Popular music is widely assumed to be different in kind from the serious music or art music that, until very recently, monopolized attention in philosophical discussions of music. In recent years, however, popular music has become an important topic for philosophers pursuing either of two projects. First, popular music receives attention from philosophers who see it as a test case for prevailing philosophies of music. Even now, most philosophy of music concentrates on the European classical repertoire. Therefore, if there are important differences between popular and art music, widening the discussion to include popular music might encourage us to reconsider the nature of music. Second, popular music increasingly serves as a focal point in general debates about art and aesthetic value. A growing number of philosophers regard popular music as a vital and aesthetically rich field that has been marginalized by traditional aesthetics. They argue that popular music presents important counterexamples to entrenched doctrines in the philosophy of art. Similar issues arise for the aesthetics of jazz, but the special topic of jazz is beyond the scope of this article.
Although the category of popular music presupposes differences from serious music, there is limited consensus about the nature of these differences beyond the near-tautology that most people prefer popular music to art music. This obvious disparity in popular reception generates philosophical (and not merely sociological) issues when it is combined with the plausible assumption that popular music is aesthetically different from folk music, art music, and other music types. There is general agreement about the concept’s extension or scope of reference – agreement that the Beatles made popular music but Igor Stravinsky did not. However, there is no comparable agreement about what “popular music” means or which features of the music are distinctively popular. Recent philosophizing about popular music generally sidesteps the issue of defining it. Discussion of particular genres or examples of popular music can be used to advance broader philosophical projects. Such arguments have concentrated on rock music, blues, and hip-hop.
Among the topics that have benefited from this reconsideration are the nature of music’s aesthetic value, music’s claim to autonomy, and the ontology of music.
Since both Plato and Aristotle philosophized about music, philosophy of music predates and is not identical with modern philosophy of art. Nonetheless, most philosophy of music is strongly influenced by the aesthetic assumptions of modernism. Eighteenth-century philosophers organized a new field of study, aesthetics, around the search for a unifying principle for the disparate “fine arts” of post-Renaissance Europe. This principle would distinguish science and craft from such activities as music, poetry, theater, dance, painting, and sculpture. Following this precedent, most subsequent theorizing about music inherited distinctively modernist biases about art. Three ideas proved to be particularly relevant to later efforts to distinguish art from popular art. First, art is the product of genius. Art is constantly evolving, so successful new art involves progress. Second, the value of art is aesthetic, and aesthetic value is autonomous. Artistic value cannot be reduced to utility, moral effects, or social functions. Third, whatever is true about fine art is true about music. From the middle of the eighteenth century until the middle of the nineteenth, philosophers regarded music as a pillar of the emerging system of the fine arts. As a result, music could not be regarded as art if it lacked genius and autonomy. By the beginning of the twentieth century, most intellectuals endorsed the elitist consensus that popular music lacks these features.
Despite its influence on subsequent theorizing, the eighteenth-century intellectual framework did not recognize a clear distinction between fine art and popular art. For example, Immanuel Kant’s philosophy of art is a landmark work in eighteenth-century aesthetics. It places great emphasis on genius and artistic autonomy. These elements of the Kantian aesthetic are often cited to dismiss the art status of popular music. Many subsequent philosophical analyses of the distinction between art music and popular music draw on his proposal that the lesser arts dull the mind. Lacking the interplay of ideas and formal experimentation that characterizes fine art, the popular arts are mere entertainment (see Kaplan, 354-55). Nonetheless, it is important to note that Kant does not himself recognize the field of popular art, so he does not align the lesser arts and popular art. Furthermore, his general position on the value of music is inconclusive. Given his subsequent reputation as a formalist, readers are often surprised to discover his worry that instrumental music “merely plays with sensations” and therefore “has the lowest place among the fine arts” (Kant, 199). Taken seriously, Kant’s remarks suggest that songs are to be ranked higher than instrumental music. As such, Kant might assign greater artistic value to a folk song than to J. S. Bach’s Brandenburg concertos.
Eighteenth century philosophy’s silence on differences between art songs and popular songs must not be construed as evidence that no one yet discussed “popular” music. Where we do find discussion of this topic in the eighteenth-century, popularity is not yet opposed to art. For instance, at roughly the same time that Kant questions instrumental music’s merits as a fine art, the composer W. A. Mozart writes of the importance of providing his operas with memorable, popular melodies. Even here, however, it would be anachronistic to suppose that Enlightenment categories support a clear distinction between art music and popular music. At best, philosophers of this period postulated differences between refined and vulgar taste. This distinction between better and worse taste gradually developed into an explicit recognition of a distinctive sphere of popular culture and music, with a corresponding stigmatization of the “low” or popular (Shiner, 94-98).
A more rigid distinction between art music and other music gradually emerges during the nineteenth century. By the middle of the century, philosophical discussions of music begin to make sporadic reference to what we now recognize as popular music. Philosophy of music increasingly concentrates on explaining why recent European concert music is musically distinctive and superior. Emphasizing Kant’s idea of autonomous aesthetic value, Eduard Hanslick focuses on pure instrumental music. The art of music is the art of structuring tones. Only structural properties matter, and they matter only for themselves. Impure music that relies on words or emotional expression pleases audiences with non-musical attractions. In this analysis, most popular music pleases its audience by its extra-musical rewards. In defending the aesthetic superiority of instrumental music, Hanslick’s aesthetic formalism reinforces the view that popular music, which emphasizes song, lacks artistic merit. Hanslick deploys a Kantian aesthetic to undermine Kant’s concerns about instrumental music’s lack of artistic value.
A quarter century later, Edmund Gurney provides additional arguments for musical autonomy. Although he allows that popular music can be melodically valuable, Gurney’s attack on the distractions of emotional expression clearly consigns most popular music to an inferior category. Hanslick and Gurney are both reacting against the Romantic tendency to value music’s expressive capacity. Responding to the longstanding idea that music expresses emotion by generating a felt, bodily response, both Hanslick and Gurney insist that bodily engagement indicates an inferior response. Again, they extend a Kantian theme. Kant argues that bodily responses create a personal interest that is incompatible with a universalizable and “pure” aesthetic judgment. Together, Hanslick and Gurney are an important source of the view that popular music is inferior because its primary appeal is visceral, bodily, and felt. In contrast, the abstract structures of classical music demand an intellectual response. The body hears, but only the intellect listens (see Baugh 1993, Gracyk 2007).
Gurney is not entirely negative about popular music. He distinguishes between popular music as “low” commercial music found “in common theaters and places of public entertainment” and popular music as that which appeals to virtually anyone in a society who is exposed to it (407). Folk music comprises most of the latter category. This category also includes appealing melodies of operatic arias and other classical works. Gurney already recognizes, in 1880, that the maintenance of social strata requires stereotypes that unnecessarily limit access to a wide variety of music. Consequently, true popularity is seldom cultivated. Gurney is particularly critical of Richard Wagner’s idea that genuine popularity is constrained by nationalism. For Gurney, music cannot be popular if its appeal is limited by social boundaries of any sort.
Setting a different precedent, Friedrich Nietzsche’s views on music are a byproduct of his general philosophy of culture. Nietzsche initially defends the superiority of certain strains of European classical music. He praises composers whose irrational genius provides the Dionysian energy needed to correct the rational excesses of European culture. Nietzsche eventually reverses himself. In an extended attack on Richard Wagner’s operas, he rejects the continuing value of the “great” style that characterizes art music. In what amounts to a reversal of Kantian aesthetic priorities, Nietzsche praises Georges Bizet’s widely popular opera Carmen (1875) for its triviality and simplicity (see Sweeney-Turner). However, most philosophers ignore Nietzsche’s defense of “light” music.
Nietzsche aside, philosophy of music has been dominated by the view that the best music is autonomous and formally complex (John Dewey is almost alone in defending the vitality of popular art during this time period. Unfortunately, Dewey said very little about music.). As recently as 1990, philosophy of popular music consisted of variations on a single theme. Philosophers defended the twin assumptions that popular music is essentially different from “serious” or art music, and that the former is aesthetically inferior to the latter. As a result, most philosophers who bothered to discuss popular music concentrated on identifying the aesthetic deficiencies inherent in such music.
Theodor Adorno offers an influential, philosophically sophisticated account of the nature of twentieth-century popular music. He is the single best source for the view that popular music is simplistic, repetitive, and boring, and that it remains this way because commercial forces manipulate it in order to placate and manipulate the masses who passively respond to it. Although a Marxist orientation influences almost all of his arguments, his influence is apparent in many writers who are not explicitly Marxists. Unfortunately, Adorno is a notoriously difficult writer. His writings on music are subtle, dense, and fill many hundreds of pages.
Adorno begins with the insight that popular music is characterized by the synthesis of entertainment values and mass art. Twentieth-century popular music is mass art because commercial forces now produce it on an industrial model. It is a commodity aimed at the largest possible number of consumers. Therefore it must combine a high degree of standardization with relative accessibility, and so the same rhythms and structures appear again and again. Yet a constant supply of new “product” must be marketed to consumers. As a result, popular music competes with and replaces local and regional folk traditions (In the wake of the industrial revolution, genuine folk art is no longer possible.). In a commercial world where one popular song sounds much like any other, popular music cannot function as a medium of genuine communication. At best, a philosophically reflective stance sees that its standardization and commercial presentation reflects important facets of the socio-economic conditions that shape it. Its standardization reflects the alienating, oppressive standardization of modern capitalism. The momentarily pleasurable diversions offered by popular music are mere distractions from this alienation – a process that the music itself reinforces. Since it fails to satisfy any genuine needs, exposure to popular music encourages an endless repetition of the cycle of consumption, boredom, alienation, and fresh distraction through consumption.
Adorno’s analysis of popular music is transformed into outright criticism of it when he contrasts it with “art” music. We cannot complain about popular music if our culture cannot provide a more satisfying alternative. If nothing better is available, then there is nothing especially wrong with popular music. Adorno argues that objectively better music is available. He is sophisticated enough to avoid a simple contrast of classical and popular music. For Adorno, almost all of the music that passes as art music is just as bad. It is barely comprehended by its audience, most of whom respond approvingly to its familiarity. Radical composers such as Arnold Schoenberg, however, provide art music that is socially progressive. This music challenges listeners by presenting them with more “truth” than other twentieth-century music. For Adorno, artistic truth is neither a matter of saying conventionally true things nor of making socially oppositional statements (Within the socio-economic framework of capitalism, the political stance of punk or hip-hop is just another “hook” and marketing tool.). Artistic truth is relative to the time and place of its creation and reception. It requires music that is sufficiently autonomous from socio-economic pressures to permit compositional integrity. For example, our expectations for aesthetic pleasure previously placed a premium on beauty. The quest for beauty curtails genuine autonomy. Therefore musical integrity comes at a cost: good music no longer offers us the beauty of conventional fine art. Instead, it must be compositionally complex enough to incorporate and display the contradictory demands that we impose on art. By comparison, music that is readily understood and immediately pleasurable is not autonomous. It neither discloses nor opposes society’s dominant socio-economic framework. Given these requirements, very little music succeeds in forcing listeners to deal with the contradictions of modernity. Popular music fares worst of all. Its requirement of accessibility deprives it of social truth, so it lacks any genuinely progressive social role.
Adorno sees no important distinctions within popular music. His analysis is subject to challenge on the grounds that some popular music lacks conventional beauty and easy pleasures. However, Adorno can reply that such music cannot simultaneously achieve popularity while offering artistic truth, for that truth cannot be conveyed by music that is accessible enough to generate a commercial profit. Several philosophers (Brown 2005, Gracyk 1996) have responded that some jazz and rock musicians are counterexamples to Adorno’s analysis. Charlie Parker and John Coltrane made commercial recordings and so must be “popular,” as Adorno understands the category. Yet they created autonomous, challenging music. The commercial framework of twentieth century music has not eradicated artistic truth as Adorno defines it.
Adorno aside, popular music received limited philosophical attention before the early 1960s. Then the British Journal of Aesthetics published articles on the topic by Frank Howes and Peter Stadlen. Although the Beatles are not mentioned in either article, it is interesting to note that this pair of essays appeared in the same year and country that gave the world the Beatles’s debut recordings, “Love Me Do” and “Please Please Me.” Within two years, the Beatles’s musical intelligence and emergence as an international cultural force invited serious reconsideration of the claim that repetition and cognitive vapidity define popular music. Although neither Howes nor Stadlen cites Adorno, their analyses endorse many of his basic ideas. Howes sets out to explain why “there is little bad folk music and much bad popular music” (247). Where Gurney treats folk music as a species of popular music, Howes opposes the two categories. Howes proposes that the communal composition and ongoing re-fashioning of folk music ensures a unique combination of simplicity and excellence. In contrast, popular music is created for immediate widespread consumption and thus prioritizes “ease of comprehension,” discouraging musical development and subtlety. Popular music is more often “indifferent” than it is bad through incompetence. Like Adorno, Howes thinks that popular music must employ excessive repetition and crude clichés.
Stadlen departs from Howes in recognizing that the emergence of blues music represented a “novel type of virtuosity” and an unheralded combination of tragic and comic elements (359). Otherwise, Stadlen regards popular or “light” music as aesthetically impoverished for its avoidance of musical complication and for its juvenile emotional ambivalence about sex, which it exploits for its emotional impact. In a few short paragraphs, Stadlen encapsulates most of the position that Allan Bloom revived more hyperbolically in 1987.
To summarize the modernist view, genres of art develop a hierarchy. “Higher” forms of music satisfy the most advanced modes of response. Superior genres require attention to abstract structures, so they require active, focused listening. Therefore the best music is found in the classical repertoire, where composers have emphasized autonomy and cognitive complexity. By comparison, popular music is aesthetically deficient. It sacrifices autonomy because its design is driven by functional demands for emotional expression and for dance rhythms. Popularity requires accessibility, so popular music cannot combine popularity and complexity.
Richard Shusterman has produced several essays that challenge these standard dismissals of popular music. Bringing a more balanced perspective to the philosophical debate, these essays demonstrate that popular music is philosophically more interesting than modernism suggests. Inspired by Dewey’s pragmatism, Shusterman argues that the social distinction between high and low music does not correspond to any distinctive aesthetic differences. He offers no analysis of either “popular art” or “popular music.” Instead, he focuses on highly selective examples of popular music that achieve “complex aesthetic effects,” thereby satisfying our “central artistic criteria” (2000b, pp. 215-16). Good popular music satisfies the aesthetic criteria routinely used to praise serious music. Although Shusterman concedes that a great deal of popular music is aesthetically poor and may have negative social effects, he argues that at least some of it succeeds aesthetically while offering a socially progressive challenge to prevailing cultural biases.
Shusterman’s arguments are based on a very small sample of rock, hip-hop, and country music. He identifies and criticizes a core set of criticisms that are typically directed against popular music. He focuses on its alleged lack of creativity, originality, and artistic autonomy. He also replies to claims that it degrades culture generally by offering an inferior substitute for better music, that its escapism makes for shallow rewards, and that it encourages an uncritical passivity that generates a disengaged populace (2000b, pp. 173-77). (Most of these arguments originate in Adorno. Several of them are found in Roger Scruton and Julian Johnson, neither of whom endorses Adorno’s Marxism.) Against these criticisms, Shusterman argues that the rewards and pleasures of art music are no less transitory than those of popular music, that critics over-emphasize art’s capacity to engage the intellect, and that the standards used to discredit popular art are essentially Romantic in origin and therefore offer a historically limited perspective on the nature and value of art.
Directly responding to Adorno, Shusterman’s pragmatism rejects the modernist opposition of art and “life” (2000b). Shusterman recommends aesthetic criteria that are broad enough to endorse the functional dimension of every art form. These proposals gain specificity in Shusterman’s response to the charge that popular music is formulaic and falls short of the formal achievement of good music. Resisting the traditional association of form and intellectual engagement, he argues that musical form should be rooted in “organic bodily rhythms” and the social conditions that make them meaningful (199). Popular music’s continuing reliance on dance rhythms returns Western music to its “natural roots” (2000a, p. 4). The fundamental structure of popular music lies in its bodily rhythms, so movement is necessary for appreciating it. Since these movements bear meanings, a genuine response to music is both physical and intellectual. This active, bodily engagement is also supplemented by awareness of lyrics because songs dominate popular music. When language is connected to the music’s rhythms, the integrated experience of music and language is as creative and complex as is the experience of “high” or classical music.
Shusterman’s most important essays are “Form and Funk: The Aesthetic Challenge of Popular Art” and “The Fine Art of Rap” (both in 2000b). The latter focuses on hip-hop recordings that are verbally complex, philosophically insightful, and rhythmically funky. They are aesthetically satisfying in a way that integrates both bodily and intellectual responses. The best hip-hop presents a life philosophy. However, concentrating on a handful of exemplary cases does not demonstrate that popular music is generally complex in this manner. For this purpose, Shusterman’s arguments should be considered in light of the recent outpouring of books that discuss philosophy’s relevance to different popular musicians. These books feature essays that explore the philosophical underpinnings of groups such as the Beatles, the Grateful Dead, Metallica, and U2. These analyses show that Shusterman’s limited examples cannot be dismissed as the rare exceptions in popular music. They also correct another major bias. Adopting Hanslick’s position that an aesthetics of music must be an aesthetics of instrumental or “absolute” music, traditional philosophy of music pays little attention to songs. It is clear that many accessible popular songs grapple with complex ideas and issues, however.
Finally, Shusterman argues that some popular music has the additional merit of presenting a postmodern challenge to the modernist categories that have dominated philosophical aesthetics (2000a). In particular, hip-hop often highlights postmodern strategies of recycling and appropriation. It engages with the concerns of subcultures and localized communities rather than with an allegedly universal perspective. These strategies reverse and thus repudiate modernist standards of artistic value. This line of argument does little to address traditional criticisms of popular music, however. Instead, it acknowledges that popular music is deficient according to traditional standards while also contending that cultural change renders those standards irrelevant. This argument does not answer critics who still endorse traditional views about art because the force of this argument depends on a complex understanding of historical developments in art and aesthetics. Furthermore, Shusterman’s appeal to postmodernism suggests that when we find anything in popular music that is not endorsed by traditional aesthetic theory, its presence can be interpreted as a challenge to the dominant tradition. Shusterman thus weakens his earlier charge that aesthetic theory has systematically misrepresented the nature of most art. Traditional aesthetic categories still frame the debate as popular music divides into two broad categories. Good popular music succeeds according to either modernist or postmodernist values. Either way, popular music is evaluated according to fine art standards (see Gracyk 2007). Shusterman supplements his discussions of rock and hip-hop with an independent essay on country music (2000a). He focuses on a small genre of films about the careers of fictional country singers. This essay moves Shusterman away from the bifurcation just outlined. Country music is discussed without reference to either modernist or postmodernist standards. Instead of arguing that country music is aesthetically complex and socially progressive, Shusterman focuses on the issue of how country music succeeds in conveying emotional authenticity to its fans. He thus endorses a line of analysis that is found in many ethnomusicological analyses of popular music. Shusterman concedes that country music is excessively sentimental and that commercial processes undercut its claim to authenticity. Nonetheless, it is comparatively authentic to its fans for a variety of reasons. First, its working class white audience is generally “uncritical” and, due to social circumstances, seeks “easy emotional release” in music (86). Second, it is commercially positioned as more authentic than contemporary alternatives in popular music. Third, its emphasis on first-person storytelling has a self-validating authority. Together, these factors give country music an aura of authenticity that explains its appeal. It is striking that this analysis cites neither aesthetic excellence nor progressive ideas to account for the music’s popular success, however. Hence Shusterman’s analysis offers no answer to critics who dismiss country music as simplistic and politically reactionary.
Inspired by Shusterman’s analysis of hip-hop, Crispin Sartwell offers an alternative and arguably more satisfying account of the value of blues and country music. Building on the general theme that a modernist aesthetic does not apply to most art produced by most cultures, Sartwell builds on Dewey’s theme that healthy arts involve form and expression that give a unifying coherence to everyday experiences. Hence, popular music should not be judged against the elitist ideals that have dominated aesthetic theory. It must be judged in relation to its capacity to embody and consolidate social relationships and values that are central to the society that creates and assimilates it.
In place of Shusterman’s appeal to a comparative authenticity, Sartwell calls attention to the importance of genuine tradition in blues and country music. For several generations, both kinds of music have evolved organically in response to social change. These musical traditions have not changed for the sake of originality and novelty, as encouraged by modernist aesthetics. Art music embraces progress that dictates continuously new forms, experiments, and innovations. Blues and country music constantly re-adapt established forms and signifiers. They change as necessary to remain relevant in the face of changing circumstances. As a result, ongoing styles of American popular music are extraordinarily successful at expressing racial, generational, and class-specific values in a way that remains comprehensible and emotionally satisfying to almost everyone in their respective audiences. As such, the vitality of popular music is best seen by highlighting its commonalities with non-Western art. Sartwell argues that the continuity of American popular music does an admirable job of satisfying non-Western expectations for art, especially those articulated in Asian traditions infused with Confucianism.
Bruce Baugh (1993) defends popular music by concentrating on rock music. His position recalls Shusterman’s argument that the best popular music exhibits a postmodern rejection of modernist aesthetic standards. Baugh contends that rock music and European concert music succeed according to different and opposing aesthetic standards. Traditional musical aesthetics was formulated by reference to the European classical repertoire. Therefore what is valuable about rock music cannot be explained by appeal to aesthetic standards appropriate to Mozart or Wagner. Baugh proposes that rock music is best appreciated by “turning Kantian or formalist aesthetics on its head” (26), literally reversing traditional priorities. Rock places more value on performance than composition, more on material embodiment than structure, more on rhythm than melody and harmony, more on expressivity than formal beauty, and more on heteronomy than autonomy. Like Shusterman, Baugh thinks that this music is fundamentally experienced in the body, especially through dancing, rather than by listening intellectually, without moving. Rock music thus serves as evidence of the limitations of traditional musical aesthetics. Traditional aesthetics concentrates on aesthetic standards “appropriate to only a very small fragment of the world’s music” (28).
Against Baugh, James O. Young and Stephen Davies argue that rock and classical music do not invite evaluation under distinct standards. Young argues that Baugh merely shows that rock music tends to employ different means of expression, not that the music has different ends. The European concert tradition includes a great deal of music that prioritizes expressivity and requires performance practices that highlight the music’s material embodiment. Consequently, Baugh has not identified standards that are unique to rock. Davies (1999) criticizes Baugh’s strategy of aligning classical and rock with intellect and body, respectively. Since music is patterned sound, anything that counts as listening to music will require attention to both form and matter. Davies also attacks Baugh’s assumption that a bodily or somatic response is noncognitive. A somatic response to music is a response to its pattern of movement. This response requires awareness of its distinctive pattern of tensions and relaxations, which requires knowledge of the “grammar” of the appropriate musical style. A visceral, somatic response seems immediate and nonintellectual to listeners. The response actually requires a considerable amount of cognitive processing, however. In a similar manner, the expressive power of rock music is due to, and not opposed to, a cognitive response.
In their responses to Baugh, Young and Davies spend much of their time summarizing and refuting the alleged differences between rock and classical music. As a consequence, it is easy to lose sight of the larger issue that emerges. To what extent is there such a thing as “traditional musical aesthetics,” and to what extent have philosophers adequately formulated the standards for any music? Shusterman and Baugh assume that Hanslick and Gurney accurately describe European art music and its associated listening standards. This assumption leads them to reason that because popular music is different from art music, popular music cannot be understood by appeal to prevailing standards of musical value. Young and Davies suggest a more radical response, however, by proposing that classical music is far more varied than modernism allows. To the extent that modernist standards of musical excellence fail to make sense of popular music, those standards may be equally distorting for most of the European classical repertoire. (To some extent, Adorno already recognizes this point when he argues that Stravinsky and Schoenberg are engaged in very different aesthetic projects, so that Stravinsky has more in common with popular music than with Schoenberg’s rejection of a tonal hierarchy.)
In the second half of the twentieth century, philosophy of art came to be seen as a kind of meta-criticism, identifying legitimate and illegitimate patterns of critical activity directed toward the arts. Derived from analytic philosophy’s concern for language and logic, this approach must not be confused with Adorno’s Marxist position that the best art is always a powerful vehicle for cultural criticism, demonstrating a corresponding failure of the popular arts due to their critical passivity. For the most part, philosophers in the so-called “analytic” tradition do not claim to have any special insights into the nature of music. With a few notable exceptions, such as Roger Scruton, they have abandoned the traditional project of developing a privileged critical perspective from which to sort music into better and worse kinds. Today, analytic philosophers are more likely to examine what is characteristically said about music as a starting point for examining our implicit assumptions about it. Once the emphasis shifts to an examination of the logic of what is said about music, popular and art music are revealed to be equally rich fields for philosophical analysis. As a result, an increasing number of philosophers have investigated popular music by identifying and critiquing key concepts that shape our response to this music. These investigations frequently incorporate insights gained from social and political philosophy.
Joel Rudinow adopts the analytic method in order to summarize and respond to the enormous body of non-philosophical writing about authenticity and the blues. He calls attention to the logic that supports criticisms of musical borrowing or appropriation of African-American music by white musicians and audiences. Addressing selected critics of white appropriation, Rudinow focuses on the social and conceptual issues embodied by white blues musicians.
Rudinow identifies, summarizes, and challenges the two most common arguments advanced against the phenomenon of blues music performed by white musicians. The first is the proprietary argument. It says that when one cultural community owns a musical style, its appropriation by another group constitutes a serious wrong. According to this argument, white blues players participate in a racist appropriation that deprives African-Americans of what is rightfully theirs. The second argument addresses experiential access. It says that white musicians lack relevant experiences that are necessary for expressive authenticity in the blues tradition. At best, white musicians produce blues-sounding music that cannot mean what the blues have traditionally meant. Unable to draw on the full cultural resources that inform the blues, white appropriations will be expressively superficial.
Rudinow responds to the proprietary argument by arguing there is no plausible analysis of ownership according to which a community or culture can “own” an artistic style. He responds to the experiential access argument by arguing that, absent a double standard, it will assign inauthenticity to recent African-American blues performances as readily as to white appropriations. In an argument that echoes Sartwell’s reflections on tradition, Rudinow points out that, after a century of development and change, the African-American experiences that were expressed in early blues cannot plausibly be the standard for evaluating contemporary blues. An evolving tradition that includes white participants is neither more nor less a departure from the core tradition than was, for example, the introduction of electric guitars. Furthermore, African-American experience is sufficiently diverse to allow some white musicians routes of initiation into experiences that can, in combination with mastery of the musical idiom, defuse the charge of mere posturing.
Paul Taylor responds by reviving the experiential access argument. He argues that the blues tradition was, and remains, a racial project. A blues performance is authentic only if it “can properly bear witness to the racialized moral pain that the blues is about” (314), and it only does so if it generates an appropriate feeling in informed listeners. These listeners care very much about the racial identity of performers and regard white performers as less capable of bearing witness about African-American experience. As a result, white appropriations do not generate the proper feeling in blues fans. Therefore white blues performances are not expressively authentic. Rudinow responds with two arguments. First, Taylor postulates a criterion for expressive authenticity that cannot be applied to most other music. Second, Taylor’s argument involves a question-begging assumption that the blues is a homogenous and static racial project. Because this assumption cannot be accepted a priori, it is readily challenged a posteriori by the fact that many African-American musicians and audiences admire the best white blues performers. Since Taylor’s argument links authenticity with audience response, these facts about audience response appear to certify the expressive authenticity of some white blues performances.
As Rudinow predicts (1996, p. 317), his exchange with Taylor merely sets the stage for further argument. Lee B. Brown (2004) explores the overlap between arguments about blues authenticity and longstanding debates about white jazz musicians. He documents and criticizes the outmoded essentialism found in such arguments. Expanding this topic to embrace the popularity of “world music,” Theodore Gracyk (2001) outlines and criticizes common assumptions about the communicative processes involved in popular music. Given that so much popular music is created and heard in recorded form, it is foolish to postulate a unified audience that responds uniformly. There are at least four distinct kinds of musical appropriation that can affect expressive authenticity, and there are at least three kinds of musical reception for any music listening that cross cultural boundaries. So it is implausible to maintain that blues music, to take one example, continues to be a unified cultural project. Popular music authenticity can only be determined on a case-by-case basis, by inspecting the complex interplay of cultural processes, musician’s intentions, and listener’s activities.
Jeanette Bicknell argues that the logic of authenticity is particularly complicated when it involves the singing of songs, as is the case with most popular music. Although some popular musicians compose their own material, such is not always the case. When listening to a song performance, audiences for popular music do not necessarily demand authenticity, narrowly construed. Because singing is akin to acting, each singer’s public persona influences the audience’s aesthetic response whenever a song is sung. This persona includes relatively obvious facts about a singer, such as ethnicity and gender, together with readily available information about the singer’s personal history. Bicknell proposes that most of the popular audience understands that few singers have a public persona that closely matches their “true personality” (263). Hence the actual standard of authenticity is the degree to which the material’s meaning seems appropriate to the singer’s public persona. Furthermore, singing is a physical activity. Few singers will seem authentic when they perform material that the audience regards as unsuitable for someone of their apparent race, gender, or age. For example, Johnny Cash’s performance of “Hurt” in the final year of his life is more expressively authentic than are performances by its composer, rock musician Trent Reznor. Due to the prominence of race in a singer’s persona, most white musicians will find it difficult to sing the blues convincingly. It is not impossible, however.
Feminist aesthetics raises many of the same issues that dominate debates about race and ethnicity. Furthermore, feminist aesthetics frequently discusses performance art. Exploring song performance, Bicknell argues that gender and race are equally relevant for popular song reception. Renée Cox and Claire Detels have provided a philosophical foundation for further work and Gracyk has outlined several philosophically rich issues that deserve further attention (Gracyk 2001). Yet as is the case with aesthetics in general, explicitly feminist analyses are usually directed at fine art and far more attention is paid to the visual arts than to music. In contrast, musicologists have produced many essays and books that highlight feminist perspectives on popular music.
Philosophy contains the sub-field of ontology. Proceeding from the assumption that different kinds of things exist in very different ways, ontology examines different categories of things that exist. Philosophers engage in musical ontology when they identify and analyze the various distinct kinds of things that count as music. For example, traditional philosophy of music distinguishes between a musical work and its performances. Unlike physical objects, the same musical work can be in different places at the same time, simply by being performed in two places simultaneously. Furthermore, not every performance seems to require reference to a pre-existing musical work. Many musicians improvise without performing any recognizable work. What kind of thing, then, is a musical work, such that George Gershwin’s “Summertime” remains the same musical work in a jazz performance by Billie Holiday and a rock performance by Janis Joplin? What is the shared object of musical attention when current audiences access these performances through the mediation of recording?
A number of philosophers think that popular music complicates the traditional ontology of music because the established distinction between works and performances has been supplemented by music that exists as recorded sound. Reflecting on popular music’s reliance on mass-mediation, Gracyk (1996, 2001), Fisher, Brown (2000), Davies (2001), and Kania argue that there are important aesthetic dimensions to the processes by which popular music, particularly rock music, is created and shared as recorded music. It is here, rather than in stylistic differences, that recent popular music differs most sharply from the classical repertoire.
Granted, most popular musicians make a significant amount of their income from live performances. Dedicated fans will often follow their favorite performers from show to show on the concert circuit. Others pay exorbitantly inflated prices to ticket agencies in order to secure prime seats when their favorite singer performs. Nonetheless, the audience for popular music generally spends more time with recorded music than with live music. Furthermore, the enormous return on investment made by the recording industry throughout most of the twentieth century led the industry to invest considerable time and creative energy in the process of recording music. These shifts of listening activity and creative investment have encouraged philosophers to examine the kinds of musical objects that are involved.
Before music was recorded, musical works were known almost exclusively by listening to musical performances or, for those with the proper training, by reading a score. This state of affairs presented a simple ontological or metaphysical analysis of the fundamental nature of musical works. Musical works are not physical particulars. Particular events and objects (performances and scores) provide access to the repeatable sound structures that constitute musical works. For example, Beethoven’s “Moonlight” piano sonata (Opus 27, No. 2) has received many thousands of performances since its composition in 1801. Each complete performance exists at a particular location for about a quarter hour. However, the musical work is an abstract structure that cannot be identified with any of its particular instantiations. The musical work is distinct from its performances, and the performances exist in order to make the work accessible to listeners.
Recordings complicate this straightforward ontological distinction between works and performances. Once recording technology became advanced enough to allow for the production of multiple copies of the same recording, it became necessary to distinguish between a recording (for example, Aretha Franklin’s 1967 hit record “Respect”), its various physical copies (for example, your 8-track and my vinyl 45), and the particular events that listeners hear (for example, the sounds produced from various car radios when a radio station broadcasts a copy of the record). Gracyk (1996) proposes that the experience of popular music now involves a complex web of particulars (for example, distinct performances and recording playbacks) and abstract objects (the song “Respect” and the 1967 “track” or recording of it). The song “Respect” was written by Otis Redding. Franklin subsequently performed the song in a studio, from which record producer Jerry Wexler created a recorded track. Gracyk proposes that Wexler’s recorded track is a distinct musical work, a work-for-playback related to but distinct from both Redding’s song and Franklins’ performance of it.
The relevance of ontological analysis begins to emerge in Davies’s (1999) response to Baugh’s analysis of rock music. Baugh contends that rock music places more emphasis on performances than compositions. Davies responds by noting that Baugh’s sweeping generalization arises from his failure to discuss ontology. Rock musicians, blues singers, and wedding bands do not fill their performances with free improvisations. They perform musical works. Successful performances of both “Respect” and Beethoven’s “Moonlight” piano sonata require performers to correctly perform that musical work and not some other. Whenever Franklin performs “Respect,” she is constrained by Redding’s musical composition (minimal as it may be). For Davies, the most important difference between the rock and classical traditions is that two very different kinds of musical works are normally performed. Beethoven’s sonatas are compositions of the European concert tradition and these works are ontologically “thicker” than popular songs. This simply means a work like the “Moonlight” sonata specifies relatively more of what should be heard during an authentic performance than is the case with the song “Respect” and other musical works in folk and popular music. The sonata is presented in a performance only if a high degree of what occurs during the performance is work-determinative. In other words, far more of the properties of a performance of the piano sonata are dictated by the musical work than is the case for a performance of “Respect.” In contrast, popular songs are generally “thinner” than works of the classical repertoire. Relatively few of the properties that appear in a given performance of “Respect” are present because they are essential to the identity of the musical work that is being performed.
Based on this distinction between thicker and thinner musical works, Baugh is wrong to contrast rock music and European art music by saying that rock music requires far less “faithfulness” to the music being performed. It is certainly true that performances of “Respect” will vary greatly in their performance arrangements and particular realizations. Where Redding is the only vocalist present on his 1965 recording of it, Franklin’s features backing vocalists. Where Franklin spells out the word “respect,” Redding does not. Both Redding and Franklin perform the same song, and they produce equally faithful or authentic performances of the same musical work despite their very different presentations of it. Their interpretative freedom is due to the fact that popular songs are thin with respect to work-constitutive properties and not because the performance matters more than the work that is being performed (Davies 1999).
Additional ontological complications arise when we address the nature of recorded music in each tradition. In the classical tradition, recordings function either to capture the sound of a particular live performance or they attempt to present the sound of an ideal performance (Davies 2001). Popular music developed a third function by exploiting studio technology to create inventive sonic presentations that are not meant to be judged by reference to what can be duplicated in live performance. Philosophers debate whether these recorded tracks constitute distinct, thick musical works. Gracyk (1996) and Kania propose that the studio engineering that is typical of rock and other popular music identifies such recordings as musical works in their own right. Like some electronic music of the European art tradition, the tracks created by many record producers are musical works that can only be instantiated through electronic playback (In fact, some popular music simply is electronic music.). Tracks are extremely thick musical works. The work (the track) determines most of what is heard during its instantiations, which are its playbacks.
Unlike works-for-playback in the art music tradition, popular music tracks feature songs or instrumental compositions that can also be performed live. Returning to the 1968 hit recording of “Respect,” Wexler’s track offers access to Redding’s song. Just as there are multiple performances of “Respect,” there are multiple recordings of it. Where each performance of “Respect” is a distinct instantiation of the song, something else must be said about Wexler’s track, which itself has distinct instantiations in its various playbacks. Listening to recorded music, the popular audience attends to both an ontologically thick work-for-playback and an ontologically thin song. A track’s production style can be distinguished from the song’s musical style. Thus there is a way in which popular music tracks are more complex than is electronic art music Electronic music offers no parallel distinction between track and composition.
Davies (2001) rejects the proposal that most popular song recordings feature two distinct musical works, the track and the song. He contends that there are very few cases in which two musical works are simultaneously available to an audience. For Davies, a recording is a distinct musical work only if the music cannot possibly be performed live. With music that can be performed live, one of two situations holds. Either way, the recorded track does not count as a distinct musical work. First, some recordings represent a studio performance of an ordinary musical work. An example is Franklin’s recorded performance of “Respect.” Second, the recording studio is sometimes used to create compositions or arrangements that are too complex or too electronically sophisticated to be performed live. Only derivative arrangements can be performed live. For example, the Beatles’s studio production of their 1966 song “Rain” features guitar and vocal parts that were created by reversing the tape on which the music was recorded. Treating the studio as special kind of performance space, Davies classifies “Rain” as a work for studio performance. Other musicians have since performed this song for an audience, but to do so they must substitute different guitar passages. According to Davies, these performances require the musicians to perform a simpler, derivate musical work, an ordinary song for performance. By distinguishing between three kinds of musical works (works for performance, works for studio performance, and works-for-playback), Davies maintains that recorded tracks of popular music seldom count as works-for-playback.
Gracyk and Kania disagree with Davies on the grounds that popular music audiences regard tracks as distinct objects of critical attention. In the same way that an audience for a live performance of a song can critically distinguish between the song and its performance (for example, recognizing a weak performance of a superior song), audiences distinguish between and critically assess songs, performances, and their recordings. As evidence, Kania notes that “cover” versions or remakes are discussed and assessed by reference to previous recordings, not simply as new recordings of familiar songs. Furthermore, because recordings have sonic properties that belong to neither songs nor their originating performances, they ought to be regarded as distinct musical works. Like electronic music, popular music tracks are ontologically thick works-for-playback. Unlike electronic art music, popular music tracks generally present the audience with a distinct, ontologically thin work that can be authentically instantiated in other recordings and in live performance. Thus, when a Beatles cover band gives a live performance of the song “Rain,” the song that is being performed is not, as Davies contends, a different work from the one that the Beatles recorded. Where Davies thinks that a work for performance has been derived from a work for studio performance, Gracyk and Kania recognize one song, “Rain,” which is the same song in either case.
This debate about the ontology of recorded tracks might seem to be a dispute over mere semantics. However, it has many implications for the aesthetics of popular music. In part, it reveals disagreement on whether a musical event can belong to multiple ontological categories at the same time. Davies thinks not; Gracyk and Kania regard this result as relatively common with recorded popular music. The debate also reveals assumptions about what counts as genuine music making. Elevating tracks to the status of full-fledged musical works implies that record producers and sound engineers are as important as songwriters and performers. This status will, in turn, complicate attributions of authorship and thus interpretation. Furthermore, treating tracks as works suggests that a great deal of popular music might be better understood by exploring its connections with film rather than with other music (Gracyk 1996, Kania).
One need not classify tracks as musical works in order to see that a great deal of popular music culture centers on recorded music. This phenomenon has consequences for philosophy of music. Although Davies and his opponents disagree on the correct analysis of these recordings, both lines of analysis imply that listening to popular music is cognitively quite complex. Contrary to stereotypes about passive reception, listening involves complex discriminations regarding multiple objects of interest. Furthermore, this debate demonstrates the incompleteness of a philosophy of music derived from reflection on the European classical tradition. Analyses of popular music must develop conceptual tools that move beyond discussion compositions and performances. For good or ill, recordings are ubiquitous in our musical culture. Philosophy of music must come to grips with its status and its role in musical culture.
Minnesota State University Moorhead
U. S. A.
Last updated: June 28, 2008 | Originally published: