such typical effects, then c-fiber firing and q-fiber firing must each be able to produce those effects to qualify as instances of pain. They must therefore be causally similar to that extent at least. Importantly, critics of this argument have typically not sought to defend the disjunctive move per se, but rather implications the argument has for nonreductive physicalism (see Section 4 below.)

iv. Coordinate Typologies

Another typology-based response to the antireductionist argument claims that mental and physical typologies are to some extent interdependent, and as a result they will eventually converge in a way that yields one-one correlations between mental and physical types. Something like this idea is suggested by Kim:

The less the physical basis of the nervous system of some organisms resembles ours, the less temptation there will be for ascribing them sensations or other phenomenal events (Kim 1972: 235).

Similarly, Enc argues (1983: 290) that our mental typology will eventually be altered to reflect our lower-level scientific investigations. Couch (2004) makes a similar point: if scientists find physical differences among the parts of a system, they are likely to seek higher-level functional differences as well. (Cf. Hill 1991: Chapter 3.)

One argument in favor of coordinate typologies is suggested by Kim (1992), Bickle (1998: Chapter 4), and Bechtel and Mundale (1999). The idea is roughly that there can be higher-level regularities only if they are grounded in lower-level ones. Consequently, if we discuss higher-level regularities such as those expressed by familiar psychological generalizations, we have good reason to think these are underwritten by regularities at lower levels. This dependence of higher-level regularities on lower-level regularities gives us some reason to suspect that mental and physical typologies will tend to converge. (Sungsu Kim (2002) criticizes Bechtel and Mundale’s argument. Couch (2004) defends it.)

b. Reduction-Based Responses

Reduction-based responses to the multiple-realizability argument attack the claim that reduction requires bridge principles taking the form of identity statements. Robert Richardson (1979), for instance, argues that a Nagelian account of intertheoretic reduction can be underwritten by one-way conditionals. Consider again the theories TA and TB discussed in Section 1e. Imagine that TA is slated for reduction to TB, and that LA is a law statement of TA which is supposed to be derived from LB, a law statement of TB:

LA For any x, if A1(x), then A2(x);
LB For any x, if B1(x), then B2(x).

Since the vocabulary of TB does not include the predicates A1 or A2, additional premises linking the vocabularies of the two theories are required. Earlier, in Section 1-e, we said that the derivation of LA from LB required bridge principles taking the form of identity statements:

ID1A1 = B1
ID2A2 = B2;

It seems, however, that LA might be derived from LB on the basis of bridge principles along the following lines instead:

C1 Necessarily, for any x, if B1(x), then A1 (x);
C2 Necessarily, for any x, if B2 (x), then A2(x).

If one-way conditionals of this sort are sufficient for reductive derivations, then the non-identity of mental and physical types is not incompatible with reductionism after all. Reductive derivations might proceed via bridge principles such as C1 and C2 even if identity statements along the lines of ID1 and ID2 are false.

The problem with this understanding of reduction, one indicated by Patricia Kitcher (1980) in her criticism of Richardson, is that a derivation via one-way conditionals does not result in ontological simplification (cf. Bickle 1998: 119-120). It doesn’t show that what we originally took to be two kinds of entities are really only one. Ontological simplification of this sort is taken to be a central feature of reduction – the upshot of showing that A-entities are really just B-entities.

Reduction-based responses to the multiple-realizability argument have not been as popular as typology-based responses on account of widespread commitment to the idea that reduction involves ontological simplification (Sklar 1967; Schaffner 1967; Causey 1972; 1977: Chapter 4; Hooker 1981: Part III; Churchland 1986). Yet Bickle (2003) has recently suggested another type of reduction-based response. It claims not that bridge principles along the lines of C1 and C2 are sufficient for reduction, but that ontological issues concerning the identity or non-identity of properties are completely orthogonal to the issue of reduction. If that is the case, then issues concerning psychophysical reduction could be addressed independently of issues concerning the identity or non-identity of mental and physical types.

4. Multiple Realizability and Nonreductive Physicalism

Multiple realizability has recently played an important role in the attempt to articulate an acceptable form of nonreductive physicalism (NRP). NRP can be characterized by a commitment to three claims, roughly:

Physicalism: Everything is physical – all objects, properties, and events are the sort that can be exhaustively described and/or explained by the natural sciences.

Mental Realism: Some mental types are genuine properties.

Antireductionism: Mental and physical types are not identical.

Jaegwon Kim has articulated a well-known difficulty for a particular type of NRP: realization physicalism. Realization physicalism claims that properties postulated by nonphysical frameworks are higher-order properties that are realized by lower-order properties or their instances in the sense described in Section 1-b. Having a mental property amounts to having some lower-order property that satisfies a certain associated description or condition. Having pain, for instance, might be defined as having some lower-order property that is typically caused by pinpricks, abrasions, burns, and the like, and that typically causes wincing, groaning, and escape-directed movements. Here ‘…is typically caused by pinpricks, abrasions, burns… and typically causes wincing, groaning, escape-directed movements’ expresses the condition associated with being in pain. Any properties whose instances satisfy this causal profile count as instances of pain, and the lower-order properties (or property instances) that satisfy that condition are said to realize pain.

Kim argues that realization physicalism is an unstable theory: either its commitment to Mental Realism and Antireductionism imply a rejection of Physicalism, or else its commitment to Physicalism and Mental Realism imply a rejection of Antireductionism. His argument trades on two assumptions.

First, Kim assumes that genuine properties are ones that make a causal difference to their bearers. We can distinguish between two senses of ‘property’. Properties in a broad or latitudinarian sense are roughly the ontological correlates of predicates. Properties in a narrow, causal sense, on the other hand, are properties in the broad sense that make a causal difference to their bearers. Hence, weighing 1 kg and weighing 2.2 pounds are different properties in the broad sense since they correspond to different predicates, but they are not different properties in the causal sense since they are necessarily coextensive and influence the causal relations into which their bearers enter in exactly the same ways. One might even do well to eliminate talk of broad properties altogether, says Kim (1998: Chapter 4), and speak instead simply of properties in the causal sense which are expressible by different predicates. Hence, there is a single (causal) property expressed by the predicates ‘weighs 1 kg’ and ‘weighs 2.2 pounds’.

Second, Kim assumes that if physicalism is true, the only genuine (i.e. causal) properties that exist are physical properties. Denying this, he says, would be tantamount to denying physicalism; it would be to accept the existence of “emergent causal powers: causal powers that magically emerge at a higher level” (1992: 326).

Given these assumptions, Kim poses the following difficulty for realization physicalists. According to Antireductionism, mental types are not identical to physical types. In that case, however, it is unclear how mental types could manage to be genuine properties. If Physicalism is true, then all causal properties are physical. This seems to imply a principle along the following lines (it is stated here without the qualifications Kim adds):

If a higher-order property M is realized by a lower-order property P, then the causal powers of this instance of M are identical to the causal powers of P.

Kim (1992: 326) calls this the ‘Causal Inheritance Principle’. This principle would appear to present realization physicalists with an uncomfortable choice. They could (a) deny the causal status of mental types; that is, they could reject Mental Realism and deny that mental types are genuine properties. Alternatively, they could (b) reject Physicalism; that is, they could endorse the causal status of mental types, but deny their causal status derives from the causal status of their physical realizers. Or finally, they could (c) endorse Mental Realism and Physicalism, and reject Antireductionism. Given the assumption that mental types are genuine properties, a commitment to Physicalism would imply that mental types are identical to physical types. This is the option Kim favors. Kim is nevertheless sympathetic with the idea that the mental types postulated by our current mental typology are multiply realizable relative to the physical types postulated by our current physical typologies. He argues, moreover, that R-disjunctive types cannot be natural kinds for reasons discussed in Section 3-a-iii-3. If those types are not natural kinds, however, then we have good reason to suppose that the mental types postulated by our current mental typology are not natural kinds either. Each of those mental types is necessarily coextensive with an R-disjunction, and no mental type can have causal powers beyond those of the individual disjuncts. If those disjuncts are causally dissimilar, then instances of the corresponding mental type must be causally dissimilar as well. Suppose, however, that causal similarity is necessary for natural kind status. In that case, it follows that the mental types postulated by our current mental typology cannot be natural kinds. Consequently, Kim favors the local reduction move discussed in Section 3-a-i. We need a new mental typology that postulates new narrow mental types that are correlated one-one with physical types.

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Author Information

William Jaworski
Email: jaworski@fordham.edu
Fordham University
U. S. A.




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