Analytic Perspectives in the Philosophy of Music

musical notesThe philosophy of music attempts to answer questions concerning the nature and value of musical practices. Contemporary analytic philosophy has tackled these issues in its characteristically piecemeal approach, and has revived interest in questions about the ontological nature of musical works, the experience of musical expressiveness, the value of music, and other considerations. Priority is normally granted to the philosophical clarification of pure (or absolute) music, that is, music that is not accompanied by lyrics or a program and is otherwise lacking any reference to extra-musical reality. This is because most of the puzzles in the philosophy of music arise with particular strength in the case of pure music. For instance, although it is easy to explain why we would describe as “sad” a song with lyrics conveying a sad story, it is harder to see why we would call a piece of instrumental music “sad.” Unless otherwise stated, the word “music” in this article refers to pure music, that is, instrumental music.

While it would be hard to point to uncontroversial solutions to any of these problems, this is not to deny that substantial conceptual clarifications have been made. In the case of musical expressiveness, a fundamental distinction has been traced, and is widely accepted, between the expression of emotions as the manifestation of psychological states and expressiveness as the mere presentation of the outward characteristics associated with emotions. Conflating the former with the latter gives rise to the mistaken assumption that emotional descriptions of music must refer to an actual emotional state either in the listener or perhaps in the composer.

The field of musical ontology is largely a reflection of debates in general ontology, although some issues are peculiar to the musical case. For instance, philosophers have debated whether the differences in appreciative focus across musical traditions warrant a different ontological characterisation of works in those traditions. Consider the case of rock music: the main focus is often the record as opposed to the live performance of the piece, which is arguably the critical focus in the Western classical tradition. This may suggest that we ought to construe the work of rock music as ontologically different from the work of classical music, as the former is a track, whereas the latter is a work for performance.

Finally, analytic philosophy of music has attempted to solve the riddle of musical value: how is pure music valuable to our lives if it makes no reference whatsoever to our world? The most original solutions to this problem have tried to show that it is precisely the music’s abstractness that explains its value and appeal.

Table of Contents

  1. Definitions of Music
    1. Definitional Proposals
    2. Related Issues
  2. Musical Expressiveness
    1. Two Basic Distinctions
    2. Accounts of Musical Expressiveness
      1. Arousal Theory
      2. Resemblance Theories
      3. Persona Theory
      4. Other Accounts
    3. Literalism vs. Metaphoricism
    4. Emotions Aroused by Music
      1. The Sceptical View
      2. Emotional Contagion
      3. Negative Emotions
  3. Ontology of Music
    1. Fundamental Ontology
      1. Nominalism
      2. Platonism
      3. Sceptical Views
    2. Comparative Ontology
      1. Rock
      2. Jazz
      3. A Sceptical View
    3. Performance Authenticity
  4. Musical Understanding
    1. Concatenationism
    2. Architectonicism
  5. Musical Value and Profundity
    1. Values of Music
    2. Profundity
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Definitions of Music

a. Definitional Proposals

In comparison to the extensive scrutiny devoted to the general definition of art, the definition of music has received little attention. One may be tempted to dismiss the need for a philosophical definition, as music textbooks routinely present definitions of music that are taken to be relatively uncontroversial. However, while music textbooks may be unanimous in defining music as sound sequences that present elements such as melody, harmony, and rhythm, none of these features is necessary for something to count as a piece of music. Moreover, the occurrence of melodic intervals and rhythmic patterns in natural contexts suggest that these features are also insufficient to make something music: there are melodic intervals in birdsong, pitched sounds produced by the howling of the wind, and rhythmic patterns in heartbeats, but none of these should count as music (at least under the reasonable assumption that music requires human agency).

Examine here are two prominent attempts at a definition of music, a sceptical view of those attempts, and issues broadly related to the definitional problem.

Jerrold Levinson starts from the intuitive notion that music is organized sound (“The Concept of Music” 269). While this may seem correct, it does not yield a definition with the intended scope, as it would include human speech, Morse code, animal calls, and countless other non-musical phenomena. A possibility is to amend the definition by specifying that the organized sounds in question are produced for the purpose of aesthetic appreciation. While this would exclude some of the examples mentioned above, it would also fail to include what are arguably central cases of music the purpose of which is not that of being appreciated aesthetically. This is the case for military music, some music accompanying ritual, at least some film music, and other instances of music in which its main function is not related to its aesthetic appreciation. The amended definition would also problematically include sound arts other than music, such as poetry. Levinson believes that these shortcomings may be resolved if we define the purpose of music as the enrichment or intensification of experience achieved through an active engagement with it, where the active engagement may include activities ranging from attentive listening, to dancing, and to marching to the music. Music for dancing, marching, or praying would thus be included in the definition, as our experience is heightened, intensified, or otherwise enriched by our active engagement with organized sounds. To this qualification we must add another one: in music we engage with sounds primarily as sounds. This further caveat is necessary to exclude cases such as spoken poetry, where our engagement with the sounds primarily aims at the linguistic meaning they convey. From these observations we arrive at a definition of music as “sounds temporally organized by a person for the purpose of enriching or intensifying experience through active engagement (for example, listening, dancing, performing) with the sounds regarded primarily, or in significant measure, as sounds” (“The Concept of Music” 273).

Against Levinson’s proposal, Andrew Kania observes that the above definition is too narrow (“Definition” 8). A musician’s daily practice of scales, or a violin tune played to startle a friend in the middle of the night, ought intuitively to count as music, yet they fail to meet the requirements set out by Levinson’s definition: scale practising is not meant to enrich or intensify experience, nor is one’s playing the violin to play a prank on a sleepy friend. More problematically, the whole category of Muzak is excluded by Levinson’s definition (by Levinson’s own admission), as Muzak is not produced with the purpose of enriching or intensifying experience, but rather with that of inducing a particular mood or attitude. Kania observes that this seems to confuse classificatory and evaluative issues: Muzak may be bad music, but it certainly is music.

These cases may tempt one to include in the definition features such as pitch and rhythm, as these may allow us to include the examples unduly excluded by Levinson. But to make these a necessary feature would make the definition too restrictive, in that it would exclude avant-garde music that lacks pitched sounds or a rhythm, such as Yoko Ono’s Toilet Piece (1971), which is constituted by the sound of a flushing toilet. Kania’s strategy to get out of this impasse is a disjunctive definition (“Definition” 12). His proposal reads as follows: “Music is (1) any event intentionally produced or organized (2) to be heard, and (3) either (a) to have some basic musical features, such as pitch or rhythm, or (b) to be listened to for such features” (Kania, “Definition” 11).

Note that the disjunction allows us to include both a musician’s practice routine, which meets condition 3(a), and cases such as Ono’s Toilet Piece, which lack such elements but presuppose that we would listen for such features, as they are typical of most music.

Against these attempts, Jonathan McKeown-Green has argued that definitions attempting to preserve our pre-theoretical intuitions as to what music is may fall short of providing what we reasonably expect from a definition of something. He suggests that definitions such as Kania’s and Levinson’s are ill-equipped to provide a “future-proof” definition of music, as further developments of current musical practices may change folk intuitions in such a way as to make their current definitions unable to include things that future folk intuitions would consider music. While McKeown-Green leaves open the possibility of future methodological refinements that may address these issues, his view casts a sceptical doubt on the definitional enterprise.

b. Related Issues

In addition to these disputes, which target clearly and specifically the definitional issue, other contributions address the question of what music is in more peripheral ways. For instance, Stephen Davies ("John Cage's 4’ 33””) and Julian Dodd ("What 4’ 33” Is”) discuss the issue of whether silent pieces, such as John Cage’s famous 4’ 33”, should indeed count as music. While they both hold it should not, and prefer to classify it as a non-musical work for performance, they disagree about the nature of the work. According to Davies, 4’ 33” contains the environmental sounds that occur while it is being performed—he compares this to “an empty picture frame that is presented by an artist who specifies that her artwork is whatever can be seen through it” (459). Against this, Dodd holds that the work is merely about those environmental sounds. For, if the work is a work of performance art—something Davies grants—then it is impossible for it to include, as part of its content, sound events that are not performed by the work’s performers (6–8).

Other philosophers have focused on the distinction between natural and musical sounds, or, more generally, non-musical and musical sounds. Roger Scruton (19) distinguishes the latter two by the way we listen to them: we attend to non-musical sounds causally, as we are interested in the sounds’ sources, whereas musical sounds are listened to acousmatically, that is, independently from their sources.

John Andrew Fisher considers causal listening a possibility both in the case of musical sounds and natural sounds, but he draws the distinction between the two by specifying that they are produced by different objects: whereas natural sounds are produced by ecologically natural objects, musical sounds are produced by artefactual objects, such as musical instruments (“The Value of Natural Sounds”). This distinction grounds the otherness that is typical of natural sounds and the experience of inevitability that is associated with them. Additionally, Fisher characterises natural sounds as being attentionally unframed (a natural soundscape does not prescribe privileged focus on a foreground, whereas this happens regularly in the musical case), temporally unframed (a natural soundscape does not have a beginning, midpoint, or end), and unrepeatable (unlike most musical works) (“What the Hills Are Alive With”).

John Dyck has challenged both Scruton and Fisher’s accounts, on the ground that they leave unexplained the way in which natural and musical sounds coexist in sound art. Consider for instance works such as Jon Hopkins and King Creosote’s album Diamond Mine (2011), in which musical moments unfold over a background of environmental sounds. In mixed contexts such as this, we cannot appeal to incompatible ways of listening (causal vs. acousmatic) or incompatible standards of evaluation (attentionally and temporally unframed vs. framed). In other words, a suitable account of the distinction should not explain just the difference between the two types of sounds, but also their interaction. Dyck proposes the following dual distinction: natural and musical sounds differ causally, in that the former are caused by natural objects, the latter by artefactual objects, and acousmatically, in that the former “tend to have a greater variation of microtones, microrhythms, and microtimbres than human environments” (Dyck 298).

2. Musical Expressiveness

a. Two Basic Distinctions

Discussions of musical expressiveness are likely to begin by distinguishing between expressing an emotion and being expressive of an emotion. The distinction is standard since at least Kivy (The Corded Shell, 1980), although it can be found earlier in Tormey (1971). Expressing an emotion means to outwardly manifest a felt emotional state. For instance, I feel sad and express my sadness by weeping and being downcast. For something to be expressive of an emotion, on the other hand, means merely to display the outward manifestations of such an emotion. For instance, a Saint Bernard’s face is expressive of sadness because its snout presents the drooping features associated with sadness, although the dog may be perfectly happy. Similarly, an actor’s behaviour on the stage over the course of a play is expressive of a number of emotions without the actor necessarily going through these emotions himself. This opposition distinguishes expressive contexts that require an actual emotional state—my behaviour is expressing sadness only if I am actually sad—from expressive contexts that do not require such a state—for the actor and the Saint Bernard to look sad, nobody needs to feel actual sadness. Contemporary analytic philosophers are inclined to take music to be an example of the latter case. While the emotions expressed by the music may often be related to actual emotions—such as when listening to a sad song leads us to feel sad—the music is expressive of emotions independently of anyone’s felt emotional state.

Another important, related distinction is between the emotions in the music and those in the listener. Lay people are inclined to confuse conceptually (if not phenomenologically) the emotions aroused by the music with the emotions expressed by the music. Consider this example: a happy song at a party makes someone feel cheerful. The lonely guy in the corner hears the cheerfulness of the song too, yet his depressed mood isn’t affected by it. Or if it is, the music’s happiness may even be a source of frustration. The contrast is between happiness as a state the music induces in the listener and happiness as a state attributed to the music itself. Section 2.b deals with accounts of the latter phenomenon, whereas section 2.c examines philosophical issues related to the former.

b. Accounts of Musical Expressiveness

i. Arousal Theory

While the previous section distinguishes the music’s emotional expressiveness from emotional arousal, an elegant view describes the former as an instance of the latter. In its crudest form, the idea explains the music’s expressiveness of an emotion in terms of the music’s disposition to arouse such an emotional state in a listener. This is the arousal theory of musical expressiveness.

In this basic form, the theory is doomed to failure. On the one hand, some listeners who perceive the music’s expressive character deny ever being moved to feel such emotions themselves. On the other hand, the emotions a piece of music has a disposition to arouse may differ from those we ascribe to the music itself—think again of the guy in the corner, who was frustrated by the music’s happiness. Additionally, the theory cannot explain the way in which expressiveness contributes to the music’s value: if expressiveness is reduced to emotional arousal, then a suitable emotion-inducing drug could supply whatever value is provided by the music’s expressive character. This goes against the intuition that the value of a musical piece’s expressiveness is intrinsically linked to the music and could not be retrieved otherwise. Finally, the arousal theory fails to explain why we would listen to music that is expressive of fear, anguish, or other negative state: if these expressive properties were to be analysed as the music’s disposition to arouse similar emotional states in us, we would probably refrain from listening to such music altogether (more about this in section 2.d.iii).

Derek Matravers defends a version of the arousal theory that he believes capable of facing these difficulties. He claims that the emotions aroused by music are not full-blown emotions, but rather feelings, as they are deprived of the cognitive component typical of emotions. Moreover, Matravers denies that the feeling aroused by the music is always, and only, the one ascribed to the music. Rather, the listener’s emotional response may vary, as does our emotional response to emotions in human beings. Sad music, for instance, is music which normally arouses emotional responses of the sort that would constitute an appropriate reaction to someone’s expression of sadness. These responses are arguably limited, but certainly are not restricted to sadness only. We may for instance appropriately react to sadness with compassion or pity.

While Matravers’ work remains a classic reading in contemporary analytic philosophy of music, his view is normally deemed incapable of solving at least some of the problems that threaten cruder versions of the arousal theory. Justine Kingsbury observes how in other contexts we hardly ever run together the expression of an emotion (or feeling) and its arousal. One may be saddened by other people’s happiness, or worried by someone’s continuous expressions of anger, or feel some sort of Schadenfreude when confronted with expressions of distress. Given the commonplace nature of the conceptual distinction between emotional expression and arousal, it would be weird to think that these should be analysed as equivalent in the musical case.

Matravers would presumably respond to this objection by saying that the two cases are akin as in both cases the appropriate response to emotional expression is an emotional response. We react with sadness (or pity) to someone’s sadness, and we react to sad music in a similar way. But this reply would need to deal with Kingsbury’s other objection: on what grounds can Matravers disqualify as inappropriate the reaction of the listener who does not feel appropriate emotional reactions to sad music? While there are reasons to describe as appropriate the emotional reaction to the misery of another human being, it is unclear in what sense the expressive character of inanimate objects such as musical works requires or invites an emotional reaction.

ii. Resemblance Theories

Resemblance theories of musical expressiveness hold that the music’s expressive properties are due to their resemblance to human expressive behaviour. This is probably the most widely supported philosophical theory of musical expressiveness, and it was first independently proposed by both Stephen Davies (“The Expression of Emotion in Music”) and Peter Kivy (The Corded Shell).

While the two versions of the theory are often discussed together, it is worth stressing their differences. In order to do so, I consider Kivy’s theory first, and then move on to Davies’. After that, I consider objections raised against both views.

The resemblance theory defended by Kivy is known as the contour theory of musical expressiveness. It owes its name to the intuition that the reason why music is expressive of emotions is to be found in the resemblance between melodic contour and human emotional prosody. In other words, music expressive of sadness sounds like human speech when we are in the grip of sadness, and so it acquires its expressive character. According to Kivy, resemblances between music and human behaviour are not limited to vocal behaviour, but also include resemblances to bodily behaviour. Music that is sad moves downwards and slowly, whereas happy music is sprightly and often proceeds by leaps.

According to Kivy, resemblance is not the only source of musical expressiveness. He claims that it is impossible to make sense of the expressive character of some elements of the Western musical tradition on the grounds of their resemblance to human expressive behaviour. His example is that of major and minor chords, which do not resemble in any salient way the vocal or bodily behaviour of happy and sad people, yet are consistently described as happy and sad respectively. Kivy’s solution is to assume that some musical features acquire their expressive character by convention (The Corded Shell 80). This is not unproblematic: how could we successfully establish the conventional connection between sadness and minor chords if these sounded entirely neutral at first?

Davies’ theory is named by its author appearance emotionalism. It holds that music is expressive because it resembles emotion characteristics in appearance, that is, the outward manifestations of human emotions. Davies is inclined to stress the importance of the music’s resemblance to human bodily expressive behaviour, as opposed to vocal (“Artistic Expression” 182). The theory shares with Kivy’s contour theory the idea that music’s expressive character depends on its resemblance to human expressive behaviour and is independent from any actual emotion in the composer or in the listener. Davies points out three main differences between his view and Kivy’s (Musical Meaning 260–267). First, he denies that music, strictly speaking, expresses emotions, as it merely presents the aural appearance of expressive behaviour, and this does not warrant talk of expression. Second, he concedes that music may express Platonic attitudes, that is, emotional states that require an object, such as admiration, pride, or hope. According to Davies, this may be achieved by suitably long and complex musical passages, which convey the succession of feelings and behavioural components typical of such attitudes. Third, Davies claims that music may be about the emotion it expresses, whereas Kivy holds to the formalist view that music isn’t about anything at all. While emotion characteristics in appearance do not by themselves refer to the emotion they are expressive of, they may do so in the appropriate context. Think of using a picture of a Saint Bernard’s sad-looking face to show how you are feeling. In this case, the emotion characteristic in appearance presented by the picture would be referring to your emotional state. Likewise, music can be about the emotions it presents.

A historical note: the intuition that the music’s expressive power lies in its resemblance to human expressive behaviour is an old one and can be traced back to Plato. The resemblance theories proposed by Kivy and Davies advance this idea while at the same time detaching it from the assumption that the emotions in the music had to be related to actual emotional states either in the listener or in the composer. In this resides their main element of novelty.

Resemblance theories have been criticised on numerous grounds. Various commentators have argued that, while they may correctly characterise resemblance to human expressive behaviour as (part of) the explanation of why we hear music as expressive of emotions, they fail to characterise the experience of musical expressiveness (see Levinson “Musical Expressiveness” 195–199, and Matravers ch. 7).

Additionally, Levinson has argued against Davies that appearance emotionalism is unable to describe what would count as the musical presentation of emotion characteristics: “(w)e can give content to ‘sad human appearance’ by glossing it as ‘the appearance sad humans typically display.’ But we can’t analogously give content to ‘sad musical appearance.’ There is no such thing as the appearance or kind of appearance that sad music typically displays” (“Musical Expressiveness” 197).

iii. Persona Theory

Levinson has defended the view that musical expressiveness is essentially the expression of a fictional musical agent, or “persona.” His assumption is that expressiveness can make sense only if it is reduced to some kind of expression: the puzzle of expressiveness is to understand how it is possible for some objects deprived of a psychological life, such as works of music, to be described as possessing psychological properties like happiness or sadness. The riddle is readily solved if we postulate that whenever we hear expressive music, we are hearing it as the expression of emotions in music of a fictional musical agent.

Critics of Levinson’s view tend to stress how competent listeners seem to be able to detect and appreciate the music’s expressive character without any imaginative engagement with a fictional agent they hear in the music (Davies, “Artistic Expression” 189). Levinson’s reply to this is that these processes may often not be conscious. A second, more radical objection to the persona theory holds that, even granting for the sake of the argument that we do in fact hear music as the expression of fictional individuals, a piece of pure music is typically unable to constrain a plausible and coherent narrative about its development. Is the work the expression of a single persona or multiple ones? Is the dialogue between the strings and winds a fight between two imaginary agents or the internal struggle of a single one? In other words, a work of music underdetermines the coherent narratives in terms of musical personae it may elicit. The problem with this is that it is unlikely that all of these narratives will result in a similar verdict with regard to the piece’s expressive character (Davies, “Artistic Expression” 190).

iv. Other Accounts

Jenefer Robinson, in her Deeper than Reason, is noteworthy for the attention she devotes to empirical research on emotions, as well as for her attempt to develop a notion of expressiveness that could be applied to art forms other than music. According to Robinson, highly expressive works of art allow the appreciator to feel what it is like to be in the emotional state the work is expressive of (see, for instance, Robinson 290).

Unlike Levinson, Robinson does not believe that all expressiveness requires an expressing persona. She contends, however, that some music in the Western canon invites such a listening. Relatedly, it is also noteworthy that Robinson is willing to make concessions to the discredited expression theory of expressiveness, according to which a work of art’s expressive properties are due to its creator’s emotional state. As it is, this theory is untenable: we know that artists have created exuberant and joyful works while being depressed, and it is in any case unlikely that an artist will remain in a single emotional state throughout the creation of a complex work of art such as a symphony. Robinson concedes, however, that some musical works, particularly those in the Romantic tradition, may present an emotional state felt by their authors (325). In these cases, we may be justified in identifying the persona in the music as the work’s author.

Charles Nussbaum has defended a sophisticated version of the arousal theory built around the idea that we form a mental representation of a musical work as a virtual terrain. Just like the ordinary space surrounding us, musical space offers affordances, that is, action possibilities. On this view, the arousal of feelings by music is due to off-line motor states that the music puts us into in virtue of our spatial representation of the musical surface (214). Nussbaum’s theory is ambitious and has probably not yet received the sustained consideration it deserves. Some critics have doubted if it could fend off standard objections to cruder versions of the arousal theory (see for instance Trivedi 47–48).

Saam Trivedi in 2017 defended an imaginationist account of musical expressiveness. According to him, the experience of musical expression centrally involves imagination, although it may do so in different ways. The basic way we use imagination in relation to music is to imagine the music itself as a sentient being expressing its emotional states, but other types of imaginative engagement are available (133–139). For instance, we could imagine that the music is the expression of emotions of an indeterminate persona, or that we are ourselves in the emotional states the music is expressive of (139–143).

c. Literalism vs. Metaphoricism

A debate parallel to that concerning musical expressiveness is the one regarding the status of our descriptions of music in emotional terms. When we describe music as “‘sad,” “happy,” and the like, are we speaking literally or, rather, using metaphors in order to grasp aspects of the music that we cannot quite describe in literal terms? The former option is dubbed literalism, whereas the latter can be called metaphoricism.

An early metaphoricist proposal is the one by Nelson Goodman. He claimed that music metaphorically exemplifies expressive properties (85). Suppose you have a new suit made. The tailor shows you swatches of fabric to let you choose your preferred colour and material. The swatches possess a variety of properties, but exemplify only some of them—for instance, they exemplify colour and thickness, but not size. A way to put this is to say that exemplification is possession plus reference. Goodman builds his account of expressiveness on this basic notion of exemplification, with the relevant difference that expressive properties, unlike properties such as colour or size, are not literally possessed by inanimate objects. In the case of expressiveness, then, exemplification is reference to a property that is metaphorically possessed by an object. For instance, a work of music is expressive of sadness if it refers to the property of sadness that it possesses metaphorically.

Goodman’s view has been frequently criticised, especially for the rather obscure notion of metaphoric possession that is central to it (see for instance Davies, Musical Meaning 145–150).

Roger Scruton holds common descriptions of music in spatial and emotional terms to be irreducibly metaphorical. They are metaphorical because they describe in spatial terms something that is not literally extended in space and in emotional and psychological terms something that has no mental states. These metaphors cannot be paraphrased into literal statements, yet they are indispensable because they describe the way in which we imaginatively engage with music. This claim receives support from Scruton’s broader account of musical understanding (see section 4; see Trivedi 67–72 for criticism of Scruton’s metaphoricism).

Against these theorists, Stephen Davies defends a literalist position (“Music and Metaphor”). His strategy is to appeal to the secondary meaning taken by emotion terms when they are used to describe the outward manifestations of emotions. For instance, we may describe a tragic mask as “sad,” and by this we would mean not that the mask is in some actual state of sadness, but rather that it displays the physiognomy associated with sadness. Emotional descriptions of music work in a similar way. When we call a piece of music “sad,” we are using the term in the secondary sense referring to the outward manifestations of sadness, its behavioural correlates, rather than in the primary sense referring to a psychological state. Davies clarifies his view by stressing that the connection between the two uses of the word “sad” (the psychological one, and the behavioural one) is not one of mere homonymy (as in the use of “bank” to indicate both a financial institution and a riverside), but rather an instance of polysemy, that is, of distinct but related meanings (as in the use of “mole” to refer to both a burrowing animal and an undercover agent).

d. Emotions Aroused by Music

There are two main issues related to the emotions aroused by music in listeners. The first is the question as to whether instrumental music may arouse emotions (at least some emotions) and how it may do so. The second is the question as to whether any of these emotions are relevant to the appreciation of music qua music.

i. The Sceptical View

I start from a sceptical view of emotional arousal defended by Peter Kivy (Music Alone ch. 8). While he does not deny that listening to music regularly arouses garden-variety emotions (happiness, sadness, and so on), Kivy denies that any emotion of this sort is relevant to the appreciation or understanding of music as music. This apparently sweeping claim is best understood in light of Kivy’s preferred theory of emotions, that is, a cognitive theory according to which emotions always come with a feeling-state component, an intentional object, and an appropriate belief. Pure music is deprived of the propositional content or extra-musical references necessary to supply a relevant intentional object and belief. So music alone cannot arouse such emotions in us. However, music often gives rise to all sorts of idiosyncratic associations in the listener’s mind. It is these that, according to Kivy, provide the material necessary to the arousal of happiness, sadness, and the like. It is a short step from here to a sceptical position: if garden-variety emotions are aroused by music because of associated content brought to mind by the listening experience, then it is, properly speaking, that content that does the arousal and not the music. Moreover, if the emotional arousal in question is prompted by content that is contingently related to the piece that calls it to mind, then the emotions aroused are irrelevant to the appreciation of the piece. They may in fact be of a completely different character to two different listeners who associate different contents with the piece in question.

There is only one sort of emotion that, according to Kivy, is connected to our appreciation of music. Unsurprisingly, this emotion fits the cognitive view of emotions in that it has an intentional object and a corresponding belief. More precisely, this nameless emotion is one that takes the music as an object and, correspondingly, the belief that the piece is beautiful, well-crafted, skilful, and so forth. Among the properties of the piece that may give rise to such emotional response are also expressive properties. A sad musical work may be beautifully sad, that is, it may express sadness in particularly poignant and well-suited musical means. But this is not to say that the appreciation of such a characteristic is going to arouse sadness in us. Rather, the emotion aroused in these cases is the very same nameless emotion mentioned earlier, a response that takes the music as an object and is sustained by the belief that the music is skilfully, beautifully, and powerfully expressive.

ii. Emotional Contagion

Against the sceptical view, some philosophers hold that arousal of garden-variety emotions is possible without the aid of extra-musical associations. Particularly, those who hold a more liberal view than Kivy’s are inclined to think that music may arouse in the listener the emotions it expresses as happens in the case of emotional contagion from music to listener. This is the position defended by Stephen Davies, who rejects the cognitive theory of emotions. While some emotions may fall neatly in the template described by the cognitive theory, others do not. For instance, we may experience an objectless anxiety or a phobia that lacks the support of any relevant belief. Emotional contagion from music to listener is another example: we catch the music’s emotional state, but the music is not the intentional object of our emotional response (we are not sad about the music, but merely saddened by it; Davies, “Emotional Contagion” 51–52)

Jenefer Robinson’s view is similar to Davies’ in that she holds music to be capable of arousing emotional responses of a mirroring sort. However, she is critical of Davies’s description of the arousal process. In particular, she claims that Davies is mistaken in holding that emotional contagion is the result of a listener’s experience of musical expressiveness (392). According to Robinson, things are quite the opposite, as music is able to induce the emotional states it expresses both before we may realise it expresses them and independently from our capacity to do so. From this point of view, Davies’ description of the mirroring process (or emotional contagion) is unduly heavy on the cognitive side, as it describes contagion as dependent on the listener’s capacity to recognize the music’s expressive character.

Robinson provides an intriguing and empirically informed account of the contagion process. First, music expressive of e may elicit psychological and physiological changes typical of certain moods. Subsequently, the listener may latch onto environmental cues that may supply an intentional object to her emotion. For instance, I may be listening to a happy piece of music, and this may arouse a cheerful mood in me. The mood will convert into a full-blown emotion of happiness when I see something on my desk that reminds me of a friend who is far away but who I will soon get to see. Robinson calls this process the “Jazzercise” effect (391).

Davies is sceptical regarding both Robinson’s objection and her account of the contagion process. Against the worry that he may give too prominent a role to the listener’s recognition of the music’s expressive character, he replies that he does not rule out what he calls “non-attentional contagion,” that is, the unconscious, emotional attuning to expressive features of the environment. He merely believes this to be less central a case than its attentional counterpart (Davies, “Emotional Contagion” 56).

Davies’ criticism of Robinson’s Jazzercise effect questions whether this is a genuine case of contagion from music to listener. If the music merely occasions physiological changes and the corresponding objectless mood, and if these need to be supplemented by environmental cues in order to result in the arousal of an emotion, then the object of our emotion is whatever feature of the environment aroused it. In the above example, if the happiness is prompted by seeing the picture on my desk, then it would seem that we are in the presence of a standard emotion of the cognitive sort, one that does not take the music as an object. (Davies, “Emotional Contagion” 58–60).

iii. Negative Emotions

Recall that one of the standard objections against the arousal theory questions the willingness of listeners to put themselves in negative emotional states by listening to music expressive of such states. And, as we have seen, various philosophers who reject the arousal theory claim nonetheless that music may in fact arouse in the listener the emotions it expresses. It then remains to be seen how they justify the listener’s toleration of, or even attraction to, deeply sad music, if such music has the disposition to arouse in them the negative emotional states it expresses. I examine two prominent answers to this problem.

Levinson considers the music’s expressive character as capable of arousing in the listener the feeling component of emotional states. This falls short of what is required to have a full-blown emotional state, which would require an intentional object and a relevant belief. It is exactly this that makes the musical arousal of emotions a rewarding experience, as the absence of the usual contextual implications for our lives of negative states allows us to relish and explore the phenomenological aspect of these emotions, that is, the feeling component aroused by the music. As Levinson puts it, “(w)e become cognoscenti of feeling, savoring the qualitative aspect of emotional life for its own sake” (“Music and Negative Emotions” 324).

Levinson further claims that additional benefits may be available to the listeners who imaginatively engage with the feeling component aroused by the music and imagine to be themselves in a full-blown state of despair, sadness, or any other negative emotion (“Music and Negative Emotions” 326–329).

Davies is drawn to a more modest but perhaps more effective solution. He observes how many human activities that are valuable and sought after possess an intrinsically unpleasant or painful element—think of weight training or running. Listening to music expressive of negative emotions is one such activity: one of the ways in which we listen to music with understanding is by reacting emotionally to its expressive character, such as when we are made cheerful by happy music or sad by sad music. Because he describes the negative emotional response to sad music as an integral response of our understanding of such music, Davies avoids characterising negative emotional responses as something we endure in order to pursue some goal. He writes: “The response is not an incidental accompaniment but rather something integral to the understanding achieved. It is not something with which one puts up for the sake of understanding; it is an element of that understanding” (Davies, Musical Meaning 312).

3. Ontology of Music

Philosophical reflection on the ontological status of music has tackled three main problems: the fundamental ontological nature of musical works, the possible differences in ontological status of works belonging to different musical traditions, and the issue of what counts as an authentic instance of a piece. The three following sections examine these issues.

a. Fundamental Ontology

We know that the Mona Lisa is a canvas in a large room in the Louvre; likewise, we know that the Palazzo Vecchio is a building in Piazza della Signoria in Florence. These objects seem relatively easy to locate and classify. Musical works, however, are elusive entities. Where is Bach’s Musical Offering, and what kind of thing is it?

Fundamental ontology is mainly concerned with the question as to what sort of entity musical works are, that is, to what ontological category they belong. Dodd calls this the categorial question (“Musical Works” 1114). Are works of music collections of particulars, or are they types that are instantiated by various performances?

Alongside this basic question, musical ontology addresses what Dodd has named the individuation and the persistence questions (“Musical Works” 1114–1116). The former deals with identity conditions: when are we to consider two works as the same? Is identity of notation sufficient? Should we include historical factors, such as its date of composition? The persistence question, on the other hand, concerns a musical work’s coming into being as well as its possible destruction. Do composers create works, or do works exist prior to their composition, in which case they are merely discovered? And under what circumstances, if any, would a musical piece cease to exist?

Views of musical ontology are normally grouped according to the way in which they answer the categorial question—a practice I follow here. However, it is worth observing that pre-theoretical intuitions regarding a work’s identity and its creation or discovery are often decisive in accounting for a philosopher’s preference for one ontological category over another.

i. Nominalism

An early proposal advanced by Nelson Goodman is that we should consider a musical work to be a collection of particulars and, more specifically, as a set including all of the work’s correct performances. This view is appealing to those who, like Goodman, intend to avoid commitment to entities other than particulars. However, it runs into rather obvious problems. First, nominalism seems to convert contingent facts regarding a work’s performances into facts about the work of music they are performances of. For instance, suppose I write a piece of music for guitar this afternoon. I then perform it three times, but every time my performance contains a wrong note on bar 8, as the passage exceeds my technical abilities. The nominalist view would seem forced to draw the absurd conclusion that the piece itself contains a wrong note, as the composition exists only as the set of my three defective performances. Alternatively, the nominalist might embrace the equally counterintuitive view that the work in question has never been performed, for all of the available performances are defective and so do not really count as performances of the work.

A second, even more serious worry, takes the form of a modal objection. It is arguably contingent for a work of music to have been performed a certain number of times. There is a possible world in which Thelonious Monk’s Straight, No Chaser has been performed two more times than it has in ours, and others in which it has been performed eight times fewer. But if we construe works of music as sets, a problem arises, for sets necessarily have just the members they do. The incapacity of accounting for this modal characteristic of the relation between a work and its performances seems to doom the nominalist project to failure.

ii. Platonism

Kivy has proposed what may be considered the most elegant way to account for the relation between a work and its performances. He suggests that the musical work is an eternal type and is realised in its various performances (Kivy, “Platonism in Music”).

This view has been questioned by Levinson, who stresses its inability to account for two rather central intuitions regarding musical works (“What a Musical Work Is” 65–78). First, we would consider two pieces identical in their sound structure but composed at different times to be two different pieces. This intuition is arguably grounded in the different properties we would ascribe to these two pieces (the earlier piece may be ground-breaking, the later one scholastic). Kivy’s view does not respect this intuition, as it identifies musical works with their sound structure and would therefore consider the two pieces to be identical. Second, we consider composers as the creators of the pieces they compose, whereas Kivy’s view holds that composers merely discover pre-existing sound structures.

Jerrold Levinson has suggested his alternative proposal that it is to better accommodate these intuitions. Consider first a non-musical example: the case of the Tarte Tatin. While this type of cake is certainly instantiated by a variety of tokens, it does not serve our intuitions well to hold that this model has always existed in the Platonic realm of eternal forms alongside mathematical entities and the like. The Tarte Tatin is a repeatable entity that was created at some point in time by someone who specified its ingredients, preparation, and so on. The case of musical works may be ontologically akin to the one just presented. We need to make sense of a musical piece as something that has been specified in its sound structure and performance means by some agent at a certain time. Levinson calls this ontological category an indicated type (“What a Musical Work Is” 79). More precisely, a musical work as a sound/performance means structure-as-indicated-by-X-at-t. This characterisation of a piece’s ontological nature is also capable of accounting for the two intuitions mentioned above: the intuition that we should consider as separate works two pieces with an identical sound structure but composed at different times in the history of music and the intuition that musical works are created rather than discovered.

Julian Dodd in 2007 revived the standard Platonist view, according to which musical works pre-exist their composition (“Works of Music”). I focus here on his rejection of Levinson’s arguments. Dodd’s first point concerns Levinson’s claim that a full-fledged Platonist view would fail to make sense of our intuition that composers, in composing a work, engage in a creative process. Dodd takes this objection to conflate the psychological notion of creativity with the metaphysical claim that something is created by composers. While the view that composers are creative is arguably correct, this view is simply expressing the idea that composers are engaging in a creative process, not that they are bringing something into existence. Dodd considers discoveries in the field of mathematics or logic as a useful parallel to the musical case: we do not deny that Pythagoras was a creative individual, even though we may well hold that the theorem that bears his name is an abstract entity that pre-existed its discovery by the Greek mathematician.

Dodd’s second objection to Levinson’s account questions its capacity to strike the intended compromise between the type/token view and our intuition that musical works are created. Indicated types, Dodd observes, are just as problematic as their non-indicated cousins in that they also pre-exist their discovery. Levinson is making the mistake of considering the impossibility of a type’s instantiation as equivalent to the type’s non-existence. But this is metaphysically suspicious, to say the least. As Dodd exemplifies, the type “child born in 1999” could not have been instantiated in the year 1066, yet we would not consider this as a reason to deny its existence in 1066. Ditto for works of music as indicated types. But if indicated types also pre-exist the act of composition, it would seem that we fall back into the idea that musical works are discovered rather than created.

iii. Sceptical Views

In a famous study, Lydia Goehr claimed that the concept of musical work we are familiar with appeared only in the 19th century, as earlier musical practice had looser criteria regarding a piece of music’s identity as well as a more diluted conception of authorship. For instance, scores were less precise in indicating embellishments and performance dynamics—if they did so at all. According to Goehr, this shows how the search for a fundamental ontological category is mistaken when it comes to a culturally variable and historically mutable practice such as music making.

Goehr’s dismissal of musical ontology isn’t typically welcomed by analytic philosophers of music. For instance, Stephen Davies observes that Goehr’s examples show that pieces of music composed prior to 1800 may have had a higher degree of indeterminacy in that they left more choices to the performer. But this falls short of supporting the view that the composers of such pieces were not creating works of music of a sort ontologically akin to those composed later on (Davies, Musical Works 123).

b. Comparative Ontology

Often referred to as “higher-order ontology,” comparative ontology explores alleged differences in the sort of musical works characteristic at the centre of different musical genres. By way of example, I present here two debates concerning the correct ontological characterisation of works in two musical traditions: rock and jazz.

i. Rock

Theodore Gracyk pioneered philosophical reflection on rock music with his monograph Rhythm and Noise (1996). He argues that records are the primary artistic object produced by rock artists as they represent the focus of appreciation for rock fans and critics. While Gracyk is ready to concede that rock musicians also create songs, he denies to songs the central critical place he accords to records. The view he puts forward construes the rock tradition as fundamentally different from the classical one, as in the latter the object of attention is the work as determined by the score, quite apart from its instantiations. In the rock tradition, on the contrary, the particular manifestation of the song found on the relevant recording is the ultimate object of critical attention.

Stephen Davies agrees with Gracyk that works in the rock tradition rely heavily on studio wizardry, but he is unwilling to give up the idea that rock pieces are works for performance. After all, some rock bands only exist as garage bands, playing small venues and never recording their songs, while other major bands play a song live for quite some time before recording an album version. According to Davies, we can make sense of these practices if we describe rock songs as works for studio performance (as opposed to works for live performance, such as the works in the Western classical tradition). What distinguishes works for studio performance is that they are created with the studio as a privileged performance venue, as the studio allows the manipulation of the musical material that, as shown by Gracyk, is so central to the rock tradition (Davies, Musical Works).

In this way, Davies is able to accommodate the important intuition that there could be performances of rock works—rather than just playbacks of the relevant tracks—while still preserving the strength of Gracyk’s claim that studio production plays a paramount role in the sonic identity of rock pieces.

A fundamental difference between this view and Gracyk’s is that Davies intends to stress the continuity between rock and classical music: both traditions produce works for performance, although with different performance contexts in mind.

Christopher Bartel argues that both Gracyk and Davies are mistaken in considering the record as the primary object of appreciation. Grounding his claim on evidence concerning appreciative practices, he argues that several artists in the rock scene are appreciated for their skills as performers or songwriters. As an illustration of this, consider the contrast between the two hard rock bands Led Zeppelin and Deep Purple. These two iconic bands produced their most important records around the same time and played a relatively similar kind of music. However, while the first is appreciated for the polished, layered, and modern character of the tracks they recorded, the latter is considered by fans to be at its finest as a live band. Yet other rock artists are credited for the songs they have written over and above their value as performers or recording artists—Leonard Cohen being a case in point. Bartel concludes that “there are (at least) three practices central to the rock tradition, and musicians will place varying degree of emphasis on each” (153).

ii. Jazz

Various philosophers have examined the ontological peculiarity of jazz, with particular focus on the nature of jazz standards. Here I focus mainly on a debate between Andrew Kania and Julian Dodd.

Kania claims that jazz standards cannot fit the standard token/type ontology that seems apt to describe the relation between a work and its instantiations typical of the Western classical tradition. Jazz, according to Kania, is a workless musical tradition (“All Play and No Work”). While the claim may appear counterintuitive, Kania holds that no available realist view about jazz works could make sense of jazz performance practice. Kania offers three main reasons in favour of his view.

First, he argues that variation in the performance of a standard is too great to identify a core musical material that is common to every performance of that standard. Jazz standards, it would seem, cannot be located in the way works in the classical tradition can. Second, and relatedly, jazz standards do not constrain performance as classical Western works do. Third, Kania claims that jazz standards are not the focus of critical attention. Rather, it is their performances, and their improvisational elements in particular, that are normally subject to the greatest critical scrutiny. This is in stark contrast with what happens in the Western classical tradition, in which the work is the focus of attention.

Against Kania, Dodd holds jazz standards to be ontologically akin to works in the classical tradition. While they may be ontologically thinner, in that performers have more freedom with regard to the piece’s structure, instrumentation, length, and other features, works of jazz are repeatable works, the identities of which are grounded in instructions for performance determined by the composers. Central to Dodd’s rebuttal of Kania’s view is the idea that performance authenticity plays a more peripheral role in jazz than in classical music: we are interested mainly in what musicians do with a standard rather than in their correct performance of it, but this is not to say that the standard is ontologically different from works in the classical tradition (Dodd, “Upholding Standards”).

iii. A Sceptical View

Consider the pluralist view of rock ontology proposed by Bartel in 2017 and summarised above. It is a short step from the acceptance of this sort of pluralism to a full-fledged scepticism with regard to the enterprise of comparative ontology. For if there is no entity that is accorded pride of place when it comes to the appreciation and evaluation of rock music, then perhaps the whole idea of exploring the nature of the rock work rests on the mistaken assumption that there is one such thing. Lee B. Brown has suggested just that. He argues that, both in rock and jazz, what we have are multiple directions of critical and appreciative interest, and no ontological investigation could possibly identify a single ontological category as critically privileged without abandoning a descriptivist approach. He writes: “The truth is that rock history has not depos­ited any well-entrenched concept of the work of rock music” (174).

c. Performance Authenticity

Agreement concerning the fundamental nature of musical works does not imply agreement with regard to how they are correctly instantiated in performances. This section examines answers to the question as to what counts as a correct performance of a piece. In examining this issue, philosophers of music have mainly taken as a point of reference the tradition, starting in the 20th century, of historically informed music performance. Broadly construed, this tradition holds that pieces of music ought to be performed in a way sensitive to the period in which they were composed. While versions of this thesis are widely accepted in musical practice, philosophers and musicologists have debated the justification of such approaches.

As with other issues in the field, Kivy has been one of the earliest and most influential contributors, with a monograph on the topic (Authenticities). His book appeared in the same year as musicologist Richard Taruskin’s seminal Text and Act (1995), and both works share a degree of scepticism regarding the philological reconstruction of the original sound of past music. Particularly, they share the intuition that the self-proclaimed objective, evidence-based treatment of performance and instrumentation choices, is an attempt to remove a central aspect from music-making, at least in the Western classical tradition, that is, the contribution to a piece of the performer’s interpretation of it. Kivy describes this as an unfortunate trade-off between personal authenticity and other kinds of authenticity, particularly sonic authenticity, which is defined as the attempt at replicating the sound of past performances.

Recall that Levinson considers musical works to be structures comprising both sounds and performance means. As a consequence of this view, Levinson holds an instrumentalist position with regard to the instantiation of a work: a work of music is correctly instantiated only if it is performed with the musical instruments (or, more generally, performance means) prescribed by its score.

Stephen Davies distinguishes between ontologically thick and thin works of music (Musical Works). Thin works are comparatively less specific in prescribing performance means and other properties of a correct performance, whereas thicker works leave relatively less freedom to the performer. As an example, popular songs in the American songbook are thinner works than a Mahler symphony. A way to interpret Davies’ suggestion is to consider a compromise between the sonicist and instrumentalist positions just mentioned: there is no absolute standard when it comes to performance requirement, as works in certain traditions prescribe specific instrumentations, whereas other musical practices are more liberal.

Dodd has argued for a pluralist account of performance authenticity, distinguishing between compliance authenticity and interpretive authenticity (“Performing Works of Music”). Whereas the former is concerned with the accurate performance of the piece as specified by the score, the latter is a way of performing that displays a deep understanding of the piece. These two ways of performing may at times be in tension: there are occasions in which disregarding compliance concerns may help a performer produce a persuasive performance of a piece. In these cases, musical practice shows that concerns for interpretive authenticity may override concerns for compliance, as when a piece’s indicated tempo is disregarded by a performer because she deems a different tempo to be more suited to the piece’s character (Dodd, “Performing Works of Music” 9).

A sceptical view of historically informed performance has been expressed by James O. Young. He considers various formulations of the authenticity ideal animating historically informed performances of music and dismisses them as either unattainable or unattractive. Young concludes that contemporary performers engaging in historically informed performance are valuable for their artistic achievements and for their capacity to present the music they play under a new, stimulating light, and not because of their ability to retrieve the “authentic” version of a piece.

A final observation: although I have started by noting how the debate concerning the basic ontological status of musical works does not settle performance authenticity issues, it is worth stressing how the two problems are presumably connected. Historically loaded characterisations of musical work’s fundamental ontological nature are often paired with authenticity requirements that include the means of production of a musical structure (for example instrumentation, as in Levinson’s case), whereas fundamental ontologies of a platonic sort tend to set the bar low, in that parameters such as timbre or instrumentation are irrelevant to the instantiation of a musical work.

4. Musical Understanding

Music isn’t simply sounds we hear. It is sounds we listen to. Analogously to natural languages, the process of listening to music involves understanding it as music. But how exactly should this understanding be characterised? Contemporary analytic philosophy has produced a debate regarding the way in which we should describe basic musical understanding. The intent is to describe the minimum requirements for the appreciative understanding of a musical piece. The two main opposing views, championed by Levinson and Kivy, are termed concatenationism and architectonicism.

a. Concatenationism

According to Levinson, basic musical understanding is defined by our ability to follow the music’s development from one moment to the next (Music in the Moment).

In order to describe this process, Levinson introduces the concept of quasi-hearing. This refers to the process of attentive listening that encompasses the moments immediately preceding the present one, and that, on this basis, anticipates the music’s short-term development.

Basic musical understanding, as characterised by Levinson, does not include a grasp of large-scale structures, such as the exposition-development-recapitulation characteristic of sonata form. While Levinson does not deny that many educated listeners do pay attention to formal musical features, he denies that awareness of these aspects is required in order to satisfactorily understand a piece of music.

In a 2015 defence of his view, Levinson also appeals to empirical research showing how even accomplished musicians are insensitive to significant changes in large-scale structure, as long as they are able to follow the music’s flow from one moment to the next (“Concatenationism” 42).

b. Architectonicism

Against Levinson, Kivy observes that part of the Western classical music canon is impossible to understand without some degree of awareness of large-scale musical structure (“Music in Memory”). Kivy agrees that momentary listening is basic in the sense of being presupposed by any other kind of musical understanding. If one cannot follow the music’s moment-to-moment progress, one cannot understand music at all. But to concede this is not to say that all music may be understood by listeners who follow only the music’s unfolding in the short span covered by quasi-hearing.

A third party in this dispute, Stephen Davies, offers a criticism of Levinson’s view that downplays the difference between concatenationism and architectonicism (“Musical Understandings”, 95–99). He observes that Levinson seems to present momentary listening and structural listening as distinct psychological processes, the former involving perceptual awareness and the latter some sort of cognitive appraisal. But this need not be the case. For instance, our recognition of a theme as it returns after several minutes from its first appearance is perceptual in that it does not involve explicit knowledge regarding the work’s structure, yet it arches back to a part of the piece that clearly lies outside the scope of our quasi-hearing capacities. Accordingly, Davies claims that “Levinson shows not that grasping a work’s overarching form is irrelevant to musical understanding but that such awareness must arise from the listening experience” (“Musical Understandings” 97).

5. Musical Value and Profundity

Is there a value intrinsic to pure instrumental music? For the purpose of this section, I define as an intrinsic value to a work of art w a value that is unavailable to those who do not experience w. This means a work of art’s intrinsic value is not merely instrumental—as is, for instance, the work’s capacity to generate wealth if sold at an auction. While it may be conjectured that representational art-forms possess a value related to their representational content, this move is impossible in the case of pure music, as this lacks by definition any ties to the real world. Where, then, does the value of music reside?

a. Values of Music

But we may be moving too quickly, for it is not beyond dispute that pure music indeed lacks any extra-musical reference. For one thing, as we have seen, many philosophers believe music to be expressive of emotions. (Though they may not agree on whether music may also be about the emotions it expresses—recall that this is a major difference between Kivy’s and Davies’ accounts.) If pure music indeed does have an emotional character, it may be that part of its value as an art form is related to this feature. As an example of this, recall Robinson’s view that a musical piece’s expressive character articulates and individualises an emotion and may allow a listener to feel what it is like to be in that emotional state. If correct, this account offers an elegant insight into the value of expressive music, for it shows that music has the capacity to make us understand what it is to feel an emotion without our having to undergo the full-blown emotion.

Let us now restrict our focus to those who seek to explain the value of music apart from whatever value may ensue from the music’s capacity to be expressive of emotions. This move is necessary because, regardless of how optimistic one may be with regard to the value of musical expressiveness, one will be forced to admit that much great music is lacking in expressive power. Any value possessed by music of this kind would have to be of a sort different from the value connected to the music’s expressive character.

The most promising strategy in order to explain the value of music, despite its lack of any evident connection to our world, is to bite the bullet of abstraction and claim that pure music is valuable precisely because of its abstract nature. This is the strategy pursued by Alan H. Goldman. He observes that it would not be sufficient, in order to establish the peculiar value we accord to music, to point out the ways in which it expresses emotions. For literature and the visual arts surely do so with greater precision, and the scope of emotional states they are able to represent lies outside the possibilities for pure music. The real value of music, according to Goldman, resides in its capacity to fully engage us in the exploration of an alternative world. Goldman fleshes out this proposal by noting that musical tones are experienced as independent from their material sources and constitute a virtual musical space (39–40). Moreover, the development of music is experienced as purposive: the music goes through struggles and developments and finally finds rest—at least in tonal pieces. But this must solve only part of the enigma, for Goldman has so far suggested only that the experience of music is the experience of an alternative world. He hasn’t yet explained why such an experience is valuable to us. His suggestion is that in addition to the capacity music has to allow us to escape our daily concerns regarding the actual world, there is a particularly welcome feature to the alternative world music opens to us. The musical world is designed, and its dissonances and hesitations are finally resolved as the piece comes to an end. The world of music is “a totally human world in which threats are tamed even when tinged with pathos or other negative emotions throughout” (42).

Malcolm Budd also attempts to explain the value of music through its abstract nature. He likens the appeal of music to that of other natural and artefactual objects featuring abstract patterns (165). The peculiarity of music is that these abstract gestalten are offered as developing in time. Moreover, music presents us with formal structures that reach levels of complexity hardly imaginable in other contexts, in that the formal structures of music are hierarchically organized and related to other structures within the same piece—think of an arpeggio as a sonic gestalt, embedded in a chord progression, which we experience as a larger gestalt (168). While we may be confronted with similar levels of formal complexity in the case of logic or mathematics, this abstract complexity is rarely given perceptually, and the formal structures we deal with in those cases do not arguably have as their primary goal the exploration of aesthetically rewarding structures.

Budd also observes how abstractness does not preclude references to the extra-musical altogether: pure music may exemplify relations that are not, qua relations, exclusive to music. (The concept of exemplification used by Budd is the one introduced by Goodman and presented in section 2.c.) Consider the simple case of imitation in a contrapuntal piece. The relation of imitation instantiated by the piece is one that has application outside of the musical domain, and a work of music may exemplify this relation by prominently showcasing it.

b. Profundity

A related debate concerns the sense in which pure music may be described as profound. We routinely say of novels, poems, movies, and even paintings, that they are profound, and mean by this that they convey some sort of insight or give us food for thought. It has been a matter of debate whether pure music could do the same. If it does, then this would arguably constitute a further way in which music may be valuable.

Kivy is sceptical (Music Alone ch. 10). Pure music lacks the minimum requirements for profundity, namely the capacity of denoting something extra-musical, as well as the capacity to communicate profound propositions about that thing.

Kivy had excluded the possibility of musical profundity before others claimed against him that music may indeed be profound. He later likened his early expression of scepticism to the story of the man who told the children not to stick beans up their nose: they would have never had the idea had he not suggested it to them (“Another Go” 410). Much like the children in the story, philosophers of art have tried to do exactly what Kivy said wasn’t advisable, that is, show that music may be profound. What follows is a presentation of two relevant attempts.

Stephen Davies develops a notion of musical profundity that does not commit him to claims about the music’s possession of propositional content. He suggests an analogy with a game of chess ( “Profundity” 348). A cleverly played game or an unexpected and brilliant move may be described as profound because of their capacity to illustrate the impressive potential of human ingenuity and inventiveness. A game of chess is profound not by communicating profound propositions but rather by showing profound analytical skills, problem-solving abilities, and so on. Similarly, music is sometimes profound because it displays a composer’s cleverness in handling the musical material, from the tonal development to the details of the orchestration.

Kivy remains unconvinced by this attempt, and notes that Davies’ criterion for profundity does not seem to reflect the intuitive claim that not all great works of art are profound. If profundity is a display of astonishing ingenuity, then all music masterpieces should be described as profound. That we would refuse to do so counts against Davies’ view of profundity (Kivy, “Another Go” 407).

According to Dodd, Kivy is right in holding music incapable of communicating propositional content, but he is mistaken in considering this a requirement for profundity. In fact, both requirements he sets out for something to be profound are misleading (Dodd, "The Possibility” 301). First, profundity does not require denotation but mere reference, and reference may be achieved in ways other than through denotation. Dodd’s suggestion is that display may be the relevant relation in the musical case. Among the properties it has, a work of music displays those that the sensitive listeners perceive as crucial to the work’s point. In doing so, it may elicit in such a listener a deeper understanding of its subject matter, that is, the displayed properties. According to Dodd, Kivy is misled from the start by his insistence on a quasi-semantic characterisation of profundity, a tendency he undoubtedly owes to his choice to treat literary profundity as paradigmatic (Dodd, “The Possibility” 302).

6. References and Further Reading

  • Bartel, Christopher. "Rock as a Three‐Value Tradition." The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, vol. 75, no. 2, 2017, pp. 143–154.
  • Brown, Lee B. "Do Higher-order Music Ontologies Rest on a Mistake?" The British Journal of Aesthetics, vol. 51, no. 2, 2011, pp. 169–184.
  • Budd, Malcolm. Values of Art: Painting, Poetry, and Music. Penguin, 1995.
    • This work, while not uniquely concerned with music, has insightful discussion on both the musical expression of emotions and the value of music as art.
  • Davies, Stephen. “Artistic Expression and the Hard Case of Pure Music.” Contemporary Debates in Aesthetics and the Philosophy of Art, edited by Matthew Kieran, Blackwell, 2006, pp. 179–191.
  • Davies, Stephen. “Emotional Contagion from Music to Listener.” In his Musical Understandings & Other Essays on the Philosophy of Music, Oxford University Press, 2011, pp. 47–65.
    • Davies rejects Robinson’s view of emotional contagion and offers an alternative model.
  • Davies, Stephen. “The Expression of Emotion in Music.” Mind, vol. 89, no. 353, 1980, pp. 67–86.
  • Davies, Stephen. "John Cage's 4′ 33″: Is It Music?" Australasian Journal of Philosophy, vol. 75, no. 4, 1997, pp. 448–462.
  • Davies, Stephen. “Music and Metaphor.” In his Musical Understandings & Other Essays on the Philosophy of Music, Oxford University Press, 2011, pp. 21–33.
  • Davies, Stephen. Musical Meaning and Expression. Cornell University Press, 1994.
    • A reference work for the debate on musical expressiveness. Like Kivy, Davies defends a resemblance theory of musical expressiveness, although their views do not overlap completely.
  • Davies, Stephen. “Musical Understandings.” In his Musical Understandings & Other Essays on the Philosophy of Music, Oxford University Press, 2011, pp. 88–128.
    • An overview of issues concerning musical understanding.
  • Davies, Stephen. Musical Works and Performances: A Philosophical Exploration. Clarendon Press, 2001.
    • An important work on musical ontology, with a focus on comparative ontology and authenticity.
  • Davies, Stephen. "Profundity in Instrumental Music." The British Journal of Aesthetics, vol. 42, no. 4, 2002, pp. 343–356.
  • Dodd, Julian. “Musical Works: Ontology and Meta-ontology.” Philosophy Compass, vol. 3, no. 6, 2008, pp. 1113–1134.
  • Dodd, Julian. “Performing Works of Music Authentically.” European Journal of Philosophy, vol. 23, no. 3, 2015, pp. 485–508.
  • Dodd Julian. "The Possibility of Profound Music." British Journal of Aesthetics, vol. 54, no. 3, 2014, pp. 299–322.
  • Dodd, Julian. "Upholding Standards: A Realist Ontology of Standard Form Jazz." The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, vol. 72, no. 3, 2014, pp. 277–290.
  • Dodd, Julian. "What 4’ 33” Is." Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 2017, doi: 10.1080/00048402.2017.1408664.
  • Dodd, Julian. Works of Music: An Essay in Ontology. Oxford University Press, 2007.
    • Dodd presents a defence of the Platonist view of musical ontology.
  • Dyck, John. "Natural Sounds and Musical Sounds: A Dual Distinction." The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, vol. 74, no. 3, 2016, pp. 291–302.
  • Fisher, John Andrew. “The Value of Natural Sounds.” Journal of Aesthetic Education, vol. 33, no. 3, 1999, pp. 26–42.
  • Fisher, John Andrew. “What the Hills Are Alive With: In Defense of the Sounds of Nature.” The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, vol. 56, no. 2, 1998, pp. 167–179.
  • Goehr, Lydia. The Imaginary Museum of Musical Works: An Essay in the Philosophy of Music. Clarendon Press, 1992.
    • A take on the analytic perspective on musical ontology that is well known even outside philosophical circles.
  • Goldman, Alan. "The Value of Music." The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, vol. 50, no. 1, 1992, pp. 35–44.
  • Goodman, Nelson. Languages of Art: An Approach to a Theory of Symbols. Bobbs-Merril, 1968.
    • From an historical perspective, this work is fundamental in setting the stage for future debates concerning musical ontology and expressiveness.
  • Gracyk, Theodore. Rhythm and Noise: An Aesthetics of Rock. Duke University Press, 1996.
    • A seminal work in the discussion of comparative ontology, specifically regarding the ontological status of rock works.
  • Kania, Andrew. "All Play and No Work: An Ontology of Jazz." The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, vol. 69, no. 4, 2011, pp. 391–403.
  • Kania, Andrew. “Definition.” The Routledge Companion to Philosophy and Music, edited by Theodore Gracyk and Andrew Kania, Routledge, 2011, pp. 3–13.
    • Regarding the definition of music, this chapter in The Routledge Companion to Philosophy and Music is an excellent starting point. It is also worth noting that the entire Companion offers an excellent and up-to-date overview of most topics in the analytic philosophy of music.
  • Kingsbury, Justine. “Matravers on Musical Expressiveness.” The British Journal of Aesthetics, vol. 42, no. 1, 2002, pp. 13–19.
  • Kivy, Peter. "Another Go at Musical Profundity: Stephen Davies and the Game of Chess." The British Journal of Aesthetics, vol. 43, no. 4, 2003, pp. 401–411.
  • Kivy, Peter. Authenticities. Philosophical Reflections on Musical Performance. Cornell University Press, 1995.
  • Kivy, Peter. The Corded Shell: Reflections on Musical Expression. Princeton University Press, 1980.
    • A reference work for the debate on musical expressiveness, defending a resemblance theory of musical expressiveness similar to Davies’, although their views do not overlap completely.
  • Kivy, Peter. Music Alone: Philosophical Reflections on the Purely Musical Experience. Cornell University Press, 1991.
    • Kivy discusses a variety of issues concerning musical value and profundity and defends a formalist view of the appreciation of Western classical music.
  • Kivy, Peter. “Music in Memory and Music in the Moment.” In his New Essays on Musical Understanding, Oxford University Press, 2001, pp. 183–217.
  • Kivy, Peter. "Platonism in Music: A Kind of Defense." Grazer Philosophische Studien, 19, 1983, pp. 109–129.
  • Levinson, Jerrold. “Concatenationism, Architectonicism, and the Appreciation of Music.” In his Musical Concerns: Essays in Philosophy of Music. Oxford University Press, 2015, pp. 32–44.
  • Levinson, Jerrold. “The Concept of Music.” In his Music, Art, and Metaphysics: Essays in Philosophical Aesthetics, Cornell University Press, 1990, pp. 267–278.
  • Levinson, Jerrold. “Musical Expressiveness as Hearability-as-expression.” Contemporary Debates in Aesthetics and the Philosophy of Art, edited by Matthew Kieran, Blackwell, 2006, pp. 192–204.
    • A clear formulation of the persona theory of musical expressiveness.
  • Levinson, Jerrold. “Music and Negative Emotions.” In his Music, Art, and Metaphysics: Essays in Philosophical Aesthetics, Cornell University Press, 1990, pp. 306–335.
  • Levinson, Jerrold. Music in the Moment, Cornell University Press, 1997.
    • Levinson offers the first formulation and defence of the concatenationist view.
  • Levinson, Jerrold. “What a Musical Work Is.” In his Music, Art, and Metaphysics: Essays in Philosophical Aesthetics, Cornell University Press, 1990, pp. 63–88.
    • An important work on musical ontology.
  • Matravers, Derek. Art and Emotion. Oxford University Press, 1998.
  • Nussbaum, Charles O. The Musical Representation: Meaning, Ontology, and Emotion. MIT Press, 2007.
  • Robinson, Jenefer. Deeper than Reason: Emotion and its Role in Literature, Music, and Art. Oxford University Press, 2005.
    • An ambitious and empirically informed study on emotional expression in the arts. The section on music defends a hybrid view that combines arousalist elements with Levinson’s persona theory. This work also presents Robinson’s model of emotional contagion from music to listener.
  • Scruton, Roger. The Aesthetics of Music. Oxford University Press, 1997.
    • A highly original and influential take on many of the issues discussed in this article, from definitional concerns to problems of expressiveness and value.
  • Taruskin, Richard. Text and Act: Essays on Music and Performance. Oxford University Press, 1995.
  • Tormey, Alan. The Concept of Expression: A Study in Philosophical Psychology and Aesthetics. Princeton University Press, 1971.
  • Trivedi, Saam. Imagination, Music, and the Emotions: A Philosophical Study. State University of New York Press, 2017.
  • Young, James O. "The Concept of Authentic Performance." The British Journal of Aesthetics, vol. 28, no. 3, 1988, pp. 228–238.


Author Information

Matteo Ravasio
University of Auckland
New Zealand